Supplement to Platonism in the Philosophy of Mathematics

Some Definitions of ‘Platonism’

Dummett 1978b, p. 202:

Platonism, as a philosophy of mathematics, is founded on a simile: the comparison between the apprehension of mathematical truth to the perception of physical objects, and thus of mathematical reality to the physical universe.

Dummett 1991a, p. 301:

Platonism is the doctrine that mathematical theories relate to systems of abstract objects, existing independently of us, and that the statements of those theories are determinately true or false independently of our knowledge.

Field 1989, p. 1:

A mathematical realist, or platonist, (as I will use these terms) is a person who (a) believes in the existence of mathematical entities (numbers, functions, sets and so forth), and (b) believes them to be mind-independent and language-independent.

Gödel 1995, p. 323

[Platonism is] the view that mathematics describes a non-sensual reality, which exists independently both of the acts and [of] the dispositions of the human mind and is only perceived, and probably perceived very incompletely, by the human mind.

Maddy 1990, p. 21:

[Realism or platonism is the view that] mathematics is the scientific study of objectively existing mathematical entities just as physics is the study of physical entities. The statements of mathematics are true or false depending on the properties of those entities, independent of our ability, or lack thereof, to determine which.

Parsons 1983, p. 273:

As is customary in discussing the foundations of mathematics, platonism means here not just accepting abstract entities or universals but epistemological or metaphysical realism with respect to them. Thus a platonistic interpretation of a theory of mathematical objects takes the truth or falsity of statements of the theory, in particular statements of existence, to be objectively determined independently of the possibilities of our knowing this truth or falsity.

Shapiro 1997, p. 37:

[Realism in ontology or platonism is the view that] mathematical objects exist independently of mathematicians, and their minds, languages, and so on.

Resnik 1980, p. 162:

Let us call an ontological Platonist someone who recognizes the existence of numbers, sets, and the like as being on a par with ordinary objects and who does not attempt to reduce them to physical or subjective mental entities.

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Øystein Linnebo <>

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