Antiochus of Ascalon

First published Tue Mar 1, 2005; substantive revision Mon Apr 9, 2018

Antiochus, who was active in the latter part of the second and the early part of the first centuries B.C.E., was a member of the Academy, Plato’s school, during its skeptical phase. After espousing skepticism himself, he became a dogmatist. He defended an epistemological theory essentially the same as the Stoics’ and an ethical theory which synthesized elements from the Stoa and Plato and Aristotle. In both areas he claimed to be reviving the doctrines of the Old Academy of Plato and his earliest successors and Aristotle.

1. Life, Works and Background

Antiochus was born in the latter part of the second century B.C.E. in Ascalon (whose site is in present-day Israel) and died in 69/8 B.C.E. (On Antiochus’ life, see Hatzimichali 2012). Early in life he moved to Athens, at this time still the center of the ancient philosophical world, where he became a member of the Academy, the philosophical school founded by Plato in the fourth century B.C.E. He may also have studied with certain of the Stoic philosophers then active in Athens. His membership in the Academy dates from around 110 B.C.E., the date when Philo of Larissa became the school’s head, or scholarch. At this time Philo championed a form of the skepticism that had been defended in the Academy since the scholarchate of Arcesilaus, in the first half of the third century B.C.E. Antiochus was for many years a student and follower of Philo, whose views he defended in his writings, but at an uncertain point (though before 79 B.C.E.; see Section 3) he broke sharply with Philo and rejected skepticism (Cicero, Acad. 2.69).

A measure of caution is in order. “Skeptic” is an ancient Greek term meaning inquirer. The Academics did not use it of themselves; The descriptive appellation ‘skeptic[al] ’ was first applied by Pyrrhonians to their school in order to signal their commitment to open-minded inquiry (see the overview in the entry on ancient skepticism). Understood in this way, the term applies at least as well to the skeptical Academy as to the Pyrrhonian school, which was founded or revived by Aenesidemus, an Academic who reacted against what he saw as an increasingly dogmatic tendency in the Academy of his time in the first century B.C.E. Later in antiquity the term “skeptic” seems to have been applied to both schools. A range of arguments that, in one way or another, call the existence or possibility of knowledge into question, together with the positions or attitudes taken in response to, or expressed by, these arguments, have been styled “skeptical”, and several forms of skepticism were defended by different Academics in the course of the school’s history.

From his break with Philo Antiochus was a dogmatist, who maintained that knowledge was possible and that there were truths known to him and other human beings. It is clear that he began a new school of thought and attracted followers. Later in antiquity, when different phases in the history of the Academy corresponding to changes in doctrine and philosophical approach were distinguished, some people spoke of a fourth Academy of Philo and a fifth of Antiochus (Sextus Empiricus [S.E.], Outlines of Pyrrhonism, i.e., Pyrrhoneae hypotyposes [PH] 1.220). These distinctions were not meant to correspond to changes in the Academy as an institution, and evidence about institutional developments and the relations between them and Antiochus’ change in intellectual direction is fragmentary and unclear. It is not plain, e.g., whether he began expounding his new views while still a member of the Academy or after forming a group around himself, which he dubbed the ‘Old Academy’ in order to signal his allegiance to the original Old Academy of Plato and his immediate successors and to contrast it with the ‘New Academy’ of Philo and his predecessors from the time of Arcesilaus (cf. Polito 2012)

Political instability in Athens led Philo to transfer his activities to Rome in 88 B.C.E. We know that Antiochus was in Alexandria the following year in the company of Lucullus, a Roman general and statesman, with whom he maintained ties for the rest of his life. He also exerted an influence on other prominent Romans. Cicero, though not a follower of his, studied with Antiochus in Athens in 79. Varro, apart from Cicero the greatest Roman intellectual of the first century B.C.E., and Brutus, the assassin of Caesar, were adherents of Antiochus’ philosophy (on Varro, see Blank 2012).

None of Antiochus’ books have survived, but we know something about them. He wrote an epistemological work called Canonica in at least two books. The title comes from ‘kanôn,’ meaning a ruler or straightedge, a term that was used by philosophers in the Hellenistic period for the standard or criterion of truth. It is cited by Sextus Empiricus in his survey of views about the criterion of truth at Against the professors, i.e., Adversus Mathematicos [M] 7.162, 202, and modern scholars have conjectured that it was Sextus’ source for much of that survey (cf. Tarrant, 1985, 94–6; Sedley, 1992). The Sosus, possibly a dialogue, was also an epistemological work and belonged to the last phase of Antiochus’ controversy with Philo (Cicero, Acad. 2.12). He wrote a book about the gods, concerning which we know nothing more. He sent a book to the Roman Stoic, Balbus, in which he maintained that, despite differences in terminology, the Stoics and Peripatetics (as Aristotle’s successors in his school, the Peripatos, were called) were largely in agreement on matters of substance (Cicero, N.D. 1.16). And Cicero informs us that he wrote in many places about his view of the relation between happiness and virtue (T.D. 5.22).

2. Overview of Antiochus’ Philosophy

Antiochus regarded the criterion of truth and the goal (telos, end) of human life as the two most important concerns of philosophy (Cicero, Acad. 2.29), and we are best informed about his epistemological and ethical views. As we have seen, the occasion for his break from Philo was a disagreement about knowledge. After years of loyally defending the skepticism of Philo and his Academic predecessors, Antiochus came to embrace the opposing dogmatic position that knowledge is possible. What is more, he maintained that the original or Old Academy of Plato and his immediate followers were of the same opinion. This put him in conflict with his more immediate predecessors, some of whom had argued that Plato should also be interpreted as a skeptic (Cicero, Acad. 1.46). Thus, according to Antiochus, it was not he who was departing from Academic tradition, but the institution from the time of Arcesilaus to Philo that had betrayed the true Academic inheritance of the original Old Academy, which he was now restoring.

There is a further complication. The epistemology that Antiochus defended was Stoic in all essential points (Brittain 2012). This was obvious to his contemporaries, some of whom charged that, far from being an Academic of any kind, he was a Stoic and belonged in the Stoa rather than in the Academy (Acad. 2.69, 132, cf. 137; S.E. PH 1.235). In reply, Antiochus maintained that the Old Academy, the Peripatos and the Stoa were in fundamental agreement. According to him, far from being an innovator, Zeno of Citium, the founder of Stoicism, was responsible mainly only for a new terminology and a handful of corrections to the Old Academic doctrine (Cicero, Acad. 1.35). Though unconvincing to many of his contemporaries, this historical thesis explains how Antiochus could defend Stoic epistemology against the arguments made by his Academic predecessors while claiming to revive the Old Academy. His arguments about both epistemology and ethics were embedded in this reinterpretation of Academic history and thus were part of an argument about who was the legitimate heir of the school’s tradition.

Matters were likely more complicated still, and the state of the evidence leaves much room for interpretative disagreement. Some scholars have argued that his engagement with Platonism was more thoroughgoing than ancient and modern interpreters who have emphasized his debts to Stoicism tend to allow. The tantalizing fact that Zeno studied with the Academic scholarch, Polemo, lends some plausibility to the idea that Stoicism was itself indebted to the Old Academy in certain respects. And the case has been made that Antiochus exerted an influence on, or prefigured, developments in Middle Platonism (see Bonazzi 2012).

Epistemology and ethics belong respectively to Logic and Ethics which, together with Physics, were the three parts of philosophy recognized in the Hellenistic era (cf. Ac. 1, 19). We are better informed about Antiochus’ epistemology and ethical theory than his Physics, which accurately reflects his own priorities, though, as we have seen, he wrote a book about the gods, a subject that belonged to Physics. For firm evidence about Antiochean Physics we we are largely reliant on the brief exposition of the views of the Old Academics and Peripatetics by the Antiochean spokesman, Varro, in Acad. 1 (24–29), who also mentions a few “corrections” by Zeno, which Antiochus may have adopted (1. 39). Here as elsewhere it is hard to tell whether and to what extent the resemblance between Antiochus’ view, according to which material reality is constituted by two things and their interaction, one active, one passive, and Stoic views reflects the influence of the latter on Antiochus or is evidence of an Old Academic influence on Stoicism (see Inwood 2012).

3. Epistemology

Academic skepticism arose out of the debate, initiated by Arcesilaus, about the nature and possibility of knowledge between the Academy, and rival schools of philosophy, chiefly the Stoics. The Academy’s method of argument was, in the first instance at least, dialectical. Their model was Socrates as depicted in Plato’s Socratic dialogues, where he puts questions to his interlocutors and deduces conclusions unwelcome to them from their replies. Following Socrates’ example, the Academics took their premises from the doctrines of their Stoic opponents or from assumptions that the Stoics could reject only at a high cost in plausibility. By arguing in this way, the Academics hoped to enhance their and their opponents’ understanding of the issues and, if possible, to progress towards the discovery of the truth that would resolve the question in contention. The difficulties that the Academics uncovered in this way were, then, in large part internal to their interlocutors’ position, and, in drawing them out, the Academics did not necessarily commit themselves to a position of their own.

Stoic epistemology attempts to show how it is possible for human beings to attain wisdom, which the Stoics take to be a condition entirely free of opinion, i.e., false or insecure judgment (see the section on Logic in the entry on Stoicism). For this to be possible, they maintain, there must be a criterion of truth (see Striker 1990). In their theory, it is what they called a cognitive impression that plays this part. This they define as an impression from what is, stamped and impressed in exact accordance with what is, and such as could not be from what is not (cf. Annas 1990, Frede 1999, Sedley 2002). Cognitive impressions, then, are true impressions which are, in addition, distinguished by a special character belongs only to true impressions (though not to all of them) and which enables human beings to discriminate cognitive from non-cognitive impressions. In the paradigm case, which the definition has in view, cognitive impressions are perceptual, but in a broader sense of the term, non-perceptual impressions that afford an equally secure grasp of their contents can also be called cognitive. According to the Stoics, by confining assent to cognitive impressions, it is possible to avoid error entirely.

The existence of the special character alleged to distinguish cognitive impressions from other impressions was the principal target of the Academics’ arguments (see Section 3 of the entry on Carneades). If such impressions do not exist, it follows immediately in the context of Stoic epistemology that nothing can be known. On the basis of this result and the Stoic doctrine that the wise, i.e., human beings as they ought to be, do not hold (mere) opinions (S.E. M 7.155–7), the Academics went on to argue that one ought to suspend judgement about all matters.

These two doctrines—that nothing can be known, or a claim that implied it in the Stoic context, and that one ought to suspend judgment—make up the skeptical Academic position, in the sense of the position put forward and defended by Academics if not necessarily endorsed by them. The Stoics, followed by Antiochus in his dogmatic phase, argued that this position is self-refuting since to adopt a position is to assent to its component doctrines and assent is impossible without taking oneself to know. The Stoics also argued, again followed by Antiochus, that the skepticism called for by the Academics’ arguments was a practical impossibility since action is impossible without assent.

Even though, as previously noted, the Academics were not necessarily committed to the skeptical position, they defended the possibility of a life of committed skepticism in order to prevent the Stoics from escaping the difficulties raised for their position indirectly by means of these anti-skeptical arguments. Arcesilaus made a start, but it was Carneades, his successor in the 2nd century B.C.E., who did the most, and who was responsible for the version of the defense with which Antiochus was familiar.

Carneades argued that, in the absence of cognitive impressions, a basis for action and inquiry could be found in so-called probable impressions (from probabilis, meaning that which lends itself to or invites approval, Cicero’s Latin for the Greek pithanos, meaning persuasive) (see Section 3 of the entry on Carneades).

Building on this account of probable impressions, Carneades defended two views about assent. According to one proposal, the wise person will always withhold assent, but will be able to act and inquire by following or using probable impressions in a way that does not amount to assent, and so does not involve holding opinions about anything (Acad. 2.59, 99, 108). According to the second, the wise person will assent to what is probable and so form opinions, but provisionally and on the understanding that he may be wrong (Acad. 2.59, 67, 78, 112).

It is a matter of controversy whether Carneades went beyond putting these views forward for the sake of argument and actually subscribed to one of them. It appears, however, that some of his successors endorsed one or both of the skeptical doctrines. One tendency, led by Clitomachus, Carneades’ student and eventual successor as scholarch, favored what we may call a radical skeptical position embracing both doctrines. Though Clitomachus rejected assent, he accepted Carneades’ proposal that we could follow or use impressions without assenting to them and adopted this attitude toward, among other impressions, the skeptical doctrines that nothing can be known and that one ought therefore suspend judgment (Acad. 2.109–10). The other tendency endorsed a moderate or mitigated form of skepticism. Though it accepted the first skeptical doctrine, namely that nothing can be known, this tendency permitted the wise to form opinions by assenting to non-cognitive impressions so long as they are sufficiently probable and the assent given to them is bestowed in the provisional spirit of Carneades’ second proposal. And this tendency took the opinion that nothing can be known to be among the impressions to which one should assent in this way. The appearance of paradox dissolves when one realizes that in accepting that one does not know anything one is not taking oneself to know this, but only opining that it is highly probable. The most prominent proponent of this view was Antiochus’ teacher, Philo, and it is this mitigated form of Academic skepticism that Antiochus defended before his conversion to dogmatism.

We are informed about Antiochus’ case against Academic skepticism by Cicero’s Academica, substantial parts of which have survived intact. Antiochus seems to have followed the Stoics, who produced a substantial literature defending their position and attacking the Academy’s probabilistic alternative, but also to have added some elements of his own to the argument (cf. Striker 1997). He defended the veracity of the senses. He seems to have argued that in order even to possess a concept of the truth we must indisputably apprehend some truths in a way that is possible only if there are cognitive impressions (Acad. 2.33). He argued that probable impressions are a wholly inadequate substitute for cognitive impressions (Acad. 2.35–6), so that the charge that by abolishing the cognitive impression (as they think) the Academics deprive human beings of a basis for action stands (Acad. 2.31, 33, 54, 62, 102–3, 110). And he argued that, in maintaining the skeptical position, the Academics must take themselves to know at least one thing, viz., that nothing can be known (Acad. 2.28–9, 109; cf. Burnyeat 1997).

There is one more twist in the story, however. After removing to Rome, Philo published a pair of books – the so-called Roman Books – which, when they came to Antiochus’ attention in Alexandria, seemed to him to represent a radical and intellectually untenable departure from his teacher’s previous position. This was the occasion for the Sosus, which contained a stinging riposte to Philo’s new ideas. In opposition to Antiochus’ view that there were two Academies, an Old and a New, Philo maintained that there had only ever been one. But he now held that the Academics from Plato to Philo himself were not united by their skepticism, as we have seen some Academics believed. Rather they had never been skeptics because they had never meant to challenge the possibility of knowledge. Philo did not deny that Arcesilaus and Carneades had argued against the existence of cognitive impressions. Rather, he now maintained that these arguments showed, and were always intended to show, not that cognition or apprehension is impossible, but that it is impossible on the Stoic conception of apprehension, which is therefore mistaken (Acad. 2.18; S.E. PH 1.235).

Philo’s Roman innovation, then, was to reject the Stoic account of knowledge while continuing to accept his predecessors’ arguments that the requirement that cognitive impressions be set apart from other impressions by a special character cannot be satisfied (cf. Barnes 1989, 70–76). For there to be knowledge, he now held, it was enough that there be impressions which are true and accurately formed (Cicero Acad. 2.18). It is not hard to see why Antiochus was disturbed, for, if this is right, Philo was the legitimate heir of a single unbroken Academic tradition stretching back to Plato in which there was no place for alien Stoic doctrines. Cicero, who is our principal source, chose not to recount the details of this controversy (Acad. 2.12). But we know that Antiochus argued that, by abandoning the full Stoic account of cognition and its commitment to cognitive impressions satisfying the complete Stoic definition, Philo succeeded only in bringing about the result he most wanted to avoid, namely that knowledge is impossible (Acad. 2.18). Presumably Antiochus drew on the case he had already brought against Academic probabilism to argue that impressions which fail to satisfy the full Stoic definition of the cognitive impression cannot provide a basis for judgment of any kind let alone judgments of the kind that deserve to be called knowledge.

4. Ethics

Antiochus maintained that his ethical theory was that of the Peripatetics and original Old Academics just as he had maintained that his Stoicizing epistemology was in substance that of the Old Academy (Cicero, Fin. 5.7, 14; Acad. 1.22). He could make this claim about his ethical theory with more justice. On the crucial question of whether to recognize external and bodily items as goods in addition to virtue, he agreed with Aristotle and the Peripatos and disagreed with the Stoics, who made virtue the sole good. Nonetheless, his theory is greatly indebted to the Stoa, and it draws on anti-Stoic arguments of his predecessors in the Academy that also tend to presuppose Stoic ideas. Roughly speaking, Antiochus defended the Peripatetic view about goods on the basis of considerations and in the context of assumptions that belong to a Stoic and not an Aristotelian framework (cf. White 1978).

Cicero expounds and criticizes Antiochus’ theory in book 5 of the De finibus and draws on Antiochus in his critique of Stoic ethics in book 4 (trans. in Annas and Woolf 2001). The Stoics maintained that only virtue, which is identical with wisdom or the perfection of reason, is good and only vice, its opposite, evil, whereas all the so-called goods, like health and strength, and their opposites, the so-called evils, were indifferent (see the section Ethics in the entry on Stoicism). Nonetheless the Stoics took some indifferents, often those generally regarded as goods by others, to be preferred and some, often those generally regarded as evils, to be dispreferred. This distinction furnished the material or subject matter for rational selection. Virtue consists in fully rational selection among them. The wise or virtuous person acts with a view to obtaining preferred items and avoiding their opposites, but it is as an expression of his perfected reason that acts of selection are good, not because they secure, or tend to secure, preferred items for him or protect, or tend to protect, him from their dispreferred opposites. According to the Stoics, the sole necessary and sufficient condition for human good and therefore happiness is the possession of virtue. Indifferent items cannot add to or detract from the goodness of such a life by their presence or absence.

To judge by Cicero’s evidence from book 4 of the of the De finibus, Antiochus appears to have argued against this position by confronting the Stoics with a dilemma. Either the so-called preferred indifferents really were absolutely and utterly indifferent. In that case, the Stoic position collapsed into that of philosophers like the heterodox Stoic, Ariston of Chios, who refused to make distinctions of any kind among the indifferents, thus rendering virtue incapable of supplying practical guidance by destroying the basis for rational selection among actions (Cicero, Fin. 4.47, 60, 69). Or speaking of preferred indifferents was a merely verbal innovation, and the Stoics really regarded the items they called preferred as goods, albeit lesser goods, capable of making a life better by their presence and worse by their absence. Antiochus favored the latter diagnosis (Cicero, Fin. 5.74), and his own position was that virtue is the chief good, but not the sole good; this is the Peripatetic view, which he may well have been right to attribute to the original Old Academy as well (Cicero, Fin. 4.60, 61; 5.14; Acad. 1.22).

The way in which Antiochus appeals to human nature and its development in the exposition and defense of his ethics is modeled closely on Stoic theory, however. To be sure, Aristotle assigns an important role to the development of character through habituation. But Antiochus follows the Stoics and Epicureans in using what modern scholarship has been called the “cradle argument” (Fin. 5.55). The idea is that by attending to the behavior of infants, who have not yet been corrupted by contact with society, we will be able to isolate our original natural impulses and discover what the first objects of natural concern or attachment are. If one accepts a general principle according to which the object or objects with which we are naturally concerned or to which we are attached by nature provide the basis for determining the human good, the cradle argument can be used to answer the question what is the true goal of human life.

The Epicureans maintained that infants are naturally impelled to pleasure, and that the goal for adult humans is a life of pleasure. The Stoics argued that our first natural impulses were not toward pleasure (and away from pain) but towards the “natural advantages,” things like health and strength, bodily integrity and well-functioning senses (and away from their opposites). But it was not because they thought these items were goods; they insisted that they are indifferent, though preferred. The infant’s natural concern for them is the first stage of a development in which what is truly good only appears later. According to the Stoics, if all goes well, a human being’s motives undergo a radical transformation from the infant’s. Only at a later point does the human being recognize virtue and virtuous activity as the only human goods and act for the sake of the true good. Preferred indifferents are the material or subject matter for the rational selection in which virtue consists, but nothing more. Since the objects of our first natural impulses turn out not to be good but indifferent, to be the object of a natural impulse, or to be in accord with our nature in the way such objects are, is not thereby to be good.

Antiochus agrees with the Stoics about the importance of the first natural impulses and, by and large, about which items are the objects of those impulses. But unlike them, he accepts the principle that what agrees or accords with a creature’s fully developed adult nature, as it is expressed in its natural impulses, is good for that creature, and that the good life for human beings is therefore the life characterized by the fullest possible enjoyment of the goods corresponding to our natural impulses (Cicero, Acad. 1.19, 22; Fin. 5.24–5). He believes that he has an Old Academic authority for this in Polemon (Cicero, Fin. 4.14; Acad. 2.131), head of the Academy at the end of the fourth century B.C.E. Nonetheless, despite admitting other goods, he holds that virtue is the highest human good, and he believes that his theory can explain why it is the chief human good without having to make it the only good as the Stoics had done.

On his view, the development which leads a human being to virtue does not involve a radical transformation of the kind posited by the Stoics. Rather, if all goes well, a human being comes to value reason, and hence virtue as the perfection of reason, above all other things because reason is the most important part of human nature. It is not so much the character of a human being’s motivation that is transformed as he develops, according to Antiochus, but rather the self which is the object of his natural concern. As a result, though virtue is the chief human good, there is room for other goods as well, because they are in accord with human nature too, albeit less important parts of it. Antiochus’ use of the Stoic framework puts him in a position to fault the Stoics for abandoning or forgetting the nature from which they set out (Cicero, Fin. 4.26, 43; 5.72) and for failing to see the difference between taking reason to be the most important part of human nature—which is correct—and thinking that it is the only part (4.41).

Like the Stoics, however, Antiochus wants to claim that virtue is sufficient for happiness. Stoic ethics ensures this result by denying that there are any goods or evils apart from virtue and vice and therefore any items capable of affecting the goodness of a life except virtue and vice. This option was not open to Antiochus because he thinks that there are other goods and evils, which do have this power. His solution, which is the most distinctive feature of his ethical system and the one that seems to have drawn the most criticism, is to distinguish between the happy life (vita beata in Cicero’s Latin), for which virtue is sufficient, and the completely or entirely happy life (vita beatissima) (Fin. 5.71, 95; T.D. 5.22), which requires bodily and external goods as well (see Irwin 1992).

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