Plutarch of Chaeronea in Boeotia (ca. 45–120 CE) was a Platonist philosopher, best known to the general public as author of his “Parallel Lives” of paired Greek and Roman statesmen and military leaders. He was a voluminous writer, author also of a collection of “Moralia” or “Ethical Essays,” mostly in dialogue format, many of them devoted to philosophical topics, not at all limited to ethics.
Plutarch's significance as a philosopher, on which this article concentrates, lies in his attempt to do justice to Plato's work as a whole, and to create a coherent and credible philosophical system out of it, as Plotinus will also do later (204–270 CE). Two moves are crucial in this regard. First, Plutarch respects both the skeptical/aporetic element in Plato (as marked by the tentativeness with which Socrates and the other main speakers in his dialogues regularly advance their views) and the views apparently endorsed by the main speakers of the dialogues, which were widely regarded as Plato's own doctrines (e.g. Diogenes Laertius 3.51–2). Second, Plutarch focuses primarily and quite strongly on the Timaeus for his understanding of Plato's “doctrines,” and his interpretation of this dialogue shapes his understanding of the entire Plato. Plutarch maintains a literal interpretation of the Timaeus, according to which the world has come about in time from two principles, the creator god and the “Indefinite Dyad”. While the Dyad accounts for disorder and multiplicity, such as that of disordered matter before the creation of the ordered physical world, of which pre-cosmic stage Timaeus appears to speak in the Timaeus, god accounts for order and the nature and identity of objects and properties in the world.
This metaphysical dualism is further strengthened by the assumption of two mediating entities through which the two principles operate; the Indefinite Dyad operates through a non-rational cosmic soul, while god through a rational one. This is the same soul, which becomes rational when god imparts reason from himself to it. As a result of god's imparting reason to the world soul, matter ceases to move in a disorderly manner, being brought into order through the imposition of Forms on it. The postulation of a non-rational pre-cosmic world soul, inspired mainly by Laws X (but absent from the Timaeus), allows Plutarch to dissolve the apparent contradiction in different works of Plato that the soul is said to be both uncreated (eternal) and created. For in his view the first soul of the sensible world, the world soul, is created only in the sense that god, the demiurge of the Timaeus, makes it rational. The postulation of a non-rational pre-cosmic soul also allows Plutarch to account for the existence of badness in the world, because in his view residual irrationality abides in the world soul even when it becomes rational, which is accounted for by the fact that the world soul is originally non-rational in the sense that its movement is such, i.e. disorderly, and reason is an element external to it.
This dualism (non-rational-disorderly-bad vs. rational-orderly-good) pervades also the sensible or physical world, since the human soul, being derivative from the world soul, has a rational and a non-rational aspect too, as the Republic proposes. In this spirit Plutarch distinguishes both in the world and in human beings three aspects, body, soul, and intellect. The soul's concern with the body gives rise to the non-rational aspect, which amounts to disorder, vice, or badness, while the co-operation between soul and intellect promotes rationality, that is, order, virtue, benevolence. In an attempt to accommodate the diverse strands of ethical thought in Plato (e.g. in the Gorgias, Protagoras, Republic, Phaedo, Theaetetus, Timaeus), Plutarch is the first Platonist to distinguish different levels of ethical life, which we could term political and theoretical respectively, depending on whether virtue pertains to the soul as organizing principle for one's daily life, or to the intellect as one's guide to knowledge of the Forms (which include virtues) and of the intelligible realm more generally.
- 1. Life and works
- 2. Plutarch's Platonism
- 3. Logic/Epistemology
- 4. Metaphysics
- 5. Psychology
- 6. Ethics and Politics
- 7. Poetics and Educational theory
- 8. Influence
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Plutarch was born in Chaeronea, a city of Boeotia in central Greece around 45–47 CE. This date is inferred from Plutarch's own testimony (On the E at Delphi 385B), according to which he began studying at Athens with a Platonist philosopher named Ammonius (see Dillon 1977, 189–192, Donini 1986b), when Nero was in Greece (66/67 CE). (This assumes that he was not more than twenty years old at the time.) We know little about Ammonius and his school, that is, also of Plutarch's institutional affiliation (the evidence of On the E at Delphi 387F has been much debated; see e.g. Donini 1986a, 209–212, 1986b, 108–119, Opsomer 1998, 21-25, 129-131). The main evidence about Ammonius' philosophical views is his speech as a character in On the E at Delphi (391E–394C), on god, being, generation and corruption as well as his contributions to the discussion in On the Obsolence of Oracles (410F–414C) regarding divine justice and providence (Dillon 1977, 189–192, Opsomer 2009, 142–179). This evidence can be reasonably considered indicative of Ammonius' engagement with metaphysics, which must have stimulated Plutarch's own interest in metaphysical questions. Plutarch must have stayed in Athens not only during his studies with Ammonius but considerably longer, so as to become an Athenian citizen (Table Talks 628A). According to this testimony, he also visited Rome (Demetrius 2) and Alexandria (Table Talks 678A; see Russell 1973, 7–8). However, Plutarch spent most of his life in his native city and in nearby Delphi. There must have been two reasons for this; first, Plutarch's strong ties with his family, which apparently was wealthy enough to support his studies and travels (Russell 1973, 3–5), and, second, his own interest in the religious activity of Delphi. The latter is testified to by the fact that Plutarch served in various positions in Delphi, including that of the priest of Apollo (Table Talks 700E), and also in his several works concerning Delphi and the local sacred rituals (On the E at Delphi, On Oracles at Delphi, On the Obsolescence of Oracles; see Stadter 2005). These works demonstrate intimate knowledge of Delphi, its traditions, and activities. Plutarch must have died after 119 CE, the date at which he was appointed procurator of Achaea by Hadrian (Eusebius' Chronicle).
Plutarch was a prolific writer. The so-called Lamprias catalogue, an ancient library catalogue (preserved mutilated), supposedly compiled by Plutarch's son Lamprias, lists 227 works, several of them no longer extant (Russell 1973, 18–19). Plutarch's works divide into philosophical and historical-biographical. The latter, the so-called Lives (Bioi) of distinguished Greek and Roman men examined in pairs, demonstrate Plutarch's historical and rhetorical abilities, also showing his interest in character formation and politics (Russell 1973, 100–116). Plutarch's philosophical works, many of them dialogues (set in Delphi or Chaeronea), cover half of his literary output. In modern times they have been published under the collective term Moralia, a term first given to a collection of eleven ethical works preserved in a 14th century manuscript (Parisinus Graecus 1672). When the collection was augmented by many other writings preserved in other manuscripts on topics ranging from metaphysics, psychology, natural philosophy, theology, logic, to philosophy of art, the name was retained with the misleading implication that Plutarch's philosophical works are essentially or primarily ethical.
Among Plutarch's works, several serve polemical purposes. He wrote a number of works against the Stoic and Epicurean philosophies. Against the Stoics are mainly the works On the Self-contradictions of the Stoics (De stoicorum repugnantiis), On the Common Notions against the Stoics (De communibus notitiis), On the Cleverness of Animals (De sollertia animalium), and On Moral Virtue (De virtute morali). Plutarch's main works against the Epicureans are: That One Cannot Live Happily Following Epicurus (Non posse suaviter vivere secundum Epicurum), Against Colotes (Adversus Colotem), Is ‘Live Unnoticed’ Well Said? (An recte dictum sit latenter esse vivendum). All these works are marked by the use of a distinct polemical tone against assumed adversaries, and of recognizable polemical strategies. They are often captious and in many instances betray a less than fair engagement with the views being opposed (see Warren 2011, 290–293 and Kechagia 2011, 135–294 for a vindication of Plutarch's polemics in Against Colotes).
It is worth considering why Plutarch engaged in writing so many polemical works against the two main Hellenistic schools of philosophy. One reason for Plutarch's preoccupation must be that the early Stoics and Epicureans both strongly criticized Plato. The Epicurean Colotes, for instance, Plutarch's target in the Against Colotes, was critical of Plato's dialogues in his Against Plato's Lysis and Against Plato's Euthydemus (meager fragments of which are preserved in Herculaneum papyri PHerc. 208, PHerc. 1032), while he also criticized the Republic's myth of Er and the implied view of an immortal human soul (Proclus, In Rempublicam 2.109.11–12, 111.6–17; see Kechagia 2011, 53–132). Another reason for Plutarch's engagement was the fact that both Epicureans and Stoics drew freely and extensively for their own purposes on Plato without acknowledging it and despite their criticism of Plato. This holds true especially for the Stoics (see Babut 1969a). They were inspired by the Timaeus, for instance, in their adoption of two principles, god and matter, but their god, unlike that of Plato, is immanent in the physical world and bodily, and he alone, without the Forms, suffices for the formation of matter. The Stoics were probably guided to their view that only bodies exist by passages in the Sophist (246a-247c) and in the Timaeus (31b-32c, 49d-e, 53b-c). For Plutarch, though, this is an utterly mistaken reading of the Timaeus (De communibus notitiis 1073D-1074E). Plutarch's polemics were, then, motivated by his desire to advocate Platonism against what he regarded as misguided interpretations and criticisms on the part of Epicureans and Stoics. This defense of Platonism was of vital importance for Platonism at Plutarch's time, since both Stoicism and Epicureanism were still thriving, mainly in virtue of their ethics. Plutarch wanted to show that Stoic and Epicurean ethics rest on mistaken assumptions about human nature and reality, which render their ethical doctrines useless (De virtute morali, De Stoicorum repugnantiis 1041E-1043A, De communibus notitiis 1060B-1073D). Plutarch's polemics were fuelled by the view he shares with Hellenistic philosophers that the end of philosophy is to support ethical life (see e.g. De profectibus in virtute); if a school's ethical ideal is unrealizable or, worse, unworthy of human nature, this for Plutarch (as for Antiochus, Cicero, De finibus 5.13, 5.89) is evidence that the entire philosophical system is a failure. As in the rest of his philosophical works, in his polemical treatises too, Plutarch aims to show that Plato's philosophy makes good sense as a whole, that is, it does justice to the world and human nature and can bring human beings to happiness (see below, sect. 2), but in his polemical works Plutarch aims especially to demonstrate that departure from Plato results in self-contradictions, of which he accuses the Stoics in particular (Boys-Stones 1997a). Two further features of Stoic and Epicurean philosophy appear to annoy Plutarch considerably: first, their dismissal of the aporetic/dialectical spirit that Socrates embodies, and which Plutarch regards as central to philosophy, and second, that Stoics and Epicureans alike adopt a corporealist or materialist metaphysics, rejecting the intelligible realm (that comprises god, Forms, immaterial souls), which was essential to Platonism. The central line permeating Plutarch's relevant criticism is that Stoics and Epicureans contradict our common notions (see e.g. De communibus notitiis 1073C-1074F) and do not do justice to things themselves (De profectibus in virtute 75F-76A). Ironically, perhaps, Plutarch's polemical writings are chiefly of interest—but also of very great value—for the many quotations they contain from Stoics, Epicurus, and other authors whose works were not preserved into modern times, and for his references to and paraphrases of their views in other passages of works available to him but not to us. Were it not for Plutarch, our grasp of Stoic and Epicurean philosophy would be much less extensive than it is, and our ability to reconstruct and appreciate their ideas much reduced.
Here is an overview of Plutarch's works, to give a sense of his conception of philosophy and of what in Platonist philosophy especially he valued.
Plutarch wrote relatively little in the field of “logic” in the ancient sense (logikê), which includes philosophy of language and epistemology. This, however, does not necessarily point to a lack of interest or knowledge on his part. Quite the opposite is the case. Plutarch is particularly attracted to epistemology because he considers this as a crucial aspect of Platonist philosophy. He seeks to defend the epistemology of Academic skeptics like Arcesilaus and Carneades and on these grounds to advocate the unity of the Academy against the criticisms of Antiochus of Ascalon (1st c. BCE; see below, sects. 2 and 3). The Lamprias list of Plutarch's works contains one on Stoic logic (Reply to Chrysippus on the First Consequent, #152), and two on Aristotle's: On Aristotle's Topics in eight books (#56), and a Lecture on the Ten Categories (#192), all of them now lost. The latter two are indicative of a reawakening of interest in Aristotelian logic, beginning in the 1st c. BCE, cultivated mainly by Peripatetics such as Boethus and Andronicus, but also characterizing Platonists of Plutarch's era, such as Eudorus and Nicostratus, who set themselves in dialogue especially with Aristotle's Categories. Although the content of these Plutarchean works remains unknown, we do have Plutarch's own claim that Aristotle's doctrine of categories is foreshadowed in the Timaeus (De an. procr. 1023E; Timaeus 37b-c), which suggests that he considered Aristotelian logic a welcome development of relevant Platonic ideas (Karamanolis 2006, 123–125). Plutarch's interest in the Topics, on the other hand, must have been motivated by his interest in the dialectical methodology of arguing both sides of a question (Karamanolis 2006, 86–87; see further below, sect. 3), to which the Topics is devoted. Plutarch's works on epistemology cover a broad spectrum of issues. The question of the criterion of truth must have been central to works such as On How We Should Judge Truth (#225), What is Understanding? (#144), That Understanding is Impossible (#146), none of which is extant today. The lost work Whether He Who Suspends Judgment on Everything is Led to Inaction (#158) must have confronted the common accusation against skepticism voiced in its title. Among Plutarch's surviving works important for understanding his epistemology are the Platonic Questions I and III, Against Colotes, On Common Notions, and On the Generation of the Soul 1024F-1025A (see below, sect. 3).
Plutarch paid special attention to “physics,”, which in antiquity included metaphysics, natural philosophy, psychology and theology. His most important surviving works in metaphysics are those related to the interpretation of the Timaeus, namely On the Generation of Soul in the Timaeus (De animae procreatione in Timaeo), On Isis and Osiris (De Iside et Osiride); from lost works of Plutarch relevant are the following: Where are the Forms? (#67), How Matter Participates in the Forms: It Constitutes the Primary Bodies (#68), On the World's Having Come into Beginning According to Plato (#66), On Matter (#185), On the Fifth Substance (#44). Plutarch shows quite some interest in the explanation of natural phenomena in several surviving works, most importantly in: On the Face Which Appears in the Orb of the Moon (De facie quae in orbe lunae apparet), On the Principle of Cold (De primo frigido), On the Cleverness of Animals (De sollertia animalism). Plutarch's interest in this area is apparently motivated by the wish to develop Platonist natural philosophy and also oppose the Stoics, who were dominant in this field especially since Posidonius (1st c. BCE), and in Plutarch's age with his much older contemporary Seneca (ca. 1BCE–65CE), the author of Naturales Quaestiones. Given the importance of god in the world's coming into being according to Plutarch, he is seriously engaged with theology, especially with questions pertaining to the relation between god and man, such as the issue of divination, divine justice and divine punishment, and so on, in: On Oracles at Delphi (De Pythiae oraculis), On the Obsolescence of Oracles (De defectu oraculorum), On the E at Delphi (De E apud Delphos), On Delays in Divine Punishment (De sera numinis vindicta), and On the Daemon of Socrates (De genio Socratis Socratis). Plutarch's On the Generation of Soul in the Timaeus together with the ten Platonic Questions illustrate well his work as a Platonic exegete (see Hershbell 1987, Ferrari 2001). Like the former work, most of the Platonic Questions also deal with metaphysics and psychology (Questions I and III are concerned with epistemology, VII with physics, and X with language).
Plutarch's ethical works include some of theoretical orientation (e.g. On Moral Virtue, which refutes the Stoic theory of virtue) and some of practical one (e.g. On Control of Anger, On Curiosity, How Could you Tell a Flatterer from a Friend), offering practical advice on how to attain virtue and build a good character. The tendency, however, to distinguish two altogether separate classes of ethical works (following Ziegler 1951, 768–825) is problematic given the considerable affinities between them, yet Plutarch does use different styles in them, presumably targeting different audiences (Van Hoof 2010, 264–265). Particularly representative of Plutarch's ethical views are the treatises On Moral Virtue (De virtute morali), On Making Progress in Virtue (De profectibus in virtute), On Delays in Divine Punishment (De sera numinis vindicta), On Control of Anger (De cohibenda ira), and On Tranquility of Mind (De tranquillitate animi). Plutarch wrote also works on aesthetics and education, which one could classify also as works of practical orientation. Plutarch, following Plato, evaluates poetry from the point of view of ethical education. In this category belong the works On How the Young Man Should Listen to Poets (De audiendis poetis) and On the Education of Children (De liberis educandis), the latter of dubious authenticity (Ziegler 1951, 809–811).
Finally, Plutarch wrote a number of works on aspects and figures of the history of philosophy, all lost, such as On What Heraclitus Maintained (#205), On Empedocles (#43), On the Cyrenaics (#188), On the Difference between Pyrrhonians and Academics (#64), On the Unity of the Academy Since Plato (#63). The latter two could not have been merely historical, however; the historical perspective must rather have served to defend the point of view of the skeptical Academy, which Plutarch advocated as doing justice to the aporetic spirit of Plato's philosophy (see below, sect. 2).
Plutarch lived in the wake of the revival of the dogmatic interpretation of Plato begun by Antiochus and Eudorus in the 1st c. BCE, which in a way he continues. Plutarch, however, shows a more complex philosophical profile, apparently through developing the version of Academic skepticism defended by Antiochus' contemporary Philo of Larissa and also (slightly later) Cicero. He strives for a synthesis of the skeptical interpretation of Plato, defended by the Academic skeptics Arcesilaus, Carneades and Philo, with that of Antiochus' dogmatic interpretation, according to which Plato held doctrines of his own. Thus Plutarch objects to the distinction that Antiochus suggested between Socratic and Platonic philosophy and the corresponding division of Plato's dialogues into Socratic/aporetic and Platonic/doctrinal (Cicero, Academica I.15–17). For Plutarch, rather Plato accommodates harmoniously both an aporetic and a doctrinal element in his philosophy. According to Plutarch, the aporetic element in Plato encourages a way of searching for the truth without prejudices or a priori commitments, and this practically amounts to a dialectical inquiry, arguing either side of a given question; but this dialectical spirit does not deny the possibility of reaching firm conclusions, or even the possibility of achieving secure knowledge. According to Plutarch, Plato had reached such conclusions in his dialogues, which can be identified as Plato's doctrines and yet he still preserved the spirit of unceasing inquiry, embedded in the dialogue form itself, by not holding them in a way which closed off reconsideration and further inquiry. This is why Plutarch advocates an epistemology that integrates both the suspension of judgment (i.e., the rejection of dogmatism) and a defense of the possibility of acquiring true knowledge (see below, sect. 3). On this basis Plutarch defends the unity of the Academy, going all the way back to Plato, which Antiochus had considered as having been disrupted with the advent of Academic Skepticism, in lost treatises, such as On the Unity of the Academy since Plato, On the Difference Between Pyrrhoneans and Academics (see Adversus Colotem 1121F-1122E, Platonic Question I; with Opsomer 1998, 127–133). Plutarch actually tried to disengage the term ‘Academic’ from implying exclusive commitment to the skeptical construal of Plato. Suspension of judgment, he thinks, is rather an established method of philosophical research followed by several illustrious ancient philosophers (Heraclitus, Parmenides, Socrates, Plato), rather than an innovation of Arcesilaus (Adv. Col. 1121F-1122A). For Plutarch, the Academic both appreciates Plato's aporetic spirit and still values his doctrines. Similar in this respect appears to be the position of the anonymous author of the (1st c. CE?) Commentary on the Theaetetus and of Plutarch's friend Favorinus, the addressee of his On the Principle of Cold (cf. ibid. 955C, see Opsomer 1997, Opsomer 1998, 26–82, 213–240).
In accordance with this conception of Platonism, Plutarch himself writes dialogues, which, like Plato's, are either dramatic (e.g. De cohibenda ira), narrated (e.g. De sera numinis vindicta), or mixed (De genio Socratis); see the typology of Platonic dialogues in Diogenes Laertius 3.50). As in Plato, in Plutarch's dialogues too the speakers give long speeches in favor of a certain view (Russell 1973, 34–36). It is often unclear, however, with what view Plutarch sympathizes, despite the fact that sometimes he appears as character in some dialogues (e.g. On the E at Delphi). Besides, Plutarch, following Plato again, often uses myths, metaphors, and analogies. The work On Isis and Osiris is particularly interesting in this regard. In it Plutarch relates the myth of the two Egyptian deities, yet he interprets it allegorically as a story informative about god, being, and creation (Ziegler 1951, 206–208). Of special interest are the eschatological myths in Plutarch, as they integrate cosmological, psychological, and ethical considerations. This is the case with the myth narrated in On The Face Which Appears in the Orb of the Moon, which centers on the role of the moon in the world and its role in the life of souls (see Cherniss, Plutarch Moralia, vol. XII, Loeb, Introduction). Analogous is the case of the work On the Delays of the Divine Vengeance, where Plutarch sets out to defend divine providence, yet, following Plato's claim of presenting only a likely account (eikôs mythos) in the Timaeus, he claims to be offering only what seems likely to him about divine actions (549E-F), and also like Plato, Plutarch structures his work into argument (logos) and a narrative (mythos). These authorial practices present a problem for the scholar who wants to identify Plutarch's own philosophical views, just as they do with Plato's own dialogues. The works that unambiguously present Plutarch's opinions on exegetical and philosophical matters are On the Generation of Soul in the Timaeus, and Platonic Questions, while the others must be used with caution, for the reasons given above, or because of their polemical aim and tone (see Opsomer 2007).
Plutarch represents a synthesis also with regard to his philosophical interests. On the one hand he shares Antiochus' emphasis on ethics, yet on the other he focuses considerably on metaphysics, which was revived by Eudorus (end of 1st c. BCE) and flourished with Neo-Pythagorean Platonists such as Moderatus (1st c. CE). Like them, Plutarch (as noted above) pays special attention to the Timaeus, which from then on became the keystone of Platonism. Plutarch is particularly interested in the generation of the soul, and he devotes an entire treatise to discussing one short passage, Timaeus 35a1–36b5 (On the Generation of Soul in the Timaeus; see Cherniss, Plutarch Moralia, Loeb vol. XIII.1, 133–149, Hershbell 1987). It is not an exaggeration to say that Plutarch's interpretation of the Timaeus shapes his entire philosophy. This is because Plutarch apparently endorses the idea suggested in the Timaeus that the universe is a unified whole with humans being an integral part of this unity, which means that both the physical world and natural phenomena as well as human beings and human society should be approached from a cosmic/metaphysical point of view. In the case of natural phenomena, this means that explanations should make reference to intelligible causes (De primo frigido 948B-C) which account for the nature of things in the world, while in the case of human beings, their nature and their final end in life, that is, their happiness cannot be determined unless one understands that the human constitution is similar to that of the world, consisting of body, soul, and intellect (De facie 943A, 945A, De virtute morali 441D). Plutarch systematically employs the analogy between worldly macrocosm and human microcosm, suggested in the Timaeus, which is important also in Stoicism (see below, sect. 5, 6).
Plutarch is also familiar with Neo-Pythagorean and Aristotelian philosophies. Interest in both Pythagorean ideas and Aristotelianism were in vogue at the end of the 1st century BCE and during the 1st century CE, when Plutarch writes. There is a wave of Neo–Pythagorean treatises written at this time, such as those of ps–Archytas, Euryphamus, Theages (see Dillon 1977, 341–361, 1988b, 119–122, Centrone 1990), while Plutarch's contemporary Moderatus attempted to systematize Pythagorean ideas as background to Plato (he wrote a work Pythagorean Doctrines in many books; Stephanus Byzantius, s.v. Gadeira, Porphyry, Life of Pythagoras 48; Dillon 1977, 344–351). Aristotelian philosophy, on the other hand, was revived by Peripatetics and Platonists alike during this period. In the Peripatetic camp this is the time when Andronicus of Rhodes was active, being responsible for a complete edition of Aristotle's works at the end of the 1st century BCE, while Xenarchus of Seleukeia was critically engaged with Aristotle's physics. But already before them, Antiochus and Cicero had been well acquainted with Aristotle's works, the former arguing that Aristotle was in essential agreement with Plato, at least in ethical theory (Cicero, Academica I.17, De finibus V.12). Antiochus' students Aristo (of Alexandria) and Cratippus regarded themselves as Peripatetics (Index Academicorum col. 35.2-17 Dorandi), while the Platonust Eudorus did not hesitate to use Aristotle in order to identify Pythagorean metaphysical principles in Plato (Alexander, In Met. 58.25–59.8 with reference to Aristotle Metaphysics 988a8–17). Plutarch was familiar with several Aristotelian treatises from all periods of his writing career (cf. Adv. Col. 1115B-C) and, quite interestingly, he preserves numerous fragments from lost Aristotelian works (see Ross, Aristotelis Fragmenta Selecta, Karamanolis 2006, 89–92). Plutarch's attitude to Pythagoreanism and Aristotle is complex and sophisticated. Plutarch's cosmic principles, the One and the Indefinite Dyad (De defectu oraculorum 428F-429A), allegedly found in the Timaeus, had long been considered Pythagorean in origin. Plutarch shows his familiarity with Pythagoreanism in the second (and rather cryptic) part of On the Generation of the Soul in Timaeus, where he seeks to explain the nature and role of numbers and ratios in the Timaeus making repeated references to Pythagoreans. Plutarch also integrates into Platonism other Pythagorean elements, such as number symbolism (De E 387F, De def. or. 429D-430B), abstinence from meat (On the Eating of Flesh; De esu carnium), and a belief in the rationality of animals (On the Cleverness of Animals, Beasts are Rational; Bruta Animalia Ratione Uti), probably because he considers them implied in, or compatible with, statements made in Plato (e.g. in the Phaedo, Timaeus). With regard to Aristotle, Plutarch is more cautious than Antiochus; he considers some of Aristotle's doctrines to be an articulation or development of Platonic philosophy (e.g. Aristotle's ethics, logic and science; see Teodorsson 1999), and espouses them as being Platonic (e.g. De virtute morali 442B-C, De an. procr. 1023E). However, he also criticizes Aristotle for contradicting Plato's presumed doctrines (e.g. on the Forms and on the constitution of the world; Adv. Col. 1114F-1115C; see Karamanolis 2006, 85–126).
Hence it is wrong to portray Plutarch as an eclectic philosopher (e.g. Ziegler 1951, 940, F. Babbitt, Plutarch's Moralia, Introduction, vol. I, Loeb 1927, xiv, Becchi 1981), who occasionally compromises his Platonism in order to carry out his polemic (Dörrie 1971, Donini 1988b, 131, 1999, 16–19). Rather Plutarch uses philosophers such as Aristotle only instrumentally in order to advance through them what he perceives as Plato's doctrines (Karamanolis 2006, 92–109). Plutarch shares with Antiochus (Cicero, Academica I.17–19, 33–34) the view that Plato's philosophy is subject to articulation and development through his successors in the Platonist tradition, but also to misinterpretation and distortion. On this view, Xenocrates, Polemo and Aristotle developed and articulated Platonic philosophy, though not without faults, while the Stoics and Epicureans were instead guilty of systematic distortion. Plutarch is not a populariser either (Babbitt op. cit.). Rather, Plutarch's work shows great complexity and sophistication and evinces the spirit of a meticulous interpreter, who ventures to advance innovative views, such as on the creation of the soul, on human constitution, as well as on ethics and poetics (see below, sects. 6 and 7). It is also unfair to say of Plutarch that he was “no original thinker” (Ziegler 1951, 938–939). Plutarch lived in an age in which philosophy had taken the form of exegesis of classical philosophical texts, but through this exegetical process philosophers in late antiquity (such as Plotinus and the commentators on Plato and Aristotle) crystallize and voice their own views on crucial philosophical questions. Indeed Plutarch takes some very interesting lines on metaphysics, psychology, and ethics, which became influential in later generations of Platonists, such as Plotinus and Porphyry (see below, sect. 4, 5, 6).
Like the Hellenistic Philosophers and Antiochus, Plutarch appears to be particularly sensitive to the question of how we acquire knowledge. Plutarch sets out to defend the interpretation of Plato's epistemology maintained in the skeptical Academy. According to this interpretation, suspension of judgment (epochê) is the best way to avoid overhasty commitment to opinions (doxai), since the appearances on which they are based can be deceitful. Plutarch defends this epistemological position against the Stoic accusation that such an attitude leads to inaction, making life impossible, and also against the Epicurean claim that sense-experiences are always true. Plutarch distinguishes between three different movements in the soul, which are identical to those assumed by the Stoics, namely those of sensation (phantastikon), impulse (hormê), and assent (synkatathetikon; Adv. Col. 1122B). The first two alone, Plutarch argues, against the Stoics, suffice to produce action (Adv. Col. 1122C-D). Since suspension of judgment does not interfere with either perception/sensation or impulse, it does not affect our actions but only eliminates opinions (ibid. 1122B). Consequently, Plutarch argues, suspension of judgment saves us from making mistakes (1124B) but does not prevent us at all from acting. Opsomer (1998, 88) has rightly noted that Plutarch's argument is very similar to that of the Pyrrhonian skeptics. Plutarch recommends suspension of judgment as a method of testing and evaluating knowledge obtained through the senses (Adv. Col. 1124B). This is not only because the senses often deceive us (De primo frigido 952A, De E392E); the problem according to Plutarch rather is that the world is a place that cannot be known perfectly. This, however, does not amount to dismissal of the senses, which is how Colotes criticized Plato (Adv. Col. 1114D-F). According to Plutarch, the senses are of limited application because they can at best inform us only about the sensible world, which is a world of generation, of appearances, not of being (De E 392E). For a Platonist like Plutarch, perfect knowledge can only be of being, and for that we need to transcend the sensible world and move our thought to the intelligible one (De Iside 382D-383A).
Plutarch makes a sharp distinction between sensible and intelligible knowledge, which corresponds to the fundamental ontological distinction between sensible or physical and intelligible reality (Plat. Quest. 1002B-C). He appears to distinguish two distinct faculties of human knowledge, the sensory and the intellectual, each of which grasps the corresponding part of reality (Plat. Quest. 1002D-E). The cognitive faculty for intelligibles, the human intellect, is external to the embodied soul (De an. procr. 1026E, Plat. Quest. 1001C, 1002F; cf. Numenius fr. 42 Des Places); the sensory faculty, on the other hand, comes about when the soul enters the body (De virtute morali 442B-F; see below, sect. 5), and provides the means for dealing effectively in daily life with our needs and circumstances in the physical world as it appears to our senses. In Plutarch's view, human beings come to understand through the intellect by making use of the notions or concepts (ennoiai), apparently identifiable with the Forms (Plat. Quest. 1001E), with which the intellect is inherently equipped. That is, the embodied soul recollects what it knows from its inherent familiarity with the intelligible realm, as Plato argued in the discussion of anamnêsis or recollection in the Meno (Plat. Quest. 1001D, 1002E; Opsomer 1998, 193–198). This knowledge of intelligibles is superior to sensory “knowledge,” which can only remain at the level of belief (pistis) and conjecture (eikasia; Plat. Quest. 1001C). Indeed, knowledge of intelligibles can take one as far as to understand the divine realm (ibid. 1002E, 1004D). But we can achieve this kind of knowledge, Plutarch suggests, only when “souls are free to migrate to the realm of the indivisible and the unseen” (De Iside 382F). This is the main task of philosophy for Plutarch. Philosophy in his view must be inspired by the Socratic practice of inquiry, and this practice amounts to the continuous search for truth, which presupposes that, following the example of Socrates, one admits ignorance (Adv. Col. 1117D, De adulatore et amico 72A).
According to Plutarch, knowledge of intelligibles through anamnêsis is not in tension with the Academic prescription for suspension of judgment; rather, knowledge can be advanced by suspension of judgment, since the latter puts aside opinion (doxa) as well as egoism (philautia), both of which prevent us from finding the truth (Plat. Quest. 1000C). To be in a position to carry out this search for truth, however, one must search oneself and purify one's soul, Plutarch argues (Adv. Col. 1118C-E). And he points out that Socrates promoted precisely this practice, using the elenchus as a purgative medicine, trying to remove false claims to knowledge and arrogance from the souls of his interlocutors, and to seek truth along with them, instead of defending his own view (Plat. Quest. 999E-F, 1000B, 1000D; Opsomer 1988, 145-150, Shiffman 2010). Socrates, Plutarch claims, was in a position to do that because he had purified his soul from passions (De genio Socratis 588E), hence he was capable of understanding the voice of his daimôn, his intellect (see below, sect. 5).
Plutarch does not defend the Socratic-Academic epistemology only at the theoretical level, but also applies it practically. While discussing in On the Principle of Cold whether cold is a principle rather than a privation and whether earth is the primary cold element, he defends suspension of judgment as the right attitude to take on the matter (955C; see Babut 2007, 72–76 contra Boys-Stones 1997b). This is indicative of Plutarch's attitude to natural phenomena quite generally. He maintains that natural phenomena cannot be understood merely by means of investigating their natural causes. The discovery of the immediate, natural causes, Plutarch argues, is only the beginning of an investigation into the first and highest causes, which are intelligible (De primo frigido 948B-C; Donini 1986a, 210-211, Opsomer 1998, 215–6). In other words, a metaphysical explanation in terms of the Forms and god, the creator of the universe, must be sought (De def. or. 435E-436A). This is what, for Plutarch, demarcates the philosopher from the mere natural scientist (physikos; De primo frigido 948B-C), a distinction further exploited by later Platonists (e.g. Atticus fr. 5 Des Places, Porphyry in Simplicius, In Physica 9.10–13; fr. 119 Smith). Plutarch is guided here by the dichotomy between natural and intelligible causes found in Phaedo 97B-99D and Timaeus 68E-69D (Opsomer 1998, 183). Explaining the physical world through an appeal to natural causes alone is insufficient, Plutarch argues, since such an explanation ignores the agent (god) and the end for which something happens in the world (De def. or. 435E). The fundamental ontological and epistemological distinction between the sensible and intelligible realms suggests to Plutarch an analogous distinction of corresponding levels of explanation (Donini 1986a, 212, Opsomer 1998, 217). Plutarch maintains that there are two levels of causality, physical and intelligible, and full understanding of natural phenomena requires the grasping of both. While in the case of natural phenomena suspension of judgment maintains an unfailing spirit of research, in the case of the divine realm, where human understanding is seriously limited, suspension of judgment, Plutarch suggests, is due also as a form of piety towards the divine (De sera 549E; Opsomer 1998, 178–179).
Plutarch's metaphysics rests heavily on his interpretation of the Timaeus. Plutarch maintains that the cosmogony of the Timaeus must be interpreted literally, which means that the world had a temporal beginning (Plat. Quest. 1001B-C, De an. procr. 1013C-1024C; cf. Timaeus 30a, 52d-53b). Plutarch argues against the interpretation of most Platonists of his time, who refuse to understand creation in terms of an actual generation (De an. procr. 1013E). He appears to believe that his interpretation is the only way to understand Plato's claim that the soul is “senior” to the body (Timaeus 34c), and that it initiates all change and motion (De an. procr. 1013D-F; Phaedrus 245c, Laws 896a-c). This literal interpretation of the Timaeus also aims to solve the puzzle of how the soul in Plato is said to be both uncreated (Phaedrus 245c-246a) as well as created (Timaeus 34b-35a; De an. procr. 1016A), and how the soul is said to be a mixed entity composed of indivisible being (i.e. intellect) and divisible being (i.e. the non-rational pre-cosmic soul; Timaeus 35a; De an. procr. 1014D-E, 1024A). Plutarch tries to address these issues in a number of works (see above, sect. 1), most importantly, of the surviving ones, in On the Generation of Soul in the Timaeus, a commentary on Timaeus 35a1–36b5, as I noted above.
Plutarch proposes the following interpretation. The cosmos is an ordered entity that has come into existence at a certain point (when time did not exist; Plat. Quest. 1007C) as a result of the contact between god and pre-existing, disorderly matter. God puts this matter in order (De an. procr. 1024C; cf. De Iside 374E-F), which means that god cannot be the only cosmic principle, otherwise disorderly matter would be left unaccounted for. Plutarch postulates two antithetic and antagonistic cosmic principles: the one is God (the Monad or the One, the unitary eternal substance from which everything devolves; see below sect. 4.3), and the other is the Indefinite Dyad, both principles being eternal and uncreated (De def. or. 428E-F). God is the real being, unchangeable, simple (De E 392E-393B), and good (De def. or. 423D)—the cause of order, intelligibility, stability, and identity in the universe. This is why God is the object of striving for all nature (De facie 944E). The Indefinite Dyad, on the other hand, is the principle of non-being, multiplicity, disorder, chaos, irrationality and badness (De def. or. 428F). This principle is described as being identical with matter which is ordered by God (De def. or. 428F-429D) or by its logos (De Iside 373A-C), yet the existence in it of an active element which is essentially disorderly and evil (De Iside 369D–F; Dillon 1977, 206–8) seems to suggest that the Indefinite Dyad is regarded not merely as identical with matter, taken as the underlying element of all qualities, as is suggested in Timaeus 50e (De def. or. 414F).). These two principles, God and the Indefinite Dyad, were allegedly accepted by the ancient Pythagoreans (Diogenes Laertius 8.24–25; Diels-Kranz 58 Βl), and by the Neo-Pythagoreans of Plutarch's time (Sextus Empiricus, Against the Mathematicians 10.261–284, Nicomachus, Introductio Arithmetica II.18.4; see Dillon 1977, 342–3, 354), but they were also attributed to Plato (Plato, Parmenides 149d2, Simplicius, In Physica 453.25–7), presumably by neo-Pythagorean Platonists (Eudorus in Simplicius, In Physica 181.7–30, Moderatus, ibid. 231.8–9; see Kahn 2001, 105–110 and Numenius in SEP). Plutarch identifies the two principles with the Limited and the Unlimited of the Philebus (he also calls the Indefinite Dyad limitlessness, apeiria; De def. or. 428F). The two principles are constantly opposing each other in the form of goodness and badness (De def. or. 429B-D, De Iside 369E; Dillon 1977, 203). Although God, the One, prevails over the Dyad (De def. or. 429C-D), order and goodness are always in danger of being displaced by disorder and badness. Both the Indefinite Dyad and God relate to the universe through intermediaries, namely a non-rational and a rational world soul (see above), which operate as antithetic powers of the two antagonistic cosmic principles. The result of the interaction of the two cosmic principles through these powers is the cosmos in which humans live.
This interaction happens in stages. Before the world has come into being, the universe was animated by the non-rational world soul, which accounts for the disordered motion of matter. In Plutarch's words, “what preceded the generation of the world was disorder, disorder not incorporeal or immobile or inanimate, but of corporeality amorphous and incoherent, and of motivity demented and irrational, and this was the discord of soul that has not reason” (De an. procr. 1014B; Cherniss' trans., altered). Plato speaks indeed of the receptacle as amorphous (Timaeus 50d7, 51a7), there is, however, no explicit mention of a non-rational pre-cosmic soul in the Timaeus, which is why Plutarch has been accused of arbitrariness in this regard (Cherniss, Plutarch Moralia, Loeb vol. XIII.1, 140–147). It is wrong, though, to treat Plutarch as one might treat a modern commentator of the Timaeus, with conscientious scholarly attention to what is and is not made explicit in a text. Plutarch assumes that there is a single “Platonic view” about the generation of the world, the first principles of reality, and the role of soul in the world's generation, and he seeks support for his interpretation in many Platonic dialogues. He identifies the non-rational soul with the “disorderly and maleficent soul” of Laws X (a testimony Plutarch himself considers unambiguous, De Iside 370F), with the “limitlessness” of the Philebus (26b), the “congenital desire” and “inbred character” of the Politicus (272d, 273b), and with the necessity (anankê) and the generation (genesis) of Timaeus 52d (De an. procr. 1014D-1015A). None of these passages lend clear support to Plutarch's interpretation, since nowhere does Plato explicitly speak of a pre-cosmic maleficent soul or other pre-cosmic soul-like entities: even the maleficent soul of the Laws is not pre-cosmic (Cherniss, ibid. 140). Yet Plutarch's interpretation does have merits in imposing consistency on Plato's work as a whole in the following sense. First, according to the Timaeus (35a) the demiurge (the creator god) does not create the substance of the soul, but compounds the world soul by blending indivisible with divisible being, which Plutarch not unreasonably identifies with the divine intellect and the non-rational world soul respectively (De an. procr. 1014D-E). This does justice to the nature of the soul, which for Platonists is not subject to change and corruption. Secondly, it was generally assumed that no motion is possible without a principle of motion (cf. Aristotle, De anima 402a6–7), and this traditionally is identified with the soul in Platonism (cf. Phaedrus 245c-e); so the disordered motion of matter before the creation of cosmos that Plato appears to postulate in the Timaeus needs to be accounted for by a soul (see Laws 892a), which must, then, be a pre-cosmic one (De an. procr. 1015E).
Further, the existence of a pre-cosmic non-rational soul is suggested also if one considers the world soul and the human soul in conjunction. Already the Timaeus (34c, 41d-e, 69c) suggests a relation between the two. Plutarch takes the human soul to be derivative from the world soul, which means that their natures are similar (De an. procr. 1025A-D; see below, sect. 5). In Republic 4, in the Phaedrus and also in the Timaeus it is argued that the human soul has a rational and a non-rational aspect, fighting for dominance. And it is suggested that order and harmony is established in the soul when the rational aspect rules over the non-rational, yet the non-rational aspect is always capable of revolting against rationality and creating disorder and badness. Plutarch identifies the rational aspect with intellect, which he distinguishes from the soul, making the former the cause of order and goodness while the latter the cause of disorder and badness (De an. procr. 1015E; see below, sect. 5). If the human soul reflects the nature of the world soul, then also in the latter even when rationality prevails, when the cosmos comes into being, there is room for disharmony and disorder. This is evidenced by occurrences of badness in the world, such as accidents, natural catastrophes, etc. If there is no such non-rational aspect in the world soul, then either God must be ultimately accountable for such phenomena, which is what the Stoics maintain – and this, argues Plutarch, hardly fits God's goodness (De an. procr. 1015A–B) – or they must happen without cause, as the Epicureans maintain, which then diminishes God's ruling power (ibid. 1015C). Better to think that such occurences are caused by the non-rational aspect of the world soul. Finally, a pre-cosmic soul is needed to play the role of mediator between God and matter (De an. procr. 1015B, 1024C; cf. Timaeus 35a), which is required in order to maintain God's transcendence, goodness, and purity, since matter, because of its inherent disorderliness and badness, pollutes and taints, and thus is hardly worthy of God (cf. Numenius fr. 52.37–39 Des Places; see also below, sect. 4.3).
The first stage in creation is that God imparts his own intelligence and reason to the pre-cosmic non-rational soul, making it into a partly rational thing (De an. procr. 1014C-D, 1016E-D, Plat. Quest. 1001B-C). Plutarch makes clear that the rational world soul is “not merely a work but also a part of God and has come to be not by his agency, but both from him as a source and out of his substance” (Plat. Quest. 1001C). Since the world soul, thus constructed, contains divine reason, which is a “portion” (moira) or “efflux” (aporrhoê) of God (De Iside 382B), it is not merely a product of God but rather an inseparable part of him (De sera 559D, Plat. Quest. 1001C). That is, the world soul becomes assimilated to God (homoiôsis; De sera 550D). This does not entirely eradicate the world soul's initial non-rationality (De an. procr. 1027A), yet the motions produced by the world soul become now (for the most part) harmonious and orderly (De an. procr. 1014C-E). This means that matter ceases to be disordered and indefinite. Matter now becomes stable and “similar to the entities that are invariably identical” (ibid. 1015F). Presumably Plutarch is referring here to the transcendent Forms. He states that the cosmos comes into being when the soul disperses the semblances from the intelligible world to this one (ibid. 1024C; cf. Timaeus 50c-e, 52d-53c). Plutarch appears to maintain that the world soul is capable of being molded by receiving the intelligible Forms, which is how presumably the world soul becomes rational (De an. procr. 1024C). The world soul, then, transmits the Forms onto matter (De Iside 373A, De Pyth. orac. 404C). This transmission seems to take a two-stage process, allegedly implied in the Timaeus. First, the Forms inform matter to bring about primary bodies, such as water and fire, as Timaeus 53b-d, 69b-c suggests (De an. procr. 1025A-B, Plat. Quest. 1001D-E); second, the imposition of further Forms on matter brings about compound material stuffs and different kinds of objects, which make up the cosmos (De Iside 372E-F, 373E-F).
The precise role of Forms in Plutarch's interpretation of the creation remains obscure. Plutarch discussed this issue in treatises no longer extant, such as, for example, Where are the Forms?, yet the relevant surviving evidence is inconclusive (see though Schoppe 1994, Ferrari 1995, 1996b). Some insight can be gained from the myth of Isis and Osiris, which Plutarch presents as an analogy to the world creation in his De Iside et Osiride. Osiris is a divine intellect that brings everything into being by being sown in matter, that is, in Isis, the reasons (logoi) of himself (De Iside 372E-F), eventually producing Horus, i.e. the cosmos (ibid. 374A, De an. procr. 1026C). Osiris is identified with the good itself (372E), to which Isis always inclines, offering herself to be impregnated “ with effluxes and likenesses in which she rejoices” (ibid. 373A). Apparently Osiris stands for the demiurge of the Timaeus and also the Form of the Good of the Republic (cf. De an. procr. 1017 A-B) —which explains why Osiris constitutes the object of desire by nature and Isis (De Iside 372E-F; cf. De facie 944E) and Isis stands for the receptacle (De Iside ibid., De an. procr. 1026C; Timaeus 49a, 51a). This suggests that Plutarch probably maintained the existence of the Forms in God (cf. Timaeus 39e), as did several other Platonists in late antiquity (e.g. Alcinous, Didascalikos 163.11–17, with Dillon 1993, 93–96). This is supported by the fact that for Plutarch Osiris is both the intellect and the logos present in the world soul (De Iside 371A, 376C, De an. procr. 1023C–D) and by Plutarch's claim that God is the totality of Forms (paradeigma; De sera 550D; see Helmig 2005, 20–26). However, it is not clear how for Plutarch the Forms exist in God, since in Plutarch's view God, as Osiris, can be analyzed into three elements, intellect, soul, and body (De Iside 373A). That Plutarch makes such a distinction with regard to God is also supported by his claim that “God is not senseless nor inanimate nor subject to human control” (De Iside 377E-F) and also by his reference to the body of Osiris, which symbolizes the Forms immanent in matter (ibid.; Dillon 1977, 200). Presumably, then, Plutarch assumes the existence of a divine soul, guided by statements in Plato Philebus 30c, Sophist 248d-249a, Timaeus 46d-e, according to which the intellect, to the extent that it implies life, requires the presence of the principle of life, namely soul (Plat. Quest. 1002F).
There is a question, then, as to where in the divine creator the transcendent Forms reside. We have reason to believe that Plutarch places the Forms not in the intellect of the divine creator as thoughts, as was assumed by several later Platonists (e.g. Alcinous, Porphyry), but rather in the soul (Schoppe 1994, 172–178, Baltes 2001; against Opsomer 2001, 195–197). Syrianus testifies this explicitly (In Metaphysica 105.36–38), while we find the same doctrine also in Atticus (frs. 8, 11, 35 Des Places; Karamanolis 2006, 169–170), who was said in antiquity to follow Plutarch in the interpretation of the cosmogony of the Timaeus (Iamblichus, De anima, in Stobaeus 1.49.37, Proclus, In Timaeum 1.276.30–277.7, 325.30–326.6; Atticus frs. 10, 19, 22 Des Places). The reason for endorsing such a view presumably was that it allows one to maintain the utter simplicity and order of the demiurgic intellect, so as to preserve God as the source of intelligibility, and yet to distance God from the creation, without, however, either creating gaps between god and creation or destroying the unity of God. This was the path already taken by Moderatus (Dillon 1977, 348) and later Platonists, such as Numenius and Plotinus, who postulated distinct divine hypostases. If Plutarch endorsed the view that the Forms exist in the divine soul, this may explain why he sometimes speaks of God and the Forms as a unity (e.g. De sera 550D), and at other times as if they are separate (De an. procr. 1024C-D, Plat. Quest. 1001E; Helmig 2005, 24–5). The reason may be that sometimes Plutarch speaks of the divine creator in the strict sense, as an intellect, and some other times in the wider sense, as an animated intellect (one in a soul). When Plutarch refers to being, the receptacle, and genesis in Timaeus 52d2–4, identifying the last with the non-rational soul, the receptacle with matter, and being with the intelligible realm, while he also mentions an intellect “abiding and immobile all by itself,” this is not evidence that Plutarch adds arbitrarily a fourth entity, the divine intellect, as Cherniss (Plutarch Moralia, Loeb XIII.1, 143) argued. Apparently Plutarch understands “being” in Timaeus 52d2 as equivalent to “animal” in Timaeus 39e8, namely as that which comprises both the divine intellect (in a soul) and the intelligible Forms.
The antagonism between God and the Indefinite Dyad, between intellect and soul, between the rational and the non-rational aspect of the world soul, and ultimately between goodness and badness is an entrenched feature of the world, according to Plutarch. He claims that the world contains both goodness and badness and he postulates two antithetical principles to account for each one of them (De Iside 369C–D), since God can only be the principle of goodness (ibid; cf. Republic 379c, Theaetetus 176a). And he criticizes the Epicureans and the Stoics, who postulate either matter (the atoms) or god respectively as active principles of the world (De Iside 369A). Plutarch expresses his dualism also in religious-symbolic terms: he equates the pair of good and evil principles with the Persian pair of gods Oromazes and Areimanius (De Iside 369D–E). Plutarch's pervasive dualism gives rise to problems, however. The constant presence and operation of the disorderly, non-rational aspect of the soul in the universe (De an. procr. 1027A), implies God's failure totally to dominate. Plutarch appears to maintain that God's power is limited by the necessity (anankê) imposed by matter. Yet, on the other hand, he does distinguish between the rule of nature, or fate, on the one hand, and divine providence on the other, arguing, against the Stoics, that God can dominate nature (De facie 927A-B) and can function providentially for us (De comm. not. 1075E, De Iside 371A, De defect oraculorum 413E –Ammonius speaking). The fact that God, by means of his logos, with which he is often identified (De Iside 373A-B), moulds the principle of disorder, the Indefinite Dyad, suggests to Plutarch the supremacy of God over any other force. This is actually one of the reasons why Plutarch defends temporal creation; if the world were eternal and God responsible for it, then God would be the cause of both good and bad, while on Plutarch's interpretation of the Timaeus badness is accounted for by the evil world soul, which, as I said above, according to Plutarch is pre-cosmic (see Dillon 2002, 234; see also below, sect. 4.3).
The problem however remains. It becomes more serious if we move from the cosmic macrocosm to the human microcosm. If disorder, non-rationality, and badness are cosmic forces, producing what is bad in the world, the question is how they relate to the bad or the vice caused by human beings. Plutarch distinguishes three causes, fate, chance, and ourselves as causes of what is up to us, all of which play a role in what happens to us (Quaest. Conv. 740C-D). The first two kinds of causes need some explanation in view of Plutarch's metaphysical principles. Presumably, fate amounts to God, chance to the non-rational part of the world soul, since the latter can bring about events not planned by God which are disorderly and evil. Plutarch's distinction amounts to three classes of events. Some events are fated (or planned by God), some happen by chance (or through the operation of the non-rational aspect of the world soul), while there is a third class of events for which we, humans, are the only causes (De tranq. an. 476E). We can, Plutarch says, decide what to do, how to live our lives, but not how life will turn out in terms of desired or intended outcomes of our actions (ibid. 467A-B; Eliasson 2008, 130–141). He criticizes the Stoics for violating this distinction, arguing that the Stoic notion of “that which is up to us” coincides with the Stoic notion of fate (De Stoic. repugn. 1056E-D). In view of that evidence Plutarch may appear to defend human freedom, but the problem remains, since it is still unclear how the human's participation in the intelligible realm through soul and intellect, sharing the characteristics of the (originally non-rational) world soul and the (naturally rational) divine intellect, shapes one's character and accounts for one's actions in life.
The issue of human freedom becomes more complex in view of Plutarch's conception of god and his theory of divine providence. This is an important aspect of Plutarch's philosophy. Plutarch distinguishes sharply between God or the divine (theos, to theion) and gods, and the question is how the plurality of gods is to be understood vis-à-vis the first God. This is not entirely clear (Ziegler 1951, 940). Plutarch appears to maintain that the first God can take different names, yet he is to be distinguished from the deities of the Greek pantheon (such as Asclepius in Amatorius 758A-B), who are to be identified with the lesser gods. In the On the E at Delphi Apollo is presented as the supreme God (393D-394A), while elsewhere it is Zeus who is described as the supreme God, creator of the universe (De facie 927B). According to Plutarch the first God constitutes a unity of utter simplicity, a unity including all divine beings in it (De Iside 377F), and is identified with the Good and with Being (De E 393B–D; see Opsomer 2009, 158–160). Apparently Plutarch identifies the highest principle with the Form of the Good of the Republic and with the demiurge of the Timaeus (see Ferrari 2005, Brenk 2005), a tendency that Numenius and Plotinus will resist later. God rules over the world and provides for it, but being supreme (anôtatô; Plat. Quest. 1000E), father of gods and men alike, he remains transcendent. This becomes clear in Ammonius' speech in On the E in Delphi, where God is said to be “beyond everything” (epekeina tou pantos; 393B), but also in the On the Obsolescence of Oracles, where Lamprias defends the possibility of God being provident over many worlds, provided that these are of a finite number (426E). This means that God is not immanent in the world, and yet he is its creator. God's transcendence is maintained by delegating to the world soul some mediatory demiurgic performance (see above, sect. 4.1; cf. Opsomer 2005, 94–5). This resonates with Plutarch's more general view (inspired by Plato), according to which the soul has a mediating role between the intellect and the body or sensible reality (see below, sect. 5).
Apart from the world soul, the creator God also needs some further mediation with the sensible world if his transcendence is to be maintained—this is already suggested in the distinction between the demiurge and the lesser gods in the Timaeus (42e). Plutarch acknowledges the existence of divine entities inferior to the first God or the One but also to gods, namely the “daimones.” They are said to be “by nature on the boundary between gods and humans” (De def. or. 416C). Placed in the moon, these lesser gods mediate between the first God and human beings, thus extending God's providence to them (Dillon 1977, 216–8). Plutarch explores a tradition going back to Empedocles, to Plato (Symposium 202d–203e, Phaedo 107D, 113D, Republic 427b, 620d, Timaeus 90a-d), and to Xenocrates, by whom he appears to be particularly influenced on this matter (De Iside 360E, De def. or. 416C–D). The precise role of the demons becomes an interesting issue in view of the fact that Plutarch speaks of two kinds of demons, good and bad, and indeed he claims that demons exhibit different degrees of virtue and vice, as is the case with men too (De def. or. 417B, De Iside 360E). Plutarch provides us with evidence according to which the role of demons consists in communicating God's will to humans, bestowing them with prophetic powers and inspiration (Amatorius 758E, De genio Socratis 580C, De facie 944C–D), in taking care of humans when they are needy (Amatorius 758A–B), in taking care of the sanctuaries and the sacred rites (De def. or. 417A–B), but also in punishing humans and avenging human bad acts (ibid.). The latter is the role of the bad demons. For apparently Plutarch maintained that proper punishment is never vengeful. This emerges when Plutarch discusses the question of divine punishment in his work On the Delays of the Divine Vengeance (De sera numinis vindicta).
In this work Plutarch examines an issue with which philosophers of his age are seriously concerned, namely that of theodicy. Even if God is not responsible for occurrences of evil (see above, sect. 4.2), there is a question of why these are not always punished promptly by God. In his treatise On the Delays of the Divine Vengeance Plutarch addresses the question of whether the delays of divine punishment speak against the existence of divine providence (550C) and he replies that this is not the case. God, he argues, acts on reason, not on passionate anger or impulse (551A, 557E), thus avoiding errors, and by doing so, Plutarch continues, he sets the model for our own actions (ibid.). On the other hand, Plutarch argues that human wickedness is not always to be punished, because it of itself ruins the life of those who act thus, and this is already a sufficient punishment (ibid. 556D-E). Besides, Plutarch suggests, the punishment of the divine does not have to be obvious; this can actually take place in the afterlife of the soul, as is suggested in Republic 10, so Plutarch claims that “it is one and the same argument …that establishes both the providence of god and the survival of the human soul” (560F; see also below, sect. 5).
Plutarch, as a Platonist, regards soul as responsible for all life and all motion of any kind. The world and all living beings have soul. While in Plato soul sometimes includes (or is even restricted to) intellect (e.g. Phaedo 94b) and sometimes not (e.g. Phaedrus 247c, Timaeus 69c–e), Plutarch distinguishes sharply between soul and intellect. For Plutarch soul is essentially non-rational and yet receptive of reason that stems from the intellect (De virtute morali 441F). Plutarch criticizes the Stoics who analyze the nature of man in two parts only, body and soul, for disregarding the intellect (De facie 943A–B; see Alt 1993, 94–6). For Plutarch the threefold distinction of the individual person (body, soul, and intellect) has its equivalent in the universe at large. As the human soul is intermediary between body and intellect, similarly, Plutarch claims, the world soul is intermediary between earth and sun (De facie 943A, 945A, De virtute morali 441D; see Deuse 1985, 45–47, Opsomer 1994). In both the human being and the world, the intellect is external to the soul (cf. Phaedrus 247c–d); the world soul is informed by the reason of the creator god, the demiurge, while in the case of humans the intellect amounts to the “daimôn” assigned to each of us (De genio Socratis 591E), which is what Republic 620d and, especially, Timaeus 90a-d suggest. Ultimately both the world soul and the human souls are informed by reason and become rational by coming into contact with the divine intellect. Plutarch argues that all ensouled beings, including animals, exhibit the presence of the divine intellect (De Iside 382A–B). However, as I said above (sect. 4.1), an element of non-rationality always remains in souls (De an. procr. 1027A), but Plutarch claims that this happens in different degrees, depending on how much a soul partakes of intellect (De genio Socratis 588 D, 591D–E). On this basis Plutarch argues, against the Stoics, that animals also share in reason (De sollertia animalium esp. 960B). The extent to which a soul partakes of reason largely depends on the training and the habits of that soul itself. Strong emotions, for instance, distance soul from intellect and increase its non-rationality (De genio Socratis 591D; see Dillon 1977, 212–213).
Plutarch maintains that there is a constant interaction between intellect, soul, and body. This interaction manifests itself both at a psychological and at an ethical level. The soul as such accounts for the senses, while the intellect accounts for intelligence (De an. procr. 1026D–E). Clearly, though, perception is an activity involving both the senses and the notions residing in the intellect (see above, sect. 3). It is the intellect that gives order to the sense impressions and accounts for understanding. Analogously, the interaction of soul and body gives rise to non-rational movement or passion, while the interaction between intellect and soul brings about rational movement, harmony and virtue (De sera 566A–D, 591D–F; see Dillon 1977, 194). Plutarch actually suggests that the soul that is devoid of intellect comes close to being quasi-corporeal (De sera 566A; Teodorsson 1994, 120). Regarding the embodied soul, Plutarch appears to be guided by Aristotle's view in the De anima (see also Phaedo 82d–e), arguing that the soul uses the body as an instrument. The soul, he argues, develops faculties, such as the vegetative, the nutritive, the perceptive, when associating with the body, so that it can carry out the functions of an animated body (De virtute morali 442B, 450E, 451A, Plat. Quest. 107E–1009B; Karamanolis 2006, 111–113, Baltes 2000). This coordination of the body is such that we sense and understand, and this is possible because the soul is informed by the intellect (De genio Socratis 589A).
For Plutarch, the proximity of soul as such to body in its operations as living body is evidence for the superiority of the intellect. Inspired by passages in Plato such as Phaedrus 247c and Timaeus 30b, 90a, Plutarch argues that intellect is as superior to soul as soul is to body (De facie 943A). In his view, the intelligent part of the human soul is not subject to corruption (De genio Socratis 591D-F) and Plutarch identifies it with one's true self. He argues that one's self is neither that in virtue of which we sense nor that in virtue of which we desire, but rather that in virtue of which we reason and think (De facie 944F–945A; cf. Timaeus 90a-d). Plutarch actually goes so far as to distinguish two kinds of death, first when intellect leaves soul and body, second when soul leaves body (De facie 943A–B; see Donini 1988b, 140–143, Brenk 1994, 15). The separation of intellect from soul and body happens “by love for the image of the sun…for which all nature strives” (De facie 944E). The ascent to the sun as the goal of intellect symbolizes the human being's imitation of, and assimilation to, the divine, and is a frequent theme in Plutarch (De Iside 372D-E, De E 393D–F, De sera 556D; see Brenk 1994, 10–14, Becchi 1997). This is illustrated in the myth presented in On Delays in Divine Punishment of a certain Aridaeus, who like Er in the Republic, died but has come back to life to narrate his experience after death. The death of Aridaeus amounts to the fall of the intelligent part of his soul (to phronoun; De sera 563E–F, 566A), through which humans partake of the divine (564C), with the soul remaining behind (allê psychê) as an anchor in the body (564C; cf. 560C-D). The latter is the non-rational part of the soul, which is such because it is bound to the body (sômatoeidês; 566A) and inclines the entire soul toward earthly concerns, preventing the soul from going very far away (566D). This is very similar to what Plotinus maintains later in Enn. IV.8.8.1. However, in his On the Soul that is only fragmentarily preserved, Plutarch speaks of the separation of soul from body and recounts the story of a certain Antyllos who had died and then his soul had been released again (fr. 176 Sandbach). In this context Plutarch claims that the doctrine of the incorruptibility of the soul is an ancient one (fr. 177 Sandbach), a claim which may well be a criticism of the Epicurean doctrine of the mortality of soul (cf. Non posse suaviter vivi 1103F; see Bonazzi 2010, 78–83). Inspired by the Phaedo, Plutarch argues that the very task of philosophy is to prepare us for the separation from the body, which amounts to a life without bodily needs that he considers as the “true life”, which in his view the Epicureans ignore (Non posse suaviter vivi 1105C–E). After death, Plutarch claims, souls go through the process of reincarnation, which, as in Plato, is a form of punishment for wicked souls (De sera 567D-F). While all intellects live eternally, those of noble souls become divine (daimones) and operate as guardians of humans (De genio Socratis 593D-594A; see further Dillon 1977, 219–224). Such evidence suggests that for Plutarch both intellect and soul are immortal though in a different way, a doctrine we find also later in Porphyry (fr. 453 Smith).
Plutarch shares the view of Hellenistic philosophers that philosophy is a way of life. He is much concerned to advocate the life according to Plato, and to show that such life is possible and indeed happy (Adv. Col. 1107E, Non posse suaviter vivi 1086C-D). He criticizes Stoics and Epicureans for proposing misguided ethical ideals (e.g. An recte dictum sit latenter esse vivendum 1129F-1130E). Plutarch's strong concern with ethics is reflected also in his Lives, which focus on the character of a historical figure. Central to these is how man's nature (physis) can be educated so that a certain state of character is formed (êthos; Pericles 38, Alcibiades 2.1, De sera 551E-F, 552C-D; Russell 1973, 105-106, 117). Plutarch's especially strong interest in ethics among the sub-fields of philosophy is characteristic of his age. The two most prominent of Plutarch's Stoic contemporaries or near-contemporaries, Epictetus and Seneca, devote most of their attention in their writings to ethics, and this is the case also with the Peripatetic Aristocles of Messene (1st c. CE?), the author of some eight books on ethics (Suda s.v. Aristocles). To some extent, this especially strong interest in ethics goes back to Antiochus (1st c. BCE). Plutarch and the Peripatetic Aristocles identify ethical formation as the ultimate goal of philosophy, yet Plutarch at least differs from Antiochus in that he founds his ethics on metaphysics, largely based on his interpretation of the Timaeus outlined above (sect. 4.1). It is because Plutarch maintains the existence of an intelligible world, which has shaped the sensible world including humans, that he rejects the ethics of both Stoics and Epicureans. On the basis of the Phaedrus and the Timaeus, Plutarch maintains that both the human intellect and the human soul stem from the intelligible realm, the indivisible and the divisible being respectively, which shapes our human nature accordingly (cf. Plat. Quest. 1001C).
Plutarch argues that the crucial difference between the Platonic and the Stoic understanding of virtue is grounded in their different conceptions of soul as the source of human agency (De virtute morali 441C-E). While for the Stoics soul is reason only, Plutarch defends the conception of soul outlined in the Republic (esp. book 4), which presents the soul as consisting of rational and non-rational parts. As explained above (sect. 4), this fits well with Plutarch's interpretation of the creation of the world, according to which the pre-cosmic non-rational world soul is informed by the reason (logos) of the divine demiurge, yet this is not sufficient to eliminate its natural non-rationality. The non-rational aspect of the human soul accounts for emotions and bodily desires (Opsomer 1994, 41). In fact, however, Plutarch does not lump together bodily desires and emotions as constituting an undifferentiated non-rational part. Given the theory of Republic 4, Plutarch distinguishes spirit, as responsible for emotions, from appetite, which is responsible for bodily desires. But he classes them together to the extent that both are dependent upon reason, sensitive to, and nurtured by, it (De virtute morali 443C-D; Plat. Quest. 1008A-B). Plutarch describes virtue (without mentioning appetite) as the state in which reason succeeds in managing emotion and drives it in the right direction (De virtute morali 443B-D, 444B-C, 451C-E), while vice arises when emotion is not properly informed by reason (443D). Plutarch defines virtue as the state in which emotion is present as matter and reason as form (440D), a definition inspired by Nicomachean Ethics 1104b13–30 (cf. Aspasius, In Ethica Nicomachea 42.20–25). Plutarch's definition of virtue matches his account of how the world came into being, when matter was informed by reason. As with the world soul, similarly with the human soul in Plutarch's view, the impact of reason is possible because the soul, or part thereof, can heed what reason dictates.
Interestingly, Plutarch does not refer to the Timaeus to support his theory of the tripartite soul, but rather to Aristotle (De virtute morali 442B-C), whom Plutarch, like most ancient and modern commentators, recognizes as adopting essential aspects of Plato's doctrine. The essential feature that Aristotle shares with Plato is the belief in rational and non-rational aspects of the soul. This accounts for unself-controlled actions that, Plutarch thinks, prove how mistaken is the Stoic conception of human agency as deriving from reason alone. Plutarch also relies largely on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics with regard to the nature of virtue. He describes virtue as being an extreme of excellence (akrotês), which however lies in a mean, determined by reason, between two opposite emotions (De virtute morali 443D-444D; Nicomachean Ethics 1107a6-8). Plutarch argues that there can be no virtue without some emotion. Without some amount of fear, Plutarch contends, there can be no courage, for instance (De virtute morali 451E-452A); courage, he claims, is the virtue that one acquires when, in a state of fear, one manages to subordinate fear to a goal set by reason, such as fighting for one's country; in this sense, emotion is an ally to reason in constituting virtue (cf. De tranq. animi 471D). Plutarch suggests this specifically in the case of anger becoming bravery (De ira fr. 148 Sandbach). Anger, when moderated and guided by reason, can also motivate reasonable and due vengeance (De sera 551A-B).
Since virtue is the state (hexis 443D) in which emotion is guided by reason, it follows that virtue requires training in how to make emotion right. Plutarch devotes an entire treatise to that subject (De profectibus in virtute). He defends, against the Stoics, the view that progress in virtue is possible (ignoring the relevant views of Epictetus, Dissertations I.4 and Seneca, Letters to Lucilius 75.8). Education in virtue can be provided by parents and teachers, by the example of the virtuous actions of the people around us (De communibus notitiis 1069A), by the law of the cities (De virtute morali 452D), and also by philosophy, poetry and history (De profectibus 79B-80B). Plutarch tries indeed to offer such an education in virtue through his writings that have practical orientation, such as On the Control of Anger, On Curiosity, How Could you Tell a Flatterer from a Friend, Precepts of Marriage, To an Uneducated Ruler (see Van Hoof 2010), which are similar in spirit with the works of Philodemus On Property Management, On the Good Ruler according to Homer and Seneca's Letters to Lucilius. Plutarch maintains that the pervasion of emotion by reason should be thorough, which is why he claims that the temperate person is less virtuous than the practically wise one (phronimos), who does the good without wavering (De virtute morali 445C-D; cf. Nicomachean Ethics 1151b23–1152a3), as a temperate person might. To the extent that virtue reflects the operation of reason in the human soul, which is capable of following reason, virtue, Plutarch argues, is natural to us. He argues that nature itself attracts us (oikeiousa) to things which are natural for us to strive for, but these include also life, health, beauty, which Plutarch considers as completing happiness (symplêrotika, De communibus notitiis 1060B-E). Plutarch censures the Stoics because they argue that the final human end is to live in accordance with nature, but, he claims, they contradict themselves when they admit only virtue as being good, neglecting all other things which are, by everyone's admission, good for us, such as health. Plutarch, like Antiochus, maintains that the human final end includes the satisfaction of primary demands of the body, a doctrine Plutarch finds in Aristotle, Xenocrates and Polemo (De communibus notitiis 1069E-F).
This, however, is not the only conception of happiness that Plutarch advocates. While he argues against the Stoics that a life of thinking only, devoid of all affection, cannot be happy (De tranq. animi 468D), he also defends an alternative end for human life, which consists in a life of theoria (an Aristotelian term meaning contemplative knowing) or, in Plutarch's words, epopteia (a religious term referring to the final vision achieved in initation ceremonies for mystery religions; De Iside 382D-E; cf. Quaestiones Convivales 718d). Formally, the end that Plutarch advocates for human beings is, as he says, a life similar to god (De sera 550D-E). This end is suggested in the several eschatological stories found in Plutarch's work, which suggest that a human being can transcend the sensible world and become united with the divine (see Alt 1993, 185–204). This doctrine, which has its roots in the Phaedo, the Theaetetus and Republic X, is again to be understood against Plutarch's interpretation of the cosmogony of the Timaeus. The “younger gods” of the Timaeus imitate the demiurge in constructing human beings' and the other animals' bodies and souls (40b-d, 42e), and this is also the case with nature, which strives to imitate the creator and become like him (De facie 944; Helmig 2005, 21–23). This assimilation with god (homoiôsis) amounts to the complete domination of the intelligible aspect of humans over the sensible one. Humans are invited to follow the cosmic example and in this sense to live in accordance with nature too. To achieve this, one should let his intellect rule and get beyond having any emotions. This amounts to having and exercising theoretical virtue alone, which pertains to the intellect (Non posse suaviter vivi 1092E). The practical virtues that pertain to the embodied soul are achieved, according to Plutarch, through the subordination of emotion to reason (Tyrwitt frs. p. 68 Sandbach). Plutarch's distinction between a life of happiness through theorizing or contemplation and a practical life of happiness is made in his On Moral Virtue, apparently inspired by the relevant Aristotelian distinction in Nicomachean Ethics. Plutarch suggests that his theoretical ideal does not only require a distinct kind of virtue but also determines a distinct kind of happiness. In this Plutarch anticipates Plotinus' distinction of two kinds of ethical life, a political and a theoretical one. For Plutarch, however, the theoretical ideal of the philosopher involves a political dimension too, which is to help their fellow citizens and the city with his reasoning, as is suggested in the Republic, and he criticizes both Stoics and Epicureans for refusing to engage in politics (De Stoic. rep. 1033A–1034C, Adv. Col. 1126B–1127E, Ad Princ. Inerud. 780C–F).
Given Plutarch's concern for the education of character and of the city as a whole, it is hardly surprising that he wrote works on education (On the Education of Children, De liberis educandis, which is considered spurious, however, by Ziegler 1951, 809–812) and especially on the effect that poetry has on the education of one's character. His most important work in this field is On How the Young Man Should Listen to Poets (Quomodo adolscens poetas audire debeat; De aud. poet.), while he also wrote a treatise on Homer (De Homero) that is no loner extant. In the former work Plutarch deals with the question of how young people should read and understand poetry, since poetry can be both beneficial and harmful, depending on its interpretation. Following the Republic, Plutarch argues that poetry is a mimetic art; it imitates the character and lives of various people, good and bad alike (De aud. poet. 17E-F, 26A). In the course of this, Plutarch claims, poets tell lies and present obscene stories and images (ibid. 16A). Plutarch selects examples of such poetic habits mainly from the Republic, focusing on stories from Homer in particular. Plutarch does not condemn poetry altogether; he rather finds a convenient middle solution. He tries to show how one should read the poets in the most beneficial way. In order to do so, Plutarch argues, first one should avoid reading the deliberate lies made in poetry, which can unnecessarily upset one (ibid. 17B; see Russell 1989, 303). Second, Plutarch recommends that the reader, especially the young one, should learn how to read poetry allegorically, in such a way that this can have a beneficial effect on one's character (ibid. 19E-20B; see Lamberton 2001, 48-50). This is the approach that Plutarch himself applies to the myth of Isis and Osiris in his work with that title. Plutarch illustrates the search for the correct (morally uplifting) meaning of a poetic saying also in parts of the Table Talks (Quaestiones Conviviales 622C, 673C; see Russell 1989, 305). The young man needs to learn the skill of how to recover and isolate the beneficial elements of poetry and absorb them alone. In that way poetry can guide one to virtue (ibid. 28E-F). Plutarch likens properly educated young men in their attitude towards poetry to the way bees select the best from flowers (32E), a simile adopted by the Christians, Basil (To young men on the right use of literature 4.7–8), and Gregory of Nazianzus (Orationes 43.13.1). Such a use of poetry, Plutarch claims, prepares youths for their education in philosophy (De aud. poet. 15F, 37B). This happens in two ways. First, poetry can guide youths towards philosophy by familiarizing them with the concepts that philosophers also use; second, poetry, as we have seen, when properly used, can guide to virtue, and this, Plutarch argues, is a requirement for philosophical education (De aud. poet. 36D-37B). Plutarch actually maintains that the best of poetry is nothing other than philosophy in disguise (ibid. 15F), and throughout his work he tries to illustrate precisely this through a selection of verses from the most well known ancient poets. In On Making Progress in Virtue (79B-D) Plutarch goes so far as to treat poetry and history as complementary to philosophy in educating one's character. Regarding the educative role of poetry, Plutarch appears to be influenced by the Stoics, who were using poetry in education, but he goes further than they in devising specific strategies meant to turn young men into good readers of poetry (see Blank 2011).
From this point of view, one may relate Plutarch's Lives to his philosophical works (see Gill 2006, 421–424). Plutarch himself says he wrote the Lives for the improvement of others, assuming that the actions of virtue will instigate emulation in the reader (Pericles 1–2; see Russell 1973, 100–101). Perhaps, then, the Lives also aim to train the reader's character, and in such a way to prepare them for the life of philosophy. If this is the case, then the Lives are complementary with Plutarch's ethical works of practical orientation that I discuss in the previous section.
Plutarch exercised considerable influence on later Platonism. His emphasis on the Timaeus and on metaphysics and psychology set the tone for the following generations of Platonists, in which metaphysical and psychological questions and the high authority of the Timaeus were prominent features of philosophical inquiry. Plutarch's literal interpretation of the Timaeus itself was highly debated among Platonists. It was adopted by Atticus, but was resisted by most others, including Taurus, Porphyry and Proclus. Later Platonists criticized Plutarch for a narrow-minded interpretation of the Timaeus, some of their criticisms (e.g. on the world soul), however, rest on an uncharitable interpretation of Plutarch (see Opsomer 2001). Nevertheless, Plutarch's view that the world soul is created in the sense that it partakes of reason and intelligence imparted to it by the demiurge, is endorsed by Alcinous, Didascalikos 169.33–42 and presumably also by Numenius (fr. 45 Des Places; see Dillon 1993, 127). Plutarch's radical metaphysical and psychological dualism is shared by Numenius and Atticus, but is rejected by Plotinus and Porphyry. The latter, however, draws on Plutarch in his argument that animals partake of reason (De abstinentia 3.6–7). Plutarch's theory of divine providence and theodicy, as presented in his On Delays of the Divine Providence (De sera numinis vindicta) was influential among ancient Platonists and Christians alike. Proclus, for instance, took over much from it in his Ten Objections Against Divine Providence (esp. 8 and 9). Despite the vagaries of judgment by later Platonists of Plutarch's work, Plutarch not only set the agenda of questions for later Platonists, redirecting their attention to the Timaeus, but he was also influential in terms of his interpretative strategy in approaching Plato's writings, which aspired to take into account Plato's entire work and to treat it as a system still to be articulated. It is this strategy that leads Plutarch to distinguish hierarchies of being in Plato's work and also levels of ethical life, a strategy that Plotinus will adopt and develop. Plutarch was highly influential also among early Christians, who approved of his literal interpretation of the Timaeus, of his theory of good and bad demons, and of his educational theory. His work was used by Clement of Alexandria, who followed Plutarch in writing a treatise with the title “Stromateis,” but also by Eusebius, Cyril of Alexandria and the Cappadocean Church Fathers, especially Basil (see above, sect. 7).
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The author thanks Christoph Helmig and Christopher Noble for suggestions and remarks, and especially John Cooper for many valuable comments and suggestions while preparing this article for publication.