Notes to Public Health Ethics

1. For example, the Institute of Medicine defines public health as “what we, as a society, do collectively to assure the conditions in which people can be healthy” (IOM 1988; IOM 2003).

2. The 2014–2015 Ebola outbreaks in multiple West African countries are some of the many examples illustrating the limitations of national efforts in the control of infectious disease.

3. Private actors other than NGOs, especially for-profit industries, also play a role in producing public health. For instance, pharmaceutical companies develop vaccines or anti-biotics that are integral to preventing infectious disease. Engineers develop technologies that can be used to provide citizens with clean water or air. Yet it sounds odd to say that these activities constitute public health interventions. These private actors focus on developing the relevant medicine or technologies rather than ensuring that people have access to them. By analogy, it would be odd to claim biotech startups that develop medical technologies that are used by care providers in the clinical setting are, themselves, providing patients with medical care. Of course, how government ought to regulate these actors is an ethical question with significant implications for public health.

4. This description does not apply to libertarian theories that we discuss in Section 3.

5. Some theorists resist conceptualizing health inequalities in terms of groups and instead defend a methodology in which variation in health focuses on health status across individuals rather than across groups. For a discussion of this debate, see Section 4, of the entry on Justice, Inequality and Health.

6. Cost-effectiveness analysis uses natural measures like average five-year survival or infant mortality to assess the relative efficiency or value for money of alternative interventions to address the same or similar health problem using the same outcome (For instance, it compares different drugs for lung cancer or different interventions to reduce infant mortality). CEA is open to many of the same ethical defenses and criticisms as CUA.

7. For a discussion of the distinction between scarce and non-scare resources, see (Ubel and Goold 1998).

8. As we discuss below, the distinction between prevention and treatment is blurred, or there are cases of ‘treatment-as-prevention’.

9. See, for example, Baicker, Cutler and Song (2010); Bolnick, Millard and Dugas (2013); and Schmidt, Stock and Doran (2012).

10. A recurrent theme in these defenses is that even if very small benefits to each member of a group add up to larger overall benefit than saving one life, we should still save the one life. So, for instance, if forced to choose between saving one person’s life and eliminating the sore throat of everyone in the world, many would balk at choosing to eliminate the sore throats of everyone – even if, on some metric of well-being, eliminating the sore throats were to produce better overall welfare. (Kamm 1993, 1994) In reply, some argue that not all rescue will be for such severe harms, nor will all preventive efforts be for such trivial harms. Moreover, the concern about aggregating trivial benefits can seem misplaced when considering health policy measures that will actually save some statistical lives, and comparing such measures to rescue of identified lives. For this sort of reply, see (Hope 2001; Sheehan 2007).

11. Sometimes ‘rule of rescue’ is used to refer to the psychological phenomenon we refer to as the ‘identified victim effect’ or there is not much distinction between the psychological phenomenon and the moral imperative. We use it to refer to the moral imperative for purposes of clarity and simplicity.

12. Even if one might think that the rule of rescue should not inform allocation decisions or priority-setting, some argue it still has an important role to play in the clinical setting. (Cookson and McCabe and Tsuchiya 2007; Hughes and Walker 2009).

13. See Samuel Moyn for a discussion of this approach in (Moyn 2018).

14. Philosophers disagree about the significance of the distinction between justice and mere humanitarian duties. Typically, duties of justice are viewed as more stringent, corresponding to someone’s rights, and hence not simply matters of charity for which the donor has wide discretion about whom to assist, how much, and in what manner; see (Barry 1982).

15. A qualification is relevant here – namely, that the poverty in question does not occur in a vacuum but is caused by global economic institutions, and certain kinds of interaction between wealthier and poorer nations. Indeed, this point is important to making the case that global health is a matter of justice rather than beneficence. We thank an anonymous reviewer for pointing out this important qualification

16. Legitimacy questions have also been raised about the activities of pan-national organizations and private actors such as large philanthropies, but these questions have attracted far less scrutiny in public health ethics.

17. Here it is worth noting that the sense of legitimacy we discuss is normative, rather than descriptive. Normative legitimacy concerns the conditions under which government exercises of coercive power are actually morally permissible, rather than the conditions under which citizens judge that the government permissibly exercises its power. A second important clarification is that some draw a distinction between a right to make law and a moral power to obligate citizens to obey the law. The term ‘legitimacy’ often gets used to refer to both of these concepts (Simmons 1999) but in recent years, a growing number of scholars have emphasized the importance of differentiating them. For this distinction, see, esp., (Applbaum 2010; Buchanan 2002; Edmundson 1999; Zhu 2016). Finally, some sharply divide ‘legitimacy’ and ‘justification,’ such that theories of public justification do not constitute theories of legitimacy (Simmons 1999). We largely ignore this distinction for purposes of simplicity, although it informs some of the views we discuss. For instance, various public reason theorists or proponents of the liberty tradition might insist that regardless of whether various considerations ultimately justify implementing a particular policy, this does not suffice to show that the state has the right to implement such policies – such policies might be said to be justified but illegitimate.

18. In this entry, we typically use ‘liberty’ and ‘freedom’ as rough synonyms, although at certain places we specify different senses of these concepts, especially when discussing republican challenges to freedom as non-interference, or what Isaiah Berlin influentially dubbed ‘negative liberty’ (Berlin 1958). For work that brings to bear notions of relational autonomy to public health ethics, see esp., (Baylis et al. 2008).

19. A classic example is when an outbreak of measles can be traced to the intentional under-vaccination of children by their parents (Omerand et al. 2009; Thompson et al. 2007; Sugarman et al. 2010).

20. Again, this is similar to the case of the free market: by and large it is preferable to have free markets than not to have them, but this does not render specific aspects of its operations immune to criticism and reform from an ethical point of view.

21. There are a variety of definitions of paternalism that are more or less expansive. For instance, Jonathan Quong defines paternalism as involving two conditions: “1) Agent A attempts to improve the welfare, good, happiness, needs, interests, or values of agent B with regard to a particular decision or situation that B faces. 2) A’s act is motivated by a negative judgment about B’s ability (assuming B has the relevant information] to make the right decision or manage the particular situation in a way that will effectively advance B’s welfare, good, happiness, needs, interests, or values,’ (Quong 2011, 80). Other definitions that are broader than the one we use include (Shiffrin 2000). We do not explore these debates about paternalism for three reasons. First, whether one deems paternalism morally objectionable for the reasons we articulate will depend on the definition of paternalism one adopts. So, for instance, someone might agree that paternalism as defined by Dworkin is illegitimate but deny that paternalism as defined by Quong is illegitimate. It would be unwieldy and distracting to explore the variety of definitions of paternalism and the possible normative assessments of paternalism. Second, we opt for Dworkin’s definition because, independent of whether it is the best way to conceptualize paternalism, it is an especially prominent definition employed in public health ethics. Third, a more expansive view of paternalism, along with the claim that paternalistic interventions are illegitimate, would entail a very restrictive view about the appropriate scope of government activity. Yet we discuss something like these views in the subsection on the liberty tradition. Accordingly, one could defend the liberty tradition by appealing to (a) a more expansive definition of paternalism than we use and (b) the normative claim that government paternalism is illegitimate.

22. Ignorance and false beliefs are not usually sufficient to make a preference subject to interference, and generally require supplementing by stronger considerations such as age or cognitive disability or harm to others (e.g. one’s child) on the basis of one’s own ignorance or false beliefs. In the normal course of things, we all have at least some preferences based on ignorance and false beliefs that proponents of soft paternalism nonetheless do not think can legitimately be interfered with unless there is some compelling reason to impute impairment of rationality beyond, say, weakness of will.

23. Some object to this claim. Serene Khader, for instance, raises a powerful challenge to the idea that adaptive preferences should be construed as non-autonomous. See (Khader 2009; 2012).

24. For an argument in defense of restrictive policies on the sale of cigarettes, see esp., (Goodin 1990). Some object that this line of argument over-generalizes because our agency is compromised in many domains other than public health, yet we do not think this warrants similar forms of interference in those domains (Grill and Voigt 2016).

25. This is often accompanied by a much stronger view of the legitimacy of external judgments about what is really in a person’s interest, and a stronger likelihood to question individuals’ own assessment of their best interests than alternative, softer versions of paternalism.

26. Consider, for example, the debate in the United States about the appropriateness and necessity of isolating asymptomatic health professionals returning from providing care to Ebola patients in West Africa.

27. Here it is worth noting that Accountability for Reasonableness is often framed as a matter of justice or fairness, or procedural justice or fairness the latter of which is often invoked as a requirement for legitimacy. We focus on the legitimacy dimension of Accountability for Reasonableness.

28. For instance, Alexander Freidman writes that employing A4R leaves decision-makers “…saddled with an abstract debate in political philosophy with regard to which there is no consensus, which requires resolving disputes about the very nature and foundations of the political process and of democratic legitimacy, and the views on which have a significant degree of correlation with the very moral positions in question. Instead of limiting moral disagreement and making it more tractable, the Relevance Condition now forces us to address highly abstract and extremely contentious debates in political philosophy before we can even begin to deal with the moral disagreement itself,” (Friedman 2008, 107).

29. The passage cited by Baylis, Kenny, and Sherwin appears in Bruce Jennings’s articulation of a civic republican approach to public health ethics, an approach that has garnered significant attention in recent years.

30. This view is also reflected in a long-standing position in public health that policies should employ the least restrictive measure possible to secure their public health objectives. See, esp. (Upshur 2002; Childress et al. 2002, 173; Gostin 2008, 142).

Copyright © 2020 by
Ruth Faden <>
Justin Bernstein <>
Sirine Shebaya <>

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