States of Affairs

First published Tue Mar 27, 2012; substantive revision Thu Oct 6, 2016

Philosophers connect sentences with various different items, such as thoughts, facts and states of affairs. Thoughts are either true or false in an absolute sense, never both or neither. A sentence such as “Socrates is wise” is true (false) in virtue of expressing the true (false) thought that Socrates is wise. Thoughts are also the contents of propositional attitudes like belief and desire. For example, John’s belief that Vulcan is a planet is a relation between him and the thought that Vulcan is a planet. Since there is no such planet, the thought that Vulcan is a planet cannot be composed of Vulcan and the property of being a planet. It is composed, among other things, of a way of thinking that purports to latch on to a planet. This so-called mode of presentation may be expressed by a definite description like “the planet between the Sun and Mercury”.

Some philosophers take it to be obvious that if something is true, there must be something that makes it true, a truth-maker. Facts are truth-makers. Like sentences and thoughts, facts are taken to be complex objects. The constituents of (atomic) facts are not words or modes of presentation, but particulars and properties (see, for instance, Armstrong 1986: 85). The fact that Socrates is wise exists if, and only if Socrates is wise.

The sentence “Socrates is wise” is not only said to express the thought that Socrates is wise that is made true by the fact that Socrates is wise, but also to describe the state of affairs Socrates’ being wise.

Before pressing on a note about terminology: many philosophers follow Armstrong’s (1993: 429) terminology who uses “states of affairs” to refer to facts. (Armstrong’s book A World of States of Affairs is solely concerned with facts.) This article is not devoted to “Armstrongian” states of affairs, but to states of affairs in the sense that is prominent in the work of such philosophers as Reinach, Russell (at one time), the early Wittgenstein and Plantinga.[1] Plantinga helps us to get a grip on the intended notion:

There are such things as states of affairs; among them we find some that obtain, or are actual, and some that do not obtain. So, for example, Kareem Abdul-Jabbar’s being more than seven feet tall is a state of affairs, as is Spiro Agnew’s being President of Yale University. Although each of these is a state of affairs, the former but not the latter obtains, or is actual. And although the latter is not actual, it is a possible state of affairs; in this regard it differs from David’s having travelled faster than the speed of light and Paul’s having squared the circle. (Plantinga 1974: 44)

If there is the state of affairs Spiro Agnew’s being President of Yale University, it is not a fact (an Armstrongian “state of affairs”). For Spiro Agnew was never President of Yale University. Hereafter, “states of affairs” is used only for states of affairs that exist whether they obtain or not.

States of affairs are similar to thoughts. Thoughts are true or false; states of affairs obtain or not. There are also similarities between facts and states of affairs. Both facts and states of affairs are supposed to be complexes that contain (in a sense to be explained further) objects and properties.

Situation theory takes sentences to describe situations (see Barwise & Perry 1983). How are situations related to states of affairs? Barwise describes situations informally as “portions of the world” (Barwise 1989: 225). A portion of a world, say the Lower East Side of Manhattan, does not obtain or not (see ibid.). It is not a state of affairs, but a spatial part of a larger spatial whole.

Does one need states of affairs in addition to facts and thoughts? In order to answer this question we need to know what states of affairs are and how they contrast and compare with thoughts and facts. We therefore begin by outlining the theoretical role states of affairs are supposed to play.

1. Introducing States of Affairs

1.1 Talking about State of Affairs

Can one base our understanding of what states of affairs are on features of how we talk about them?

Pollock holds that we normally refer to states of affairs by gerund clauses such as Kareem Abdul-Jabbar’s being more than seven feet tall or Spiro Agnew’s being President of Yale University (see Pollock 1984b: 121). However, while the referents of such gerund clauses seem not to be propositions—“Kareem Abdul-Jabbar’s being more than seven feet tall is true’ does not sound right—these clauses are referentially flexible. For the gerund clauses in the following sentences seem to refer to facts or events, the relata of causal relations and objects of knowledge (the first two examples are from Pollock 1984b: 122):

  • Charlie’s eloping with Ginger was surprising.
  • Mary’s divorcing Charlie caused Charlie’s demise.
  • Kareem Abdul-Jabbar’s being more than seven feet tall is well-known.

Now facts may be nothing but states of affairs that obtain and events states of affairs that obtain at some times and not at others. If this were right, the gerund clauses above would refer to states of affairs. But we need to get an independent grip on the notion of states of affairs before settling the question whether facts and events are a kind of state of affairs. For this purpose we can neither pick out states of affairs as the things that obtain or nor say that they are the referents of gerund clauses of the kind considered above.

Are there predicates that we apply to state of affairs and that are distinctive of them? States of affairs are said to obtain or not, while Fregean thoughts are true are false. In contrast, facts exist; a fact cannot be qualified as obtaining or not obtaining (see Betti 2015: 35). However, it seems difficult to get a grip on the difference between obtaining and non-obtaining on the one hand, and truth and falsity on the other. Prima facie, the state of affairs Socrates’s being wise obtains if, and only if, it is true that Socrates is wise (see Plantinga 1974: 45–6; see also Betti 2015: 35). Pollock (1984a: 53) correctly observes that “obtaining and not-obtaining are truth-like properties”. But why are they just truth-like and not just truth and falsity under a different label; why can the obtaining of a state of affairs not be identified with the truth of a thought or proposition?

Betti proposes that the distinction between obtaining and non-obtaining states of affairs is an ontological one:

nonobtaining states of affairs have no mode of being (so they neither subsist nor exist) but they are still objects in their own right—that is, they are part of the catalogue of the world in their own right. (2015: 35–6)

If this were right, states of affairs would be more even puzzling than Meinongian objects that at least subsist. However, false propositions seem equally to have only a “shadowy” existence:

Time was when I thought there were propositions, but it does not seem to me very plausible to say that in addition to facts there are also these curious shadowy things going about such as “That today is Wednesday” when in fact it is Tuesday. (Russell 1918: 223)

In conclusion: the difference between “is true (false)” and “obtains (does not obtain)”, does not help us to distinguish states of affairs from other things. Is there a theoretical role that states of affairs can, but thoughts (propositions) and facts can’t fill?

1.2 A Theoretical Role for States of Affairs

In order to answer this question, consider a school exercise in probability (see Kripke 1980: 16). Take two ordinary dice, \(D_{1}\) and \(D_{2}\), with six sides each. For each die, there are six possible outcomes of a throw. \(D_{1}\) and \(D_{2}\) are thrown and, on landing, display two numbers. Hence, there are thirty-six possible outcomes of throwing the dice. Let us now calculate the probability that the outcome of throwing the two dice is 11. There are only two outcomes of throwing the two dice in which they show together 11: either (i) \(D_{1}\) shows 5 and \(D_{2}\) 6 or (ii) \(D_{1}\) shows 6 and \(D_{2}\) 5. The probability of the outcome of \(D_{1}\)’s and \(D_{2}\)’s jointly showing 11 is the ratio between all possible outcomes of \(D_{1}\)’s and \(D_{2}\)’s jointly showing 11 and the totality of possible outcomes of throwing the two dice: 2/36 = 1/18.

In the calculations we assumed (1):

  • (1) There are bearers of probabilities: things that are probable or improbable to a certain degree.

We also assumed that there is a space of possible states of the dice; ways the two dice might fall. A way the dice might fall exists even if it is not true that the dice have fallen that way:

  • (2) The possible states (outcomes) of \(D_{1}\)’s and \(D_{2}\)’s showing jointly certain numbers exist whether it is true that they show this number or false that they do.

The possible states are possible states of objects. \(D_{1}\)’s and \(D_{2}\)’s Showing 5 is a possible state of the dice, however we describe them or ascribe the property. This suggests (3):

  • (3) Possible states are different if they are states of different objects or constituted by different ways an object can be.

The possible states involved in our exercise have the properties philosophers take states of affairs to have. States of affairs are probable to a degree or possible, as stressed by Reinach (1911: 339–40; Künne 1987: 185ff and Forbes 1989: 131 follow Reinach). They are supposed to exist without obtaining (2) and to have objects and properties as constituents (3).

(2) distinguishes states of affairs from facts. The fact that Socrates is wise exists, if, and only if, Socrates is wise. If Socrates is not wise, there is no fact of him being wise. Hence, the fact that Socrates is wise cannot be a mere possibility for Socrates; it can, so to speak, only be an actuality. In contrast, the state of affairs that Socrates is foolish exists, even if Socrates is not foolish (see Reinach 1911; Wittgenstein 1918: 2.04, 2.05; Plantinga 1974: 44; Pollock 1984a: 52).

(3) distinguishes states of affairs from thoughts:

[States of affairs] are “about” objects but not in terms of some mode of representation. States of affairs, in some sense, contain objects as direct constituents. (Pollock 1984a: 53)

The state of affairs Marilyn Monroe’s being an actress and the state of affairs Norma Jean Baker’s being an actress, contain, in some sense, the same objects and properties as constituents in the same order. They are the same state of affairs under different names. However, I can believe that Marilyn Monroe is an actress while doubting that Norma Jean Baker is an actress. Hence, if there are states of affairs, they are not the content of propositional attitudes like belief; thoughts are. This point leaves open the possibility that a state of affairs is a set of thoughts that are equivalent in some respect (see section 2.2).

The model of a space of possible outcomes of a throw of a die gives us an initial idea of what the distinctive properties of state of affairs are and why it is plausible to assume that there are any states of affairs. It leaves questions about the precise nature of states of affairs open. For example, Wittgenstein (1918: 4.26) argued that only elementary sentences “picture” states of affairs. An elementary sentence in Wittgenstein’s sense is a concatenation of simple proper names each of which refers to a simple object. The names in the elementary proposition are arranged in a way that can be mapped onto an arrangement of the simple objects named. This arrangement of objects is the state of affairs pictured by the elementary sentence. Nothing said so far rules out that states of affairs that involve some objects and properties (relations) combine to form further complex states of affairs that have states of affairs as constituents. (Pollock 1984a: 55–6) defines negation, conjunction etc. for states of affairs. For example, if there is a state of affairs \(S_1\) and a state of affairs \(S_2\), their conjunction is the state of affairs that obtains if, and only if, both \(S_1\) and \(S_2\) obtain. If one wants to restrict the space of possible states to combinations of simple objects, one needs to marshal arguments that show that this and similar conceptions of complex states of affairs is flawed. (This entry is mainly concerned with simple states of affairs.)

Similarly, the model of states of affairs as possible outcomes does not rule out that there are impossible state of affairs. If there is a space of possible states of the dice, there seems to be a space of impossible states of them as well. For example, it is impossible for the dice to show 17 or no number at all (see Rumfitt 2015: 187f for a brief discussion of impossible states of affairs).

2. Thoughts and States of Affairs

2.1 Individuation and Existence Conditions

Thoughts can be the contents of propositional attitudes. When one says “There are three things that everyone who works on elementary physics believes”, one quantifies over things that everyone working in elementary physics believes; thoughts (see Chisholm 1970: 19). Thoughts are also truth-value bearers (“There are three truths that everyone who works in elementary physics believes”). How are thoughts related to states of affairs? For instance, how is the thought that Socrates is wise related to the state of affairs Socrates’ being wise?

Prima facie, thoughts are one thing, states of affairs another. Thoughts and states of affairs differ in their individuation and existence conditions.

Individuation-conditions: Thoughts are supposed to be the contents of propositional attitudes like belief and desire. Let “j” be shorthand for a propositional attitude verb (“desire”, “believe” etc). If one can j that p without eo ipso j-ing that q (and vice versa), the contents that p and that q are different. Now I can believe, for instance, that Hesperus shines without believing that Phosphorus shines. Hence, if thoughts are the contents of propositional attitudes, the thought that Hesperus shines is different from the thought that Phosphorus shines. If the thought that Hesperus shines is different from the thought that Phosphorus shines, thoughts cannot be logical complexes whose constituents are particulars and properties. Following Frege, many philosophers therefore take thoughts to be complexes that are built up out of modes of presentations. Here “thoughts” only refers to such complexes. Since there are different modes of presentations of the same particular (property), there can be different thoughts that concern or are about the same particulars and properties. In contrast, Hesperus’s shining and Phosphorus’s shining are the same state of affairs, namely the complex that contains only the planet Venus and the property of shining. We will see in section 2.4 that not all philosophers follow Frege’s lead. If one has arguments for a coarse-grained individuation of the objects of belief, states of affairs may serve as contents of propositional attitudes.

Existence-conditions: A thought is a complex whose constituents are modes of presentation that purport to represent objects. Standard accounts of modes of presentation allow for the existence of modes of presentations that are empty. Hence, the existence of a thought does not depend on the existence of the objects it purports to represent. For example, the thought that Pegasus is a horse exists, although there is no such horse (for defense and elaboration see Sainsbury 2005: 86–9). This is different for states of affairs. If a state of affairs is a complex that contains objects and properties as constituents, it cannot exist if its constituents don’t exist. So while it is true that Pegasus does not exist, there is no such state of affairs. This is unproblematic for we have not been given any reason to think that such a state of affairs obtains or does not obtain. For the same reason states of affairs that contain contingently existing objects are themselves contingent existents.

Philosophers often use the notion of a singular proposition. A singular proposition is supposed to be (i) “directly about” an object and (ii) evaluable as true or false. Direct aboutness requires that what the proposition is directly about exists if the proposition exists. If one combines (i) and (ii) with the plausible assumption that the proposition that Superman does not exist is singular and true, one arrives at the conclusion that Superman exists. Similar problems arise for negative modal existential singular propositions such as the proposition that Socrates might not have existed. Williamson 2002 argues on the basis of these problems that everything exists necessarily. Williamson’s modus ponens is Plantinga’s (1983) and Merricks’s 2015 (chapt. 5) modus tollens: singular propositions can exist although the object they are directly about doesn’t.

If one sides with Plantinga and Merricks, one can drive a wedge between truth and obtaining. We are not compelled to hold that there is a state of affairs Superman’s non-existing because we have no reason to say that such a state of affairs obtains or even possibly obtains, while we have a reason to say that it is true that Superman does not exist. Hence, the (singular) proposition that Superman does not exist can be true without the state of affairs Superman’s non-existing obtaining. Obtaining is indeed only truth-like.

Chisholm held that propositions are those states of affairs such that either the state of affairs or its negation always occurs (on Chisholm’s notion of state of affairs, see Kim 1979). But, as we have seen, the truth that Superman does not exist cannot be the state of affairs Superman’s non-existing occurring or obtaining.

2.2 States of Affairs as the Fundamental Bearers of Modal Properties

Reinach (1911: 339) claimed that “states of affairs, and only states of affairs, can adopt such modalities” as probability and possibility. He had in mind that an object such as a die cannot be possible or probable. This seems plausible enough. It is equally plausible that facts are not probable or possible. However, why can’t thoughts be probable or possible?

Forbes (1989: 130–131) refines Reinach’s idea in taking states of affairs as the fundamental bearers of modal properties like being possible, necessary etc. From Reinach we learn that particulars can’t be the bearers of modality. Fregean truth-values are also unsuited. According to Frege’s semantics for assertoric sentences, every true (false) sentence, whether necessary or contingently true, refers to the True (the False). Forbes appeals to our modal intuitions to argue for a better candidate for the modal value bearer role,

a category of entity not so finely discriminated as thoughts but more finely discriminated than truth-values, such that sentences with the same entity in the category as their references are guaranteed to have the same modal status. (1989: 130)

Let us consider a pair of sentences to illustrate Forbes’s argument for an entity less discriminating than thoughts and more discriminating than truth-values. Consider the sentence pairs:

  • (1) a. Hesperus shines.
  • b. Phosphorus shines.
  • (2) a. Hesperus is Hesperus.
  • b. Hesperus is Phosphorus.

(1a) to (2b) are all true. Hence, in Fregean terms, they all refer to the True. Each of these sentences expresses a thought different from all others. However, the members of each pair have the same modal status that differs from the modal status of the members of the other pair. (1a) and (1b) are contingently true; (2a) and (2b) necessarily true. If one lets sentences stand for or describe state of affairs whose constituents are the referents of the semantically relevant sentence parts, one can capture this similarity: (1a) and (1b) ((2a) and (2b)) have the same modal status because these sentences stand for the same state of affairs (Forbes 1989: 131). In general, sentences that stand for the same state of affairs have the same modal value. It is then a short step to take states of affairs to be the primary or fundamental bearers of modal status (1989: 131–2). A sentence is contingently (necessarily) true if, and only if, it stands for a state of affairs that contingently (necessarily) obtains.[2]

Can’t facts be the basic bearers of modal status? Take a further sentence pair:

  • (3) a. Hesperus has an orbital period of 226 days.
  • b. Phosphorus has an orbital period of 226 days.

(3a) and (3b) are false, they express different thoughts, yet have the same modal status: they might have been true. This similarity cannot be explained by taking them to refer to the same fact; we need states of affairs.

We can now answer our initial question: Yes, we need states of affairs as well as thoughts. States of affairs and thoughts have distinct individuation and existence conditions. Therefore, states of affairs can be the fundamental bearers of modal properties.

We can strengthen the conclusion by considering ways to dispute it. Consider all thoughts that represent the same particulars and predicate the same properties of them. Let us call these thoughts referentially equivalent. Vendler proposed that a fact is “an abstract entity which indiscriminately contains a set of referentially equivalent true propositions” (Vendler 1967: 711; my emphasis). If we drop the restriction to true propositions and simplify Vendler’s idea, we can propose that a state of affairs is a set of referentially equivalent thoughts, whether they are true or not. The state of affairs Hesperus’s shining is the set of all thoughts that are about Hesperus and predicate the property of shining to it.

However, such an approach to states of affairs makes them explanatorily uninteresting. If we want to explain why (1a) and (1b) ((2a)–(2b)/(3a)–(3b)) have the same modal profile, appealing to states of affairs in Vendler’s sense does not allow us to make progress. For instance, saying that (1a) and (1b) have the same modal profile because the belong to the set of thoughts that are about Hesperus and predicate the property of shining to it is at best a partial explanation. For it raises such questions as “What has belonging to this set to do with possibility?” and “In virtue of which property has a set of thoughts modal properties”? In contrast, the assumption that there are states of affairs (and not just a particular kind of set) and that they have properties like being possible or being probable can be independently motivated and is explanatory progress.

2.3 States of Affairs and Possible Worlds

In section 2.2 we used the modal properties of states of affairs to distinguish them from thoughts. Some philosophers have proposed to use the connection between states of affairs and modality constructively to explain what a possible world is.

Lewis (1973: 84) points out that we talk about ways things might have been. He goes on to label ways every thing might have been “possible worlds”. If it is possible that something is the case, there is a possible world in which it is the case. What are, then, possible worlds?

Van Inwagen distinguished between Abstractionist and Concretist conceptions of possible worlds (see van Inwagen 1986: 185–6; see also Stalnaker 1986: 121). According to a Concretist conception of possible worlds such as David Lewis’s, a possible world is the maximal mereological sum of individuals that are spatio-temporally related and each such sum is spatio-temporally isolated from all others (see Lewis 1986: 69–70). There are no impossible worlds. The actual world is the world in which we are located.

According to Abstractionists, possible worlds are abstract objects of some sort. The exercise in probability calculation from section 1.2 motivates an Abstractionist proposal in which states of affairs are the basic building blocks. States of affairs are possible outcomes. Kripke called possible outcomes “miniature possible worlds”. This suggests an idea of what a possible world is: it is a maximal state of affairs. Pollock (1984a: 57) defines possible world therefore as follows:

  • (PW) w is a possible world if, and only if, w is a nontransient possible state of affairs and for any nontransient state of affairs S if it is possible that w and S both obtain, w includes S. (see also Plantinga 1974: 44–6)

A state of affairs w includes a state of affairs S if, and only if, necessarily if w obtains, S obtains. The actual world is the possible maximal nontransient state of affairs that obtains.

A state of affairs is transient if, and only if, it obtains at one time and not another. For instance, the state of affairs Socrates’s not drinking hemlock obtains at some times, but not at others. Transient states of affairs are only possible, actual etc. relative to a time. Before 399 BC it was possible that Socrates does not drink hemlock, but this is no longer possible after 399 BC. A state of affairs is nontransient if, and only, if it is such that necessarily if it obtains at one time it obtains at all times. For example, the state of affairs Socrates’s being hungry on the 15th of April 400 BC at 16.15 is nontransient.

(PW) makes use of modal concepts to define possible world: it must be possible for S and w to both obtain etc. Hence, this particular Abstractionist conception of possible worlds does not allow one to explain modality away; it presupposes it. In contrast, the Concretist conception promises a definitional reduction of modal concepts. When we talk about possibility and necessity we quantify over mereological sums of things. The concept of modality is not required to distinguish between possible and impossible worlds: there are no impossible ones. Why is (PW), then, attractive?

First, Forbes (1987: 139ff) argues that the identification of possible worlds with constructions out of compossible states of affairs solves the problem of accidental intrinsics (Lewis 1986: 199–201). Let us consider an intrinsic property of a human being, say me, such as having two hands. I might have existed without having had two hands. On the concretist account this implies that there is a possible world in which I have a different number of hands. But how can one and the same individual have two as well as less/more hands “in different worlds”? If the worlds are mereological sums that have me as a common part, this seems not possible. Lewis concludes that the same object cannot be part of different possible worlds. An object can only be in different possible worlds by having counterparts in them.

According to counterpart theory, I might have had three hands only in the derived sense by having counter-parts that have three hands (see Kripke 1980: 45). This does not sit well with the intuition that I strictly and literally speaking might have had three hands. The identification of possible worlds with constructions out of compossible states of affairs is faithful to this intuition. I have different properties in different possible worlds, if the possible worlds contain different states of affairs that involve me. One possible world contains the state of affairs MT’s having three hands; the possible world that is actual contains the state of affairs MT’s having two hands. The different possible worlds under discussion don’t overlap, yet the possibilities involve me (see Forbes 1987: 141).

Second, the semantics of counterfactuals. The so-called “Stalnaker-Lewis semantics” for counterfactuals assumes that a counterfactual such as “If it were rainy today, I would take an umbrella” is true if, and only if, all of the closest possible worlds in which the antecedent is true are possible worlds in which the consequent is true. This semantics for counterfactuals allows the substitution of logically equivalent sentences in the antecedent of a counterfactual. For example, if the counterfactual “If it were rainy today, I would take an umbrella” is true, so is “If it were rainy and windy today or rainy and not windy today, I would take an umbrella” because “It is rainy today” and “If it is rainy and windy today or rainy and not windy today” are true in the same possible worlds. Fine (1975: 453f; 2012: 230f) argues that the substitution principle should be given up in the light of puzzling consequences. But certainly one can substitute some sentences in the antecedent of a counterfactual. Which ones? Fine suggests replacing Stalnaker-Lewis semantics for counterfactuals with a semantics in which possible states take pride of place. Instead of a plurality of possible worlds there is a space of possible states that involve particulars and ways they can be. Assertoric sentences refer to states of affairs and only those sentences that refer to the same state of affairs can be substituted in the antecedent of a counter-factual (Fine 1975: 454).

Fine assumes that “It is rainy”, “It is rainy and windy” and “It is rainy and not windy” etc. refer to different states of affairs (1975: 454). How can this assumption be justified? If we take the idea that states of affairs are complexes seriously, we can answer this question. Just like other complexes they can (at least in part) be individuated in terms of their constituents. The states of affairs \(S_1\) and \(S_2\) can therefore only be the same state of affairs if they have the same constituents. This conception allows for states of affairs that necessarily co-obtain, but differ. For example, necessarily, the state of affairs that triangle A is equilateral obtains if the state of affairs that triangle A is equiangular and vice versa. Similarly, the state of affairs P necessarily obtains if, and only if, the state of affairs \(P \mathbin{\&} (Q \lor \neg Q)\) obtains. Yet, these are different states of affairs: they have different constituents.

This conception of states of affairs as complexes makes them useful for semantics. If sentences refer to such states of affairs, logically equivalent sentences can refer to different states of affairs and therefore have different semantic properties. All tautologies are true in all possible worlds, yet they can refer to different states of affairs. A number of semantic theories assume that sentences refer to states of affairs. These theories provide principles that determine the reference of complex sentences on the basis of their parts (see Fine 2012: 234; see also Rumfitt 2015: 160–7).

However, if states of affairs are individuated in terms of their components and their mode of combination, there are for every possible world many different maximal nontransient states of affairs (for the following see Zalta 1993: 393–4). If the state of affairs P is a possible world, so is \(P \mathbin{\&} (Q\lor \neg Q)\) for an arbitrarily chosen possible state of affairs Q. P and \(P \mathbin{\&} (Q\lor \neg Q)\) are necessarily equivalent, but, according to our individuation method, different states of affairs. Hence, there are many different maximal states of affairs that correspond to the same possible world and, in particular, to the actual world.

Zalta (1993) tackles this problem on the basis of his axiomatic theory of abstract objects. According to him, abstract objects like numbers exemplify but also encode properties. For example, 1 encodes the properties that are essential to its identity; to its being the object it is. In contrast, 1 exemplifies, but does not encode, the property of being the number of inhabited planets of the solar system. In this system, situations are those abstract objects that encode state of affairs properties such as being such that John is to the left of Harry. If a situation is the case, the state of affairs properties it encodes obtain; the situation makes the encoded state of affairs property factual. A situation S is a possible world if, and only if, it is possible that S makes all and only the obtaining states of affairs properties factual. On the basis of the axioms of his system Zalta can show that there is a unique actual world.

If one is unwilling to make a distinction between encoding and exemplifying, but one wants to maintain the identification of possible worlds with maximal possible states of affairs, one either has to accept that necessarily equivalent states of affairs are the same or one must identify possible worlds with sets of necessarily equivalent possible states of affairs. We already rejected the first option as unfruitful for semantics. The second option seems to result in a set-theoretic modeling or replacement of possible worlds, not in a conception of possible worlds (see Zalta 1993: 394).

2.4 States of Affairs and Propositional Attitudes

Thoughts can’t fulfill the role of states of affairs as the fundamental bearers of modal properties. Can states of affairs be the contents of propositional attitudes? Prima facie, the answer is No. We have already seen that states of affairs are too coarse-grained to be the contents of propositional attitudes. I can believe that Hesperus is a planet, without believing that Phosphorus is a planet (and vice versa). Hence, the contents of the attitudes differ. But the state of affairs Hesperus’s being a planet is just the state of affairs Phosphorus’s being a planet. Propositional attitudes are, at best, mediated relations to states of affairs. For example, a belief represents a state of affairs if, and only if, the believer assents to a thought that describes a state of affairs.

Barcan Marcus has challenged this view. She argued that belief is “a relation between a subject or agent and a state of affairs that is not necessarily actual but that has actual objects as its constituents” (Barcan Marcus 1993 [1990]: 240). Her object-centered account of belief identifies belief with a differential disposition to a state of affairs:

x believes that S just in case, under certain agent-centered circumstances including x’s desires and needs as well as external circumstances, x is disposed to act as if S, that actual or nonactual state of affairs, obtains. (Barcan Marcus 1993 [1990]: 241)

Believing that so-and-so does not require concept possession. For example, believing that the sun is shining is a differential disposition to the state of affairs the sun’s shining, however described or presented.

The object-centered account of belief contrasts with mode-of-presentation-centered or language-centered accounts. The object-centered theory allows us to take belief-ascriptions to non-linguistic creatures to be literally true. However, it runs into problems when it comes to assertoric utterances of sentences containing empty singular terms. According to the object-centred view, these don’t express beliefs (see Barcan Marcus 1993 [1990]: 247). While the state of affairs a’s being F can exist, although a is not F; it cannot exist, if either a or being F doesn’t exist. Now take the belief that Napoleon was French. I satisfy all intuitive criteria for the possession of this belief. Imagine that we find out that, after all, there was never such a person as Napoleon. It was all a very elaborate hoax. Then there is no state of affairs composed of Napoleon and being French. Hence, although all intuitive criteria may have told us that I believed that Napoleon was French, we now find out that I never had that belief. This is counter-intuitive and artificial.

To sum up: Thoughts and states of affairs are different things. Thoughts cannot be reduced to states of affairs and the reduction of states of affairs to sets of referentially equivalent thoughts is unwarranted. We need both thoughts and states of affairs in order to fulfill different roles.

3. Facts and States of Affairs

3.1 Facts as Truth-Makers and Regress-Stoppers

What are facts and how may they be distinguished from states of affairs?

The Truthmaker-Argument is the main argument for the introduction of facts (see Armstrong 1997: 115ff). It also yields an understanding of the main features of facts. The argument can be summed up as follows:

  • (P1) Every truth must have a truth-maker.
  • (P2) The best candidates to occupy the truth-maker role are facts.
  • (C) There are facts.

Armstrong takes (P1) to articulate the following intuitive asymmetry: It is true that Socrates is wise because Socrates is wise; but Socrates is not wise because it is true that Socrates is wise (see Armstrong 2004: 4). In Armstrong’s terminology a truth-bearer is true in virtue of (made true by) the existence of another entity, a truth-maker. A truth-maker ensures or guarantees the truth of a truth-bearer. Some authors take this guarantee to be a form of necessitation: x makes it true that p if, and only if, necessarily, if x exists, it is true that p.

This brings us to the second premise of the Truthmaker-Argument. Why are facts the best candidates for the truth-maker role? Let us work through some alternatives. Take the thought that Socrates is wise. The existence of which object necessitates its truth? Socrates can exist without being wise. Hence, Socrates is not the truth-maker we are looking for.

The last point suggests that only a complex entity that “contains” Socrates as well as the property of being wise is a candidate for the truth-maker role. The mereological sum of Socrates and being wise, that is, the whole that has only Socrates and wisdom as parts, satisfies this condition, yet it cannot fulfill the truth-maker role. If Socrates and wisdom exist, their mereological sum exists. Hence, the sum exists whether it is true that Socrates is wise or not. For similar reasons the set that contains only Socrates and being wise cannot be the truth-maker of the thought that Socrates is wise. Armstrong concludes that only the fact that Socrates is wise that “ties” Socrates and being wise makes it true that Socrates is wise (see Armstrong 1997: 118).

Armstrong’s conception of truthmaking is controversial (see, for instance, Restall 1996). I will set its problems aside here and focus on clarifying the relation between facts and states of affairs. Facts “tie” particulars and universals. This brings them close to states of affairs that also involve particulars and universals. What distinguishes them is that the existence of a fact is supposed to guarantee the truth of a truth-bearer. The existence of the fact that a is F can only guarantee the truth of the thought that a is F if one cannot distinguish facts into those that obtain and those that do not obtain. Saying of the fact that Socrates is wise that it obtains is redundant, while it is not redundant to say so of the state of affairs Socrates’ being wise.

Facts are also introduced in order to stop a regress of instantiation. Take the particular a and the property of being F and assume that they can exist independently of each other. Given this assumption, there must be a relation that “ties” them together to a’s being F. If the required “tie” is a genuine relation, a regress, usually called Bradley’s regress, ensues: we need to introduce another relation that ties the first relation to a and being F, and so on. Facts are supposed to prevent Bradley’s regress (see Armstrong 1997: 115 and 118; Hossack 2007: 33). How? Relations that tie particulars and properties together are “explained away” in terms of facts that contain particulars and properties: if a instantiates F-ness, it does so because the fact that a is F exists. The existence of this fact guarantees that a is F. Facts are just instantiations of universals by particulars (see Armstrong 1997: 119). Hence, we arrive again at the result that the obtaining/non-obtaining distinction does not apply to facts.

In contrast to facts the obtaining/non-obtaining distinction divides states of affairs into those that obtain and those that do not obtain (see section 1). For this reason states of affairs cannot be truthmakers: their existence does not necessitate the truth of a truth-bearer. The state of affairs Socrates’ being foolish exists in some possible worlds in which Socrates is foolish, but it also exists in possible worlds in which Socrates is not foolish. Valicella reinforces this point:

[Facts] are not to be confused with abstract states of affairs which either obtain or do not obtain depending on how the world is. The latter are themselves in need of something in the world that explains why they obtain. (Valicella 2000: 237)

3.2 Are Facts Just Obtaining States of Affairs?

States of affairs contain particulars and properties; facts tie them. This similarity encourages the question whether a fact is nothing but a state of affairs that obtains (see Horwich 1990: 113 who takes true Russellian propositions to be facts). On this view the reason why it is redundant to say that a fact obtains is that a fact is just an obtaining state of affairs. However, the identification of facts with obtaining states of affairs creates problems for the theory of truthmaking. Assume that the fact that Socrates is wise is just the obtaining state of affairs Socrates’ being wise. The fact is supposed to make it true that Socrates is wise. But if the fact is just the obtaining state of affairs Socrates’ being wise, we need in turn something that explains why the state of affairs obtains. For it seems correct to say “The state of affairs Socrates’ being wise obtains because Socrates is wise”, but not “Socrates is wise because the state of affairs Socrates’ being wise obtains”. Hence, obtaining states of affairs cannot play the same role as facts. They cannot be truth-makers. The question “Why is it true that Socrates is wise?” cannot be conclusively answered by saying “Because Socrates’ being wise obtains”. This answer is in need of a further explanation of the same type as the one we were originally after.

3.3 Are States of Affairs Just Recombinations of Fact Constituents?

A non-obtaining state of affairs cannot be a fact. But can every state of affairs be a recombination of particulars and properties that are combined in some facts? Combinatorialists answer Yes (see, for example, Skyrms 1981; Armstrong 1989: 45ff; Bigelow 1988; Forbes 1989: 137). This idea has two main varieties:

Fictionalism: Like ideal gases or frictionless surfaces, possible states of affairs are (useful) fictions; only facts exist. Assume that a is not F. There exists no possible state of affairs a’s being F. But there is the fiction of possible states of affairs according to which there is the state of affairs a’s being F if, and only if, a and being F are contained in some facts (see Armstrong 1989: 46 and 49ff and the entry on modal fictionalism for a detailed overview).

Representationalism: there are no possible states of affairs, only representations of possible states of affairs (see Lewis 1986: 146 who ascribes this view to Skyrms). These representations are set-theoretic constructs that contain as their members particulars and universals that occur in some facts. For example, if a’s being F and b’s being G are both facts, but the sentence “a is G” is false, there is no state of affairs a’s being G, but there is an ordered-pair that contains a and being G as its members.

Representationalism raises the question: what distinguishes a (possible) state of affairs from a mere representation of it? Why is the state of affairs a’s being G not simply the ordered pair of a and being G? We will come back to this question in section 5.

4. States of Affairs as Complexes

In the previous sections we have seen that states of affairs are of value if the necessarily co-obtaining states of affairs are distinct. This gives us a reason to reject Chisholm’s (1976: 118) thesis that necessarily co-obtaining states of affairs are identical. At the same time it puts weight on the characterization of states of affairs as “involving” objects and properties or as composed out of objects and properties. It seems intuitively plausible that the state of affairs Socrates’s being wise involves Socrates and the property of being wise. But in what way do states of affairs involve particulars and properties?

4.1 States of Affairs as N-Tuples and Wholes

Ordered n-tuples have members. Are states of affairs n-tuples that have objects and properties as members? Is, for example, the state of affairs Socrates’s being wise nothing but the ordered pair \(\langle\)Socrates, being wise\(\rangle\)? Plantinga answers NO:

Clearly there are many set-theoretical models of our talk about states of affairs and individuals. Why pick any of them as more revealing than the others? (Plantinga 1984: 327)

We can model states of affairs as ordered n-tuples in many different ways. But there seems no way to decide between \(\langle\)Socrates, being wise\(\rangle\) and \(\langle\)being wise, Socrates\(\rangle\) as the right model for the state of affairs. Hence, the state of affairs is not identical with either ordered pair (see Pollock 1984b: 138).

Some philosophers spell out “involvement” as containment: A state of affairs is a complex that contains properties and particulars as parts. In order to assess this proposal, let us first sharpen our understanding of the part-of relation. Any relation worthy of the name “(proper) part-of” must be reflexive (everything is part of itself), transitive (if x is a part of y and z a part of x, z is a part of y) and antisymmetrical (if x is part of y and y part of x, x is identical to y) (see the entry on mereology, sect. 2 and 3). A further plausible principle for the part-of relation is the supplementation principle: if x is not part of y, there is an object z that is part of y and that does overlap, that is, have a part in common, with y. The supplementation principle implies the intuitively plausible view that nothing can have a single proper part. The supplementation principle together with the uncontroversial axioms for the (proper) part-of relation also implies the more controversial thesis that complex objects with the same parts are identical (see entry on mereology, 3.2).

The transitivity of part-of immediately gives rise to problems. For instance, Frege wrote to Wittgenstein:

[If Vesuvius is part of a state of affairs,] it seems that parts of Vesuvius must also be parts of this fact; the fact will hence also consist of solidified lava. This does not seem right to me. (Frege 1919: 20; my translation)

If Vesuvius is part of the obtaining state of affairs Vesuvius’s being a volcano, the state of affairs must by the transitivity of part-of contain the parts of solidified lava that are parts of Vesuvius. But if the state of affairs contains the solidified lava as parts, it must have a weight and an extension etc. However, the state of affairs Vesuvius’s being a volcano is not a thing that has weight etc.

There are further problems for the view that states of affairs are complexes. If the state of affairs a’s being F has only a and being F as its parts (in any plausible sense of “part”), it can only exist at a time at which a and being F exist (the sum of all my body parts exists only at the time when all my body parts exist). Hence, the state of affairs a’s ceasing to exist before b’s starting to exist cannot be a complex containing a and b. For there is no time when its constituents both exist (see Künne 2003: 122).

The principles for the (proper) part-of relation imply that complexes with the same parts are identical. But take the state of affairs that Romeo loves Juliet. If it has Romeo, Love and Juliet as its parts, it is the same as the state of affairs that Juliet loves Romeo. But intuitively, the state of affairs Juliet’s loving Romeo is different from the state of affairs Romeo’s loving Juliet. On the standard mereological conception of part, particulars and universals are not parts of states of affairs.

4.2 Non-Mereological Composition to the Rescue?

The last point cuts both ways. Why not say that different complex objects can have the same parts? Armstrong (1997: 118) answered this question positively and argued that facts are non-mereological composites. Lewis has denied that there is room for non-mereological composition (see Lewis 1992: 213; for discussion McDaniel 2009). However, independently of considerations about states of affairs we allow for different wholes that share all their parts. For instance, the sentences “John loves Mary” and “Mary loves John” both consist of the same words “John”, “Mary” and “loves”, yet they are clearly different sentences.

But our intuitive notion does not allow for wholes without remainder: if something x is part of a whole W, there is a remainder of W that is not identical with x. The remainder principle is implied by the supplementation principle of mereology, but not the other way around (see mereology entry, sect. 3.2) Hence, we can draw on the remainder principle without endorsing the stronger supplementation principle. Now there seem to be states of affairs that “contain” only one property (Bynoe 2011 argues the following point in detail). Bradley's Regress which was discussed in section 3.1 seems to show that the state of affairs Socrates’ being wise consists only of Socrates and being wise. There is no relation that ties them to a state of affairs. Otherwise the question would arise what relates this relation to Socrates and being wise. Now some properties instantiate themselves: identity is self-identical. Hence, the state of affairs identity’s being self-identical obtains. But this state of affairs contains only the property of identity. There seems to be no plausible sense of “part” in which such states of affairs have parts.

We are back then to the problem of how to make sense of how a state of affairs involves properties and particulars. In order to solve it, we need to find a relation between the state of affairs a’s being F and a and being F that (i) does not make a and being F parts of the state of affairs, (ii) allows one to distinguish between necessarily co-obtaining states of affairs, and (iii) distinguishes the state of affairs a’s being F from other objects that, intuitively speaking, involve a and being F.

4.3 Are States of Affairs Ontologically Dependent?

Fine (1982: 51–2) has suggested an answer that invokes the independently motivated idea that the identity of some objects is explained in terms of the identity of other objects (see also Fine 1995; Bynoe 2011: 99–100; and Keller 2013: 669). Consider Fine’s example of the singleton of 1. The singleton of 1 is the set whose sole member is 1. The singleton of 1 is ontologically dependent on 1 because its identity depends on the identity of 1. We explain what the singleton is by appealing to 1, but not the other way around. Similarly, the identity of (atomic) states of affairs is explained in terms of objects and properties. Fine (1982: 52) takes basic states of affairs—propositions in his terminology—to be the results of the application of the operation of predication to particulars and properties. We say what the state of affairs a’s being F is by saying that it is the result of predicating being F to a. Hence, the state of affairs a’s being F depends on being F to a. Complex states of affairs are the result of the application of such operations as conjunction and disjunction to basic states of affairs (on Operationalism as a general approach see Fine 2010: 564ff). The notion of predication gives rise to several questions and we will come back to it in the next section.

If states of affairs are ontologically dependent on particulars and properties, we can satisfy the desiderata (i) to (iii):

(i) An object can ontologically depend on other objects without being a complex that contains these objects as parts. The axis of the earth ontologically depends on the Earth, but it does not contain the Earth as a constituent. The assumption that the state of affairs a’s being F ontologically depends on a and F can therefore solve the problems that arise for the assumption that it contains a and F. Take for example Frege’s intuitive argument against the view that states of affairs contain physical objects like Vesuvius. The state of affairs Vesuvius’s being a volcano ontologically depends on Vesuvius, but it does not contain it as a part. Hence, it does not contain the lava parts that are the parts of Vesuvius. There is no need to ascribe weight etc. to the state of affairs.

Ontological dependence helps us to get around the temporal problems raised by the logical complex view of states of affairs. While a complex cannot exist at a time at which some of its parts don’t exist, an object can ontologically depend on objects that no longer exist. (I ontologically depend on a particular event, the fertilization of a particular egg by a particular sperm, although this event is long past.)

(ii) Fine’s proposal suggests that states of affairs are individuated in terms of the objects and relations in virtue of which they exist:

  • (Same2) If \(S_1\) and \(S_2\) are states of affairs, \(S_1 = S_2\) if, and only if, \(S_1\) and \(S_2\) exist in virtue of the same properties predicated of the same particulars.

This criterion of identity for states of affairs distinguishes between the necessarily co-obtaining states of affairs Hesperus’s being self-identical and Socrates’ being self-identical because they ontologically depend on different things. Hence, they come out as different. In turn, Hesperus’s being a planet and Phosphorus’s being a planet come out, as it is desirable, as the same state of affairs.

(iii) If the state of affairs Hesperus’s being a planet ontologically depends on Hesperus, it can only exist if Hesperus exists at some time. In contrast, a thought can exist whether or not the objects it purports to be about ever existed or will exist. The thought that Pegasus is a horse exists, whether there is such a horse or not.

The notion of ontologically dependence sheds light on the sense in which states of affairs “involve” particulars and properties: a state of affairs involves those objects on which it ontologically depends. But the notion of ontologically dependence does not do the main work in the account proposed. It is because some properties are predicated of some objects that (i) they form a state of affairs (ii) such that this state of affairs depends on them and can be said to involve them. A fundamental question about states of affairs concerns then the conditions of predicability. We will come back to this question.

5. The Unity of a State of Affairs

5.1 The Unity-Problem

If one conceives of a state of affairs as complexes that “contain” particulars and properties, one needs to answer the unity-question “What unifies some particulars and properties into one state of affairs?” An answer to this question should distinguish states of affairs from other complexes. Frege pressed this point in his letters to Wittgenstein:

Is every connection of objects a state of affairs? Does it not also depend on how the connection is produced? What is the tie? Can this perhaps be gravitation, as with the system of planets? Is it [the system of planets] a state of affairs? (Frege 1919: 20, my translation)

If the solar system does not qualify as a state of affairs, one better finds a notion of involvement that is independent of gravitation as the relation that holds between the things involved in the state of affairs. What distinguishes this complex physical object from the state of affairs the sun’s pulling the planets into orbit by gravity? If the latter contains the sun and the planets and the pulling-by gravity relation, the distinction between the states of affairs and solar system must lie in what unites their elements.

Russell argued that there is no plausible answer to the unity-question for states of affairs (he called them “propositions”). He explains his main worry about states of affairs as follows:

Our disbelief in their [propositions’] reality may be reinforced by asking ourselves what kind of entity a false proposition could be. Let us take some very simple false proposition, say “A precedes B”, when in fact A comes after B. It seems as though nothing were involved here beyond A and B and “preceding” and the general form of dual complexes. But since A does not precede B, these objects are not put together in the way indicated in the proposition. It seems, therefore, that nothing which is actually composed of these objects is the proposition; and it is not credible that anything further enters the proposition. (Russell 1913: 109–10; for a detailed discussion of this argument see Wetzel 1998)

What unifies A, B and the relation of Preceding to the fact that A precedes B? A’s actually preceding B. What unifies A, B and the relation of Preceding to the state of affairs A’s preceding B? If A does not precede B, the unity of the state of affairs cannot consist in A being actually related by the preceding relation to B.

So far Russell has only shown that the unity of a state of affairs A’s standing in R to B does not consist in A’s standing in R to B. In addition, he has imposed a constraint on answers to the unity-question. He says that it is not credible that there is a unifying element that is not a constituent of the state of affairs. Russell himself couldn’t find an answer to the unity-question that met his constraint. Hence, he tried to eliminate states of affairs.

5.2 External Unification

While Russell does not refute the view that there are states of affairs, he asks philosophers who believe in them a difficult question. To see the force of the constraint he imposes on answers to the unity-question consider a proposal that violates it. External theories develop the following general idea (I take the “external/internal” terminology from Valicella 2000):

The state of affairs a’s being F exists if, and only if, there is something distinct from a, being F and a’s being F & it unifies a and being F to form a’s being F.

Roughly speaking, the external unifier can bring the constituents of states of affairs together even if they don’t constitute a fact. A psychological version of the External Theory is proposed in Valicella 2000. According to him, the external ground of unity is the judging consciousness that brings about the unity of a state of affairs (Valicella 2000: 252).

Russell, in turn, argued that a mental act cannot unify some things to form a state of affairs:

Suppose we wish to understand “A and B are similar”. It is essential that our thought should, as is said, “unite” or “synthesize” the two terms and the relation; but we cannot actually “unite” them, since either A and B are similar, in which case they are already united, or they are dissimilar, in which case no amount of thinking can force them to be united. (Russell 1913: 116)

Any mental activity seems simply to be unable to create unity where none obtains already. If I think of a and being F, why should a new complex object consisting of them come into existence? Russell himself goes on to suppose that the mind is able to unite A, B and similarity with a logical form. How the mind can have that ability goes unexplained.

The linguistic version of the External Theory takes states of affairs to be descripta of sentences that owe their unity to the sentences that describe them:

The state of affairs a’s being F exists if, and only if, there is a sentence of a language L (or an extension of L) that concatenates a singular term referring to a and a general term referring to F. (see Taylor 1985: 29ff; King 2009: 263)

The linguistic version gives up on the view that states of affairs are language independent (see King 2009: 259 who concedes this). There is nothing in our intuitive notion of states of affairs that justifies the assumption that states of affairs depend for their unity on the existence of a language in which they are described. For example, there will be a space of probable outcomes of an event whether there are descriptions of them or not.

The criticism of the External Theory makes Russell’s constraint on an answer to the unity-question plausible. States of affairs are conceived of as sui generis entities that do not owe their unity and hence their identity to anything else.

5.3 Internal Unification

This brings us to Internal Theories that explain the unity of a state of affairs merely by appealing to its constituents.

The state of affairs a’s being F exists if, and only if, a or being F or both unify the state of affairs.

Ramsey describes (but does not endorse) the core of this view when he says:

[I]n every atomic fact there must be one constituent which is in its own nature incomplete or connective and, as it were, holds the other constituents together. (Ramsey 1925: 408)

For Wittgenstein in his Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus there is no designated connector in a state of affairs. All constituents are incomplete and mutually complete each other:

In a state of affairs objects fit into one another like the links in a chain. (Wittgenstein 1918: 2.03; Pears/McGuiness translation)

So far we have only been given a necessary condition for the existence of a state of affairs. Among the things that enter into a state of affairs there must be at least one incomplete one. Wittgenstein will require incompleteness or connectivity of all things that enter a state of affairs.

The notion of incompleteness at work here is difficult to explain. But one way to develop it is to propose that the incomplete and connecting elements are functions. For example, the property being F is conceived of as a function that takes a particular a as argument and maps it to the state of affairs a’s being F (see Oliver 1992: 91). The problems of the functional model of states of affairs are manifest in the development of Frege’s work. Frege 1879 held that sentences stand for what he called “judgeable contents”, complexes composed of functions and objects. For Frege predication is the application of a function to an object. Judgeable contents seem to be nothing other than states of affairs. However, the idea that states of affairs are complex does not sit happily with Frege’s further idea that the judgeable content a’s being F is the value of the function F for a as argument.

Now different functions have the same value for different arguments. For example, 3 is the value of the function Square root of x for 9 and the value of the function \(x+1\) for 2. Which of these arguments and functions is contained in the value 3? Since there is no principle that singles out one argument and function as constituting the value, we should abandon either the functional model of incompleteness or the idea that states of affairs have constituents. Later Frege takes the second option:

The references of the parts of a sentence are not parts of the reference of the sentence. (Frege 1910–14: 87)

Since different functions can have the same value for different arguments, Frege arrived at the view that a sentence that is either true or false refers to its truth-value, the True or the False. Every true (false) sentence has the same referent: the True (the False). States of affairs have no place in the Fregean theory of reference. The “case study” of Frege shows that the functional model of incompleteness undermines the very idea that states of affairs are complexes (for a reply to this argument see Gaskin 2008: 100).

The strategy to explain the unity of a state of affairs by using the notion of incompleteness either only labels the problem or, if incomplete elements are taken to be functions, threatens the very idea of states of affairs. Can one dispense with the notion of incompleteness in an answer to the unity-question?

The unity-question arises on a conception that takes states of affairs to be ontologically dependent entities. Take the state of affairs Aristotle’s being wise. It ontologically depends on Aristotle and being wise. So do the ordered pair \(\langle\)Aristotle, being wise\(\rangle\) and the mereological sum of Aristotle and being wise. What distinguishes them? If we follow Fine, the answer will invoke an operation that “generates” the entities in question. States of affairs are generated by predication, ordered pairs by another operation.

Now saying that something is predicated of something else sounds as if the existence of a state of affairs depends on performing an act. But this is a misunderstanding. Johnston explains:

[P]redicability guarantees predication. Whenever F-ness is predicable of a, there will be something that is the predication of F-ness to a. (Johnston 2006: 684)

All the interesting work is done by the notion of predicability:

The state of affairs a’s being F exists if, and only if, being F is predicable of a.

When a property (relation) is predicable of some objects will be determined by a number of principles (or axioms) (Johnston 2006: 685). For example, particulars are not predicable of other particulars, n-place properties are only predicable of n particulars. It is part of the nature of the objects and properties on which a state of affairs ontologically depends that the properties are predicable of the objects. This brings us to a key thought of Wittgenstein’s theory of states of affairs:

  • 2.0123 If I know an object I also know all its possible occurrences in states of affairs. (Every one of these possibilities must be part of the nature of the object.)
  • 2.0214 If all objects are given, then at the same time all possible states of affairs are also given.

The nature of particulars and properties determines whether the second are predicable of the first or not. Wetzel (1998: 57) fills this suggestion out in an informative way. An object may be in a range of possible states due to its capacities. Given that the computer I am writing on belongs to a particular kind there is a range of possibilities for it to be: it might be broken, functioning well, be turned off etc. Its capacities and, broadly speaking, its nature is the “ontological ground of ranges of possible states of affairs in which [it is a constituent]” (1998: 57). One should add that the nature and capacities of an object also determine a range of impossibilities such as the impossibility of my computer’s becoming a sentient being.

However, consider my computer’s being to the left of my lamp. This is a possibility for my computer, but it is a brute possibility not grounded in its causal powers. Hence, the range of states of affairs which contain a particular seems to be broader than the range of states of affairs determined by its capacities.

If the property being F is predicable of the object a, the state of affairs a’s being F exists. Hence, states of affairs exist in virtue of the nature of objects and properties. No unifying relation or operation in addition to a and being F is required. What distinguishes states of affairs from other entities which ontologically depend on the same properties and particulars is that states of affairs exist because the properties are predicable of the particulars.

This account assumes that if being F is predicable of a, there is a state of affairs a’s being F that ontologically depends on them. This move carries the problem posed by states of affairs to the right place: what are the restrictions on predicability? If one has answered this question, one has solved the unity problem for states of affairs.

6. Conclusion

Does one need states of affairs in addition to facts and thoughts? Yes, there seem to be good reasons to posit states of affairs as a sui generis category of object. If states of affairs are to be useful (i) they must exist even if they do not obtain and (ii) must involve objects and properties (relations) directly. (i) is the basic feature that distinguishes states of affairs from facts; (ii) the basic feature that distinguishes them from thoughts. Therefore a theory of states of affairs must answer the question how a state of affairs can “involve” objects and properties (relations) and combine them, if the objects don’t exemplify the properties (stand in the relations). Although there are promising proposals to answer it, this question is still open.

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Acknowledgments

I want to thank Arianna Betti, Will Bynoe, Chris Hughes, Fabrice Correia, Keith Hossack, Nick Jones and Jessica Leech, Dolf Rami and three anonymous referees for discussion and comments.

Copyright © 2016 by
Mark Textor <mark.textor@kcl.ac.uk>

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