Platonism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

First published Sat Jul 18, 2009; substantive revision Thu Jan 18, 2018

Platonism about mathematics (or mathematical platonism) is the metaphysical view that there are abstract mathematical objects whose existence is independent of us and our language, thought, and practices. Just as electrons and planets exist independently of us, so do numbers and sets. And just as statements about electrons and planets are made true or false by the objects with which they are concerned and these objects’ perfectly objective properties, so are statements about numbers and sets. Mathematical truths are therefore discovered, not invented.

The most important argument for the existence of abstract mathematical objects derives from Gottlob Frege and goes as follows (Frege 1953). The language of mathematics purports to refer to and quantify over abstract mathematical objects. And a great number of mathematical theorems are true. But a sentence cannot be true unless its sub-expressions succeed in doing what they purport to do. So there exist abstract mathematical objects that these expressions refer to and quantify over.

Frege’s argument notwithstanding, philosophers have developed a variety of objections to mathematical platonism. Thus, abstract mathematical objects are claimed to be epistemologically inaccessible and metaphysically problematic. Mathematical platonism has been among the most hotly debated topics in the philosophy of mathematics over the past few decades.

1. What is Mathematical Platonism?

Mathematical platonism can be defined as the conjunction of the following three theses:

There are mathematical objects.

Mathematical objects are abstract.

Mathematical objects are independent of intelligent agents and their language, thought, and practices.

Some representative definitions of ‘mathematical platonism’ are listed in the supplement

Some Definitions of Platonism

and document that the above definition is fairly standard.

Platonism in general (as opposed to platonism about mathematics specifically) is any view that arises from the above three claims by replacing the adjective ‘mathematical’ by any other adjective.

The first two claims are tolerably clear for present purposes. Existence can be formalized as ‘∃xMx’, where ‘Mx’ abbreviates the predicate ‘x is a mathematical object’ which is true of all and only the objects studied by pure mathematics, such as numbers, sets, and functions. Abstractness says that every mathematical object is abstract, where an object is said to be abstract just in case it is non-spatiotemporal and (therefore) causally inefficacious. (For further discussion, see the entry on abstract objects.)

Independence is less clear than the other two claims. What does it mean to ascribe this sort of independence to an object? The most obvious gloss is probably the counterfactual conditional that, had there not been any intelligent agents, or had their language, thought, or practices been different, there would still have been mathematical objects. However, it is doubtful that this gloss will do all the work that Independence is supposed to do (see Section 4.1). For now, Independence will be left somewhat schematic.

1.1 Historical remarks

Platonism must be distinguished from the view of the historical Plato. Few parties to the contemporary debate about platonism make strong exegetical claims about Plato’s view, much less defend it. Although the view which we are calling ‘platonism’ is inspired by Plato’s famous theory of abstract and eternal Forms (see the entry on Plato’s metaphysics and epistemology), platonism is now defined and debated independently of its original historical inspiration.

Not only is the platonism under discussion not Plato’s, platonism as characterized above is a purely metaphysical view: it should be distinguished from other views that have substantive epistemological content. Many older characterizations of platonism add strong epistemological claims to the effect that we have some immediate grasp of, or insight into, the realm of abstract objects. (See e.g., Rees 1967.) But it is useful (and nowadays fairly standard) to reserve the term ‘platonism’ for the purely metaphysical view described above. Many philosophers who defend platonism in this purely metaphysical sense would reject the additional epistemological claims. Examples include Quine and other philosophers attracted to the so-called indispensability argument, which seeks to give a broadly empirical defense of mathematical platonism. (See the entry on indispensability arguments in the philosophy of mathematics.)

Finally, the above definition of ‘mathematical platonism’ excludes the claim that all truths of pure mathematics are necessary, although this claim has traditionally been made by most platonists. Again, this exclusion is justified by the fact that some philosophers who are generally regarded as platonists (for instance, Quine and some adherents of the aforementioned indispensability argument) reject this additional modal claim .

1.2 The philosophical significance of mathematical platonism

Mathematical platonism has considerable philosophical significance. If the view is true, it will put great pressure on the physicalist idea that reality is exhausted by the physical. For platonism entails that reality extends far beyond the physical world and includes objects which aren’t part of the causal and spatiotemporal order studied by the physical sciences.[1] Mathematical platonism, if true, will also put great pressure on many naturalistic theories of knowledge. For there is little doubt that we possess mathematical knowledge. The truth of mathematical platonism would therefore establish that we have knowledge of abstract (and thus causally inefficacious) objects. This would be an important discovery, which many naturalistic theories of knowledge would struggle to accommodate.

Although these philosophical consequences are not unique to mathematical platonism, this particular form of platonism is unusually well suited to support such consequences. For mathematics is a remarkably successful discipline, both in its own right and as a tool for other sciences.[2] Few contemporary analytic philosophers are willing to contradict any of the core claims of a discipline whose scientific credentials are as strong as those of mathematics (Lewis 1991, pp. 57–9). So if philosophical analysis revealed mathematics to have some strange and surprising consequences, it would be unattractive simply to reject mathematics.[3] A form of platonism based on a discipline whose scientific credentials are less impressive than those of mathematics would not be in this fortunate situation. For instance, when theology turns out to have some strange and surprising philosophical consequences, many philosophers do not hesitate to reject the relevant parts of theology.

1.3 Object realism

Let object realism be the view that there exist abstract mathematical objects. Object realism is thus just the conjunction of Existence and Abstractness.[4] Object realism stands opposed to nominalism, which in contemporary philosophy is typically defined as the view that there are no abstract objects. (In more traditional philosophical usage the word ‘nominalism’ refers instead to the view that there are no universals. See Burgess & Rosen 1997, pp. 13–25 and the entry on abstract objects.)

Because object realism leaves out Independence, this view is logically weaker than mathematical platonism. The philosophical consequences of object realism are thus not as strong as those of platonism. Many physicalists would accept non-physical objects provided that these are dependent on or reducible to physical objects. They may for instance accept objects such as corporations, laws, and poems, provided that these are suitably dependent or reducible to physical objects. Moreover, there appears to be no mystery about epistemic access to non-physical objects that we have somehow made or ‘constituted’. If corporations, laws, and poems are made or ‘constituted’ by us, presumably we gain knowledge of them in the process of making or ‘constituting’ them.

Some views in the philosophy of mathematics are object realist without being platonist. One example are traditional intuitionist views, which affirm the existence of mathematical objects but maintain that these objects depend on or are constituted by mathematicians and their activities.[5] Some further examples of views that are object realist without being platonist will be discussed in Section 4.

1.4 Truth-value realism

Truth-value realism is the view that every well-formed mathematical statement has a unique and objective truth-value that is independent of whether it can be known by us and whether it follows logically from our current mathematical theories. The view also holds that most mathematical statements that are deemed to be true are in fact true. So truth-value realism is clearly a metaphysical view. But unlike platonism it is not an ontological view. For although truth-value realism claims that mathematical statements have unique and objective truth-values, it is not committed to the distinctively platonist idea that these truth-values are to be explained in terms of an ontology of mathematical objects.

Mathematical platonism clearly motivates truth-value realism by providing an account of how mathematical statements get their truth-values. But the former view does not entail the latter unless further premises are added. For even if there are mathematical objects, referential and quantificational indeterminacy may deprive mathematical statements of a unique and objective truth-value. Conversely, truth-value realism does not by itself entail Existence and thus implies neither object realism nor platonism. For there are various accounts of how mathematical statements can come to possess unique and objective truth-values which do not posit a realm of mathematical objects.[6]

In fact, many nominalists endorse truth-value realism, at least about more basic branches of mathematics, such as arithmetic. Nominalists of this type are committed to the slightly odd-sounding view that, although the ordinary mathematical statement

(1) There are primes numbers between 10 and 20.

is true, there are in fact no mathematical objects and thus in particular no numbers. But there is no contradiction here. We must distinguish between the language LM in which mathematicians make their claims and the language LP in which nominalists and other philosophers make theirs. The statement (1) is made in LM. But the nominalist’s assertion that (1) is true but that there are no abstract objects is made in LP. The nominalist’s assertion is thus perfectly coherent provided that (1) is translated non-homophonically from LM into LP. And indeed, when the nominalist claims that the truth-values of sentences of LM are fixed in a way which doesn’t appeal to mathematical objects, it is precisely this sort of non-homophonic translation she has in mind. The view mentioned in the previous note provides an example.

This shows that for the claim Existence to have its intended effect, it must be expressed in the language LP used by us philosophers. If the claim was expressed in the language LM used by mathematicians, then nominalists could accept the claim while still denying that there are mathematical objects, contrary to the purpose of the claim.

A small but important tradition of philosophers urge that the debate about platonism should be replaced by, or at least transformed into, a debate about truth-value realism. One reason offered in support of this view is that the former debate is hopelessly unclear, while the latter is more tractable (Dummett 1978a, pp. 228–232 and Dummett 1991b, pp. 10–15). Another reason offered is that the debate about truth-value realism is of greater importance to both philosophy and mathematics than the one about platonism.[7]

1.5 The mathematical significance of platonism

Working realism is the methodological view that mathematics should be practiced as if platonism was true (Bernays 1935, Shapiro 1997, pp. 21–27 and 38–44). This requires some explanation. In debates about the foundations of mathematics platonism has often been used to defend certain mathematical methods, such as the following:

  1. Classical first-order (or stronger) languages whose singular terms and quantifiers appear to be referring to and ranging over mathematical objects. (This contrasts with the languages that dominated earlier in the history of mathematics, which relied more heavily on constructive and modal vocabulary.)
  2. Classical rather than intuitionistic logic.
  3. Non-constructive methods (such as non-constructive existence proofs) and non-constructive axioms (such as the Axiom of Choice).
  4. Impredicative definitions (that is, definitions that quantify over a totality to which the object being defined would belong).
  5. ‘Hilbertian optimism’, that is, the belief that every mathematical problem is in principle solvable.[8]

According to working realism, these and other classical methods are acceptable and available in all mathematical reasoning. But working realism does not take a stand on whether these methods require any philosophical defense, and if so, whether this defense must be based on platonism. In short, where platonism is an explicitly philosophical view, working realism is first and foremost a view within mathematics itself about the correct methodology of this discipline. Platonism and working realism are therefore distinct views.

However, there may of course be logical relations between the two views. Given the origin of working realism, it is not surprising that the view receives strong support from mathematical platonism. Assume that mathematical platonism is true. Then clearly the language of mathematics ought to be as described in (i). Secondly, provided it is legitimate to reason classically about any independently existing part of reality, (ii) would also follow. Thirdly, since platonism ensures that mathematics is discovered rather than invented, there would be no need for mathematicians to restrict themselves to constructive methods and axioms, which establishes (iii). Fourth, there is a powerful and influential argument due to Gödel (1944) that impredicative definitions are legitimate whenever the objects being defined exist independently of our definitions. (For instance, ‘the tallest boy in the class’ appears unproblematic despite being impredicative.) If this is correct, then (iv) would follow. Finally, if mathematics is about some independently existing reality, then every mathematical problem has a unique and determinate answer, which provides at least some motivation for Hilbertian optimism. (See, however, the discussion of plenitudinous platonism in Section 4.2.)

The truth of mathematical platonism would therefore have important consequences within mathematics itself. It would justify the classical methods associated with working realism and encourage the search for new axioms to settle questions (such as the Continuum Hypothesis) which are left open by our current mathematical theories.

However, working realism does not in any obvious way imply platonism. Although working realism says that we are justified in using the platonistic language of contemporary mathematics, this falls short of platonism in at least two ways. As the above discussion of truth-value realism showed, the platonistic language of mathematics can be analysed in such a way as to avoid reference to and quantification over mathematical objects. Moreover, even if a face-value analysis of the language of mathematics could be justified, this would support object realism but not platonism. An additional argument would be needed for the third component of platonism, namely, Independence. The prospects for such an argument are discussed in Section 4.1.

2. The Fregean Argument for Existence

We now describe a template of an argument for the existence of mathematical objects. Since the first philosopher who developed an argument of this general form was Frege, it will be referred to as the Fregean argument. But the template is general and abstracts away from most specific aspects of Frege’s own defense of the existence of mathematical objects, such as his view that arithmetic is reducible to logic. Fregean logicism is just one way in which this template can be developed; some other ways will be mentioned below.

2.1 The structure of the argument

The Fregean argument is based on two premises, the first of which concerns the semantics of the language of mathematics:

Classical Semantics.
The singular terms of the language of mathematics purport to refer to mathematical objects, and its first-order quantifiers purport to range over such objects.

The word ‘purport’ needs to be explained. When a sentence S purports to refer or quantify in a certain way, this means that for S to be true, S must succeed in referring or quantifying in this way.

The second premise does not require much explanation:

Most sentences accepted as mathematical theorems are true (regardless of their syntactic and semantic structure).

Consider sentences which are accepted as mathematical theorems and which contain one or more mathematical singular terms. By Truth, most of these sentences are true.[9] Let S be one such sentence. By Classical Semantics, the truth of S requires that its singular terms succeed in referring to mathematical objects. Hence there must be mathematical objects, as asserted by Existence.[10]

2.2 Defending Classical Semantics

Classical Semantics claims that the language of mathematics functions semantically much like language in general functions (or at least has traditionally been assumed to function): the semantic functions of singular terms and quantifiers are to refer to objects and to range over objects, respectively. This is a broadly empirical claim about the workings of a semi-formal language used by the community of professional mathematicians. (In the widely adopted terminology of Burgess & Rosen 1997, pp. 6–7, Classical Semantics is a hermeneutic claim; that is, it is a descriptive claim about how a certain language is actually used, not a normative claim about how this language ought to be used.) Note also that Classical Semantics is compatible with most traditional views on semantics; in particular, it is compatible with all the standard views on the meanings of sentences, namely that they are truth-values, propositions, or sets of possible worlds.

Classical Semantics enjoys strong prima facie plausibility. For the language of mathematics strongly appears to have the same semantic structure as ordinary non-mathematical language. As Burgess (1999) observes, the following two sentences appear to have the same simple semantic structure of a predicate being ascribed to a subject (p. 288):

(4) Evelyn is prim.

(5) Eleven is prime.

This appearance is also borne out by the standard semantic analyses proposed by linguists and semanticists.

Classical Semantics has nevertheless been challenged, for instance by nominalists such as Hellman (1989) and by Hofweber (2005 and 2016). (See also Moltmann (2013) for some challenges concerned with arithmetical vocabulary in natural language.) This is not the place for an extended discussion of such challenges. Let me just note that a lot of work is needed to substantiate this sort of challenge. The challenger will have to argue that the apparent semantic similarities between mathematical and non-mathematical language are deceptive. And these arguments will have to be of the sort that linguists and semanticists—with no vested interest in the philosophy of mathematics—could come to recognize as significant.[11]

2.3 Defending Truth

Truth can be defended in a variety of different ways. Common to all defenses is that they first identify some standard by which the truth-values of mathematical statements can be assessed and then argue that mathematical theorems meet this standard.

One option is to appeal to a standard that is more fundamental than that of mathematics itself. Logicism provides an example. Frege and other logicists first claim that any theorem of pure logic is true. Then they attempt to show that the theorems of certain branches of mathematics can be proved from pure logic and definitions alone.

Another option is to appeal to the standards of empirical science. The Quine-Putnam indispensability argument provides an example. First it is argued that any indispensable part of empirical science is likely to be true and therefore something we are justified in believing. Then it is argued that large amounts of mathematics are indispensable to empirical science. If both claims are correct, it follows that Truth is likely to be true and that belief in Truth therefore is justified. (See the entry on indispensability arguments in the philosophy of mathematics.)

A third option is to appeal to the standards of mathematics itself. Why should one have to appeal to non-mathematical standards, such as those of logic or empirical science, in order to defend the truth of mathematical theorems? When we defend the truth of the claims of logic and physics, we do not need to appeal to standards outside of respectively logic and physics. Rather we assume that logic and physics provide their own sui generis standards of justification. Why should mathematics be any different? This third strategy has received a lot of attention in recent years, often under the heading of ‘naturalism’ or ‘mathematical naturalism’. (See Burgess & Rosen 1997, Maddy 1997, and, for critical discussion, see the entry on naturalism in the philosophy of mathematics.)

Here is an example of how a naturalistic strategy can be developed. Call the attitude that mathematicians take to the theorems of mathematics ‘acceptance’. Then the following claims seem plausible:

(6) Mathematicians are justified in accepting the theorems of mathematics.

(7) Accepting a mathematical statement S involves taking S to be true.

(8) When a mathematician accepts a mathematical statement S, the content of this attitude is in general the literal meaning of S.

From these three claims it follows that mathematical experts are justified in taking the theorems of mathematics to be literal truths. By extension the rest of us too are justified in believing Truth. Note that the experts with whom (6) is concerned need not themselves believe (7) and (8), let alone be justified in any such belief. What matters is that the three claims are true. The task of establishing the truth of (7) and (8) may fall to linguists, psychologists, sociologists, or philosophers, but certainly not to mathematicians themselves.

2.4 The notion of ontological commitment

Versions of the Fregean argument are sometimes stated in terms of the notion of ontological commitment. Assume we operate with the standard Quinean criterion of ontological commitment:

Quine’s Criterion.
A first-order sentence (or collection of such sentences) is ontologically committed to such objects as must be assumed to be in the range of the variables for the sentence (or collection of sentences) to be true.

Then it follows from Classical Semantics that many sentences of mathematics are ontologically committed to mathematical objects. To see this, consider a typical mathematical theorem S, which involves some normal extensional occurrence of either singular terms or first-order quantifiers. By Classical Semantics, these expressions purport to refer to or range over mathematical objects. For S to be true, these expressions must succeed in doing what they purport to do. Consequently, for S to be true, there must be mathematical objects in the range of the variables. By Quine’s Criterion this means that S is ontologically committed to mathematical objects.

Quine and many others take Quine’s Criterion to be little more than a definition of the term ‘ontological commitment’ (Quine 1969 and Burgess 2004). But the criterion has nevertheless been challenged. Some philosophers deny that singular terms and first-order quantifiers automatically give rise to ontological commitments. Perhaps what is “required of the world” for the sentence to be true involves the existence of some but not all of the objects in the range of the quantifiers (Rayo 2008). Or perhaps we should sever the link between the first-order existential quantifier and the notion of ontological commitment (Azzouni 2004, Hofweber 2000 and 2016).

One response to these challenges is to observe that the Fregean argument was developed above without any use of the term ‘ontological commitment’. Any challenge to the definition of ‘ontological commitment’ provided by Quine’s Criterion therefore appears irrelevant to the version of the Fregean argument developed above. However, this response is unlikely to satisfy the challengers, who will respond that the conclusion of the argument developed above is too weak to have its intended effect. Recall that the conclusion, Existence, is formalized in our philosophical meta-language LP as ‘∃xMx’. So this formalization will fail to have its intended effect unless this meta-language sentence is of the sort that incurs ontological commitment. But that is precisely what the challengers dispute. This controversy cannot be pursued further here. For now, we simply observe that the challengers need to provide an account of why their non-standard notion of ontological commitment is better and theoretically more interesting than the standard Quinean notion.

2.5. From Existence to Mathematical Platonism?

Suppose we accept Existence, perhaps based on the Fregean argument. As we have seen, this is not yet to accept mathematical platonism, which is the result of adding to Existence the two further claims Abstractness and Independence. Are these two further claims defensible?

By the standards of philosophy, Abstractness has remained relatively uncontroversial. Among the few philosophers to have challenged it are Maddy (1990) (concerning impure sets) and Bigelow (1988) (concerning sets and various kinds of numbers). This relative lack of controversy means that few explicit defenses of Abstractness have been developed. But it is not hard to see how such a defense might go. Here is one idea. It is a plausible prima facie constraint on any philosophical interpretation of mathematical practice that it should avoid ascribing to mathematics any features which would render actual mathematical practice misguided or inadequate. This constraint makes it hard to deny that the objects of pure mathematics are abstract. For if these objects had spatiotemporal locations, then actual mathematical practice would be misguided and inadequate, since pure mathematicians ought then to take an interest in the locations of their objects, just as zoologists take an interest in the locations of animals. The fact that pure mathematicians take no interest in this question suggests that their objects are abstract.

Independence says that mathematical objects, if there are any, are independent of intelligent agents and their language, thought, and practices. We will discuss what this thesis might amount to, and how it might be defended, in Section 4.

3. Objections to Mathematical Platonism

A variety of objections to mathematical platonism have been developed. Here are the most important ones.

3.1 Epistemological access

The most influential objection is probably the one inspired by Benacerraf (1973). What follows is an improved version of Benacerraf’s objection due to Field (1989).[12] This version relies on the following three premises.

Premise 1. Mathematicians are reliable, in the sense that for almost every mathematical sentence S, if mathematicians accept S, then S is true.
Premise 2. For belief in mathematics to be justified, it must at least in principle be possible to explain the reliability described in Premise 1.
Premise 3. If mathematical platonism is true, then this reliability cannot be explained even in principle.

If these three premises are correct, it will follow that mathematical platonism undercuts our justification for believing in mathematics.

But are the premises correct? The first two premises are relatively uncontroversial. Most platonists are already committed to Premise 1. And Premise 2 seems fairly secure. If the reliability of some belief formation procedure could not even in principle be explained, then the procedure would seem to work purely by chance, thus undercutting any justification we have for the beliefs produced in this way.

Premise 3 is far more controversial. Field defends this premise by observing that “the truth-values of our mathematical assertions depend on facts involving platonic entities that reside in a realm outside of space-time” (Field 1989, p. 68) and thus are causally isolated from us even in principle. However, this defense assumes that any adequate explanation of the reliability in question must involve some causal correlation. This has been challenged by a variety of philosophers who have proposed more minimal explanations of the reliability claim. (See Burgess & Rosen 1997, pp. 41–49 and Lewis 1991, pp. 111–112; cf. also Clarke-Doane 2016. See Linnebo 2006 for a critique.)[13]

3.2 A metaphysical objection

Another famous article by Benacerraf develops a metaphysical objection to mathematical platonism (Benacerraf 1965, cf. also Kitcher 1978). Although Benacerraf focuses on arithmetic, the objection naturally generalizes to most pure mathematical objects.

Benacerraf opens by defending what is now known as a structuralist view of the natural numbers, according to which the natural numbers have no properties other than those they have in virtue of being positions in an ω-sequence. For instance, there is nothing more to being the number 3 than having certain intrastructurally defined relational properties, such as succeeding 2, being half of 6, and being prime. No matter how hard we study arithmetic and set theory, we will never know whether 3 is identical with the fourth von Neumann ordinal, or with the corresponding Zermelo ordinal, or perhaps, as Frege suggested, with the class of all three-membered classes (in some system that allows such classes to exist).

Benacerraf now draws the following conclusion:

Therefore, numbers are not objects at all, because in giving the properties …of numbers you merely characterize an abstract structure—and the distinction lies in the fact that the “elements” of the structure have no properties other than those relating them to other “elements” of the same structure. (Benacerraf 1965, p. 291)

In other words, Benacerraf claims that there can be no objects which have nothing but structural properties. All objects must have some non-structural properties as well. (See Benacerraf 1996 for some later reflections on this argument.)

Both of the steps of Benacerraf’s argument are controversial. The first step—that natural numbers have only structural properties—has recently been defended by a variety of mathematical structuralists (Parsons 1990, Resnik 1997, and Shapiro 1997). But this step is denied by logicists and neo-logicists, who claim that the natural numbers are intrinsically tied to the cardinalities of the collections that they number. And the second step—that there can be no objects with only structural properties—is explicitly rejected by all of the structuralists who defend the first step. (For some voices sympathetic to the second step, see Hellman 2001 and MacBride 2005. See also Linnebo 2008 for discussion.)

3.3 Other metaphysical objections

In addition to Benacerraf’s, a variety of metaphysical objections to mathematical platonism have been developed. One of the more famous examples is an argument of Nelson Goodman’s against set theory. Goodman (1956) defends the Principle of Nominalism, which states that whenever two entities have the same basic constituents, they are identical. This principle can be regarded as a strengthening of the familiar set theoretic axiom of extensionality. The axiom of extensionality states that if two sets x and y have the same elements—that is, if ∀u(uxuy)—then they are identical. The Principle of Nominalism is obtained by replacing the membership relation with its transitive closure.[14] The principle thus states that if x and y are borne ∈* by the same individuals—that is, if ∀u(u ∈* xu ∈* y)—then x and y are identical. By endorsing this principle, Goodman disallows the formation of sets and classes, allowing only the formation of mereological sums and the application to the standard mereological operations (as described by his “calculus of individuals”).

However, Goodman’s defense of the Principle of Nominalism is now widely held to be unconvincing, as witnessed by the widespread acceptance by philosophers and mathematicians of set theory as a legitimate and valuable branch of mathematics.

4. Between object realism and mathematical platonism

Object realism says there exist abstract mathematical objects, whereas platonism adds Independence, which says that mathematical objects are independent of intelligent agents and their language, thought, and practices. This final section surveys some lightweight forms of object realism that stop short of full-fledged platonism.

4.1 How To Understand Independence

A natural gloss on Independence is the counterfactual conditional that, had there not been any intelligent agents, or had their language, thought, or practices been suitably different, there would still have been mathematical objects.

This counterfactual independence (as we may call it) is accepted by most analytic philosophers. To see why, consider the role that mathematics plays in our reasoning. We often reason about scenarios that aren’t actual. Were we to build a bridge across this canyon, say, how strong would it have to be to withstand the powerful gusts of wind? Sadly, the previous bridge collapsed. Would it have done so had the steel girders been twice as thick? This form of reasoning about counterfactual scenarios is indispensable both to our everyday deliberations and to science. The permissibility of such reasoning has an important consequence. Since the truths of pure mathematics can freely be appealed to throughout our counterfactual reasoning, it follows that these truths are counterfactually independent of us humans, and all other intelligent life for that matter. That is, had been there been no intelligent life, these truths would still have remained the same.

Pure mathematics is in this respect very different from ordinary empirical truths. Had intelligent life never existed, this article would not have been written. More interestingly, pure mathematics also contrasts with various social conventions and constructions, with which it is sometimes compared (Cole 2009, Feferman 2009, Hersh 1997). Had intelligent life never existed, there would have been no laws, contracts, or marriages—yet the mathematical truths would have remained the same.

Thus, if Independence is understood merely as counterfactual independence, then anyone who accepts object realism should also accept platonism.

It is doubtful that this understanding of Independence is sufficient, however. For Independence is meant to substantiate an analogy between mathematical objects and ordinary physical objects. Just as electrons and planets exist independently of us, so do numbers and sets. And just as statements about electrons and planets are made true or false by the objects with which they are concerned and these objects’ perfectly objective properties, so are statements about numbers and sets. In short, mathematical objects are just as “real” as ordinary physical objects (if not even more so, as Plato thought).

Let us now consider some views that reject this stronger understanding of Independence in terms of the mentioned analogy. These views are thus lightweight forms of object realism, which stop short of full-blown platonism.

4.2 Plenitudious platonism

One lightweight form of object realism is the “full-blooded platonism” of Balaguer 1998. This view is characterized by a plenitude principle to the effect that any mathematical objects that could exist actually do exist. For instance, since the Continuum Hypothesis is independent of the standard axiomatization of set theory, there is a universe of sets in which the hypothesis is true and another in which it is false. And neither universe is metaphysically privileged. By contrast, traditional platonism asserts that there is a unique universe of sets in which the Continuum Hypothesis is either determinately true or determinately false.[15]

One alleged benefit of this plenitudinous view is in the epistemology of mathematics. If every consistent mathematical theory is true of some universe of mathematical objects, then mathematical knowledge will, in some sense, be easy to obtain: provided that our mathematical theories are consistent, they are guaranteed to be true of some universe of mathematical objects.

However, “full-blooded platonism” has received much criticism. Colyvan and Zalta 1999 criticize it for undermining the possibility of reference to mathematical objects, and Restall 2003, for lacking a precise and coherent formulation of the plenitude principle on which the view is based. Martin (2001) proposes that different universes of sets be amalgamated to yield a single maximal universe, which will be privileged by fitting our conception of set better than any other universe of sets.

A different version of plenitudinous platonism is developed in Linsky & Zalta 1995 and a series of further articles. (See, for instance, Linsky & Zalta 2006 and other articles cited therein.) Traditional platonism goes wrong by “conceiv[ing] of abstract objects on the model of physical objects” (Linsky & Zalta 1995, p. 533), including in particular the idea that such objects are “sparse” rather than plenitudinous. Linsky & Zalta develop an alternative approach on the basis of the second author’s “object theory”. The main feature of object theory is a very general comprehension principle which asserts the existence of a plenitude of abstract objects: for any collection of properties, there is an abstract object which “encodes” precisely these properties. In object theory, moreover, two abstract objects are identical just in case they encode precisely the same properties. Object theory’s comprehension principle and identity criterion are said to “provide the link between our cognitive faculty of understanding and abstract objects” (ibid., p. 547). (See Ebert & Rossberg 2007 for critical discussion.)

4.3 Lightweight semantic values

Assume that object realism is true. For convenience, assume also Classical Semantics. These assumptions ensure that the singular terms and quantifiers of mathematical language refer to and range over abstract objects. Given these assumptions, should one also be a mathematical platonist? In other words, do the objects that mathematical sentences refer to and quantify over satisfy Independence or some similar condition?

It will be useful to restate our assumptions in more neutral terms. We can do this by invoking the notion of a semantic value, which plays an important role in semantics and the philosophy of language. In these fields it is widely assumed that each expression makes some definite contribution to the truth-value of sentences in which the expression occurs. This contribution is known as the semantic value of the expression. It is widely assumed that (at least in extensional contexts) the semantic value of a singular term is just its referent.

Our assumptions can now be stated neutrally as the claim that mathematical singular terms have abstract semantic values and that its quantifiers range over the kinds of item that serve as semantic values. Let’s focus on the claim about singular terms. What is the philosophical significance of this claim? In particular, does it support some version of Independence? The answer will depend on what is required for a mathematical singular term to have a semantic value.

Some philosophers argue that not very much is required (Frege 1953, Dummett 1981, Dummett 1991a, Wright 1983, Hale & Wright 2000, Rayo 2013, and Linnebo 2012 and 2018). It suffices for the term t to make some definite contribution to the truth-values of sentences in which it occurs. The whole purpose of the notion of a semantic value was to represent such contributions. It therefore suffices for a singular term to possess a semantic value that it makes some such suitable contribution.

This may even open the way for a form of non-eliminative reductionism about mathematical objects (Dummett 1991a, Linnebo 2018). Although it is perfectly true that the mathematical singular term t has an abstract object as its semantic value, this truth may obtain in virtue of more basic facts which do not mention or involve the relevant abstract object. Compare for instance the relation of ownership that obtains between a person and her bank account. Although it is perfectly true that the person owns the bank account, this truth may obtain in virtue of more basic sociological or psychological facts which do not mention or involve the bank account.

If some lightweight account of semantic values is defensible, we can accept the assumptions of object realism and Classical Semantics without committing ourselves to any traditional or robust form of platonism.

4.4 Two further lightweight forms of object realism

We conclude by describing two further examples of lightweight forms of object realism that reject the platonistic analogy between mathematical objects and ordinary physical objects.

First, perhaps mathematical objects exist only in a potential manner, which contrasts with the actual mode of existence of ordinary physical objects. This idea is at the heart of the ancient notion of potential infinity (Lear 1980, Linnebo & Shapiro 2017). According to Aristotle, the natural numbers are potentially infinite in the sense that, however large a number we have produced (by instantiating it in the physical world), it is possible to produce an even larger number. But Aristotle denies that the natural numbers are actually infinite: this would require the physical world to be infinite, which he argues is impossible.

Following Cantor, most mathematicians and philosophers now defend the actual infinity of the natural numbers. This is made possible in part by denying the Aristotelian requirement that every number needs to be instantiated in the physical world. When this is denied, the actual infinity of the natural numbers no longer entails the actual infinity of the physical world.

However, a form of potentialism about the hierarchy of sets continues to enjoy considerable support, especially in connection with the iterative conception of sets (Parsons 1977, Jané 2010, Linnebo 2013, Studd 2013). No matter how many sets have been formed, it is possible to form even more. If true, this would mean that sets have a potential form of existence which distinguishes them sharply from ordinary physical objects.

Second, perhaps mathematical objects are ontologically dependent or derivative in a way that distinguishes them from independently existing physical objects (Rosen 2011, Donaldson 2017). For example, on the Aristotelian view just mentioned, a natural number depends for its existence on some instantiation or other in the physical world. There are other versions of the view as well. For example, Kit Fine (1995) and others argue that a set is ontologically dependent on its elements. (This view is also closely related to the set-theoretic potentialism mentioned above.)


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


Thanks to Philip Ebert, Leon Horsten, James Ladyman, Hannes Leitgeb, David Liggins, Alexander Paseau, and Philip Welch for comments and discussion. Thanks also to an audience at the ECAP6 in Krakow, where parts of this material were presented. This article was written during a period of leave funded by an AHRC Research Leave Grant (number AH/E003753/1). I gratefully acknowledge their support.

Copyright © 2018 by
Øystein Linnebo <>

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