Notes to Propositions

1. Throughout this entry, ‘object of belief’ simply refers to what is believed, rather than to the entity or entities the belief is intuitively about. So, for instance, when I believe that Ford pardoned Nixon my belief is about Ford and Nixon but not about the proposition that Ford pardoned Nixon. This proposition, rather, is what I believe. This usage for ‘object of belief’ does not fit well with that of the Husserlian tradition, but it is, arguably, the standard contemporary usage, and it is adopted here.

2. For an illuminating account of these matters, see Kretzmann (1970).

3. Here we should note that that-clauses may occur in a variety of linguistic contexts, not limited to attitude- and truth-ascriptions. They may be grammatical subjects (e.g., ‘That Knowles lost the election is surprising’), complements to verbs (e.g., as in ‘The barometer indicated that it is going to rain’), complements to adjectives (‘I am happy that it is going to rain’), and complements to nouns (‘The possibility that it will rain should be borne in mind’). Whether that-clauses have the same semantic function in all these contexts is a matter of ongoing debate among propositionalists. (See Parsons (1993), Moffett (2003) for discussion.)

4. That is to say, they are neither nouns themselves nor phrases headed by a noun. The word ‘that’ in ‘that snow is white’ is not a noun which is modified by the words following, but rather a complementizer, like ‘whether’.

5. Standardly, defenders of the Relational Analysis take that-clauses to be syntactic units and take the attitude verbs to designate two place relations. However, strictly speaking, the analysis leaves open the possibility that that-clauses designate propositions by virtue of the combined workings of the complementizer ‘that’ and the sentence immediately following it. A case in point is the propositionalist version of Donald Davidson’s )(1968) paratactic theory of indirect speech reports. On Davidson’s theory, ‘Galileo said that the earth moves’ amounts to ‘Galileo said that. The earth moves’. Here ‘the earth moves’ functions as a separate displayed and nonassertoric utterance, and so does not combine with ‘that’ to form a syntactic unit. On the propositionalist version of this theory, ‘that’ refers not to the displayed utterance, but to the proposition designated by that utterance (Rumfitt (1993, p. 449). On such a view, through the combined workings of the ‘that’ and ‘the earth moves’, a proposition is designated.

In an attempt to defend the theory of direct reference, Shier (1996) argues that that-clauses do not provide relata for the belief relation but nonetheless designate propositions. For Shier, ‘\(S\) believes that snow is white’ is true iff \(S\) believes a proposition that is a finer grained version of the proposition referred to by ‘that snow is white’. The proposition that snow is white isn’t itself what is said to be believed. Shier’s modification of the Relational View can be considered as more or less friendly amendment. Propositions are still relata of the belief relation. It’s only that the that-clause doesn’t supply the relatum itself. Kent Bach (1997) holds that a belief report is true iff the subject believes a certain thing that requires the truth of the proposition contributed by the that-clause. Bach’s modifications are perhaps less friendly, if only because he is unwilling to call these “certain things” believed propositions. For more on these issues, see the entry on propositional attitude reports. Certain sorts of substitution failures provide a second important reason to modify or reject the Relational View. This issue is discussed at length in Section 3.3.

6. We emphasize these roles as they are the traditional roles assigned to propositions, and we believe they provide us with the best arguments for propositions while making the fewest theoretical assumptions. If propositions exist, then they play these roles directly. There may be additional roles that propositions are fit to play, and if so, this would provide further support for their existence. However, these additional roles depend on theoretical commitments not widely shared and additional assumptions about the relation between propositions and other ontological categories. Furthermore, these roles might not be performed by all propositions.

For instance, states of affairs are sometimes taken to be the bearers of intrinsic value. On such a view, a property such as knowledge does not possess intrinsic value, but rather the state of affairs in which someone has knowledge (Chisholm 1972). If states of affairs are propositions, then propositions are the bearers of value. Even so, there are reasons for doubting that all states of affairs play this role. Lemos (1994) and Zimmerman (2001) take only obtaining states of affairs, or facts, to be eligible for intrinsic value. Thus, for propositions to play the value-bearing role, we need the additional assumptions that states of affairs are propositions, and that obtaining states of affairs (or facts) are true propositions. True propositions would be eligible to play the role of bearers of intrinsic value, but false propositions would be ineligible. The identification of states of affairs with propositions is controversial, however. We discuss the relation between propositions, facts, and states of affairs further in section 9. See also the entry on states of affairs for further discussion.

Propositions may also be put to work in grounding or explanation. Many philosophical disputes center around claims of fundamentality: mental states obtain in virtue of physical states; the table’s existence is grounded in the arrangement of atoms; sets depend on their members; moral facts are due to natural facts; and so on. Advocates of grounding in explanation maintain that these claims should be understood as making claims about what is grounded in what. This raises the question of how to understand grounding claims. Correia and Schnieder (2012) note that there are two main views on this: the predicational view and the operational view. According to predicationalists, grounding is a relation between facts, and should take the form ‘the fact that \(p\) is grounded in the fact that \(q'\). Operationalists take the grounding claims to involve an operator (e.g. ‘because’) flanked by sentences, taking the form ‘\(p\) because \(q\)’. The operationalist thus avoids commitment to facts in their grounding claims.

Suppose the predicational view is correct and facts are the relata of the grounding relation. If facts turn out to be true propositions, then propositions play this role as well (Rosen 2010). But as in our discussion of value-bearers, this would only be a role for true propositions. Fine (2012) articulates a notion of non-factive grounding, but notes that it faces difficulties and that a factive notion of ground is likely the fundamental notion. Furthermore, if grounding is a relation between worldly entities and propositions are representational entities, then propositions may be ill-suited for the grounding role. For more on these issues, see the entry on metaphysical grounding.

7. For discussion of the Metaphysics 101 argument, or arguments like it, see Cartwright (1962), Soames (1999, ch. 1), and Salmon and Soames (1988, introduction). Soames stresses the role of propositions as truth-bearers, and Salmon and Soames the role of contents of sentences.

8. Which syntactic properties of complements trigger an object reading seems to vary with the verb. Some verbs that exhibit the Objectivization Effect retain the content reading with select nominalizations:

I maintain/know/remember/recognize/hold(?) the truth of what he said.

Others, however, are much stingier, e.g., ‘find’, ‘gather’, ‘bet’, ‘judge’.

9. Schiffer’s theory is closely related to Mark Balaguer’s (1998) “Full-Blooded Platonism”. See also Restall 2001.

10. One argument against propositions, made in Schiffer’s earlier work (Schiffer 1987), is that they must be structured complexes and yet there seem to be no appropriate entities to serve as their components.

11. The notion of free generation should be familiar to students of logic. The set of well-formed formulas of propositional logic are freely generated from the set of atoms (i.e., atomic sentences) by the basic logic operations. What this means, more carefully, is that, (i), the set of wffs is generated from the atomics by these operations (i.e., the set of wffs is the smallest set which contains all of the sets of wffs which contain the atoms and are closed on the operations), (ii), each of the operations is one-to-one on the set, and (iii), their ranges are pairwise disjoint on the set.

12. Terence Parsons (1993, 453–7) warns about drawing inferences about facts from considerations about the context ‘__ is a fact’. That context is not a factive context, because it is not the case that it, as well as its internal negation, presuppose the truth of the corresponding sentence. “That p is not a fact” differs in this way from the factive “That p is not surprising.” Facts are designated by that-clauses in factive contexts, but not by that-clauses in the context ‘__ is a fact.’

13. Some expressivists (Horwich 1993, Stoljar 1993, have argued that, even if the commitment to moral propositions is shallow, it can help them address the well-known embedding problem. See moral cognitivism vs non-cognitivism for more discussion.

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