Public Health Ethics
At its core, public health is concerned with promoting and protecting the health of populations, broadly understood. Promoting and protecting the health of populations often involves or requires coordinated action on the part of governments. In the United States, for example, the Centers for Disease Control and Prevention, the Food and Drug Administration, the Environmental Protection Agency and the Consumer Protection Agency are, at least in part, public health agencies. All nations and most states or provinces and municipalities have health departments whose functions include everything from the inspection of commercial food service to the collection and use of epidemiological data for population surveillance of disease. Collective action to promote and protect population health also occurs at the global level, as exemplified by the activities of the World Health Organization.
This entry provides a general lay of the land of the central ethical issues and challenges that arise in public health policies and practices and that drive the literature in public health ethics. Some issues are conceptual: what is the public, and in what sense can a public be healthy? Other questions concern the moral foundations of the enterprise: what sort of value does public health have, and what morally justifies efforts to promote public health?
The literature in public health ethics often falls into two big categories. The first category focuses on the goals, targets and priorities of public health policies and programs from the standpoint of justice. Many of the issues engage familiar debates between utilitarian and various egalitarian approaches to the allocation of resources and the distribution of benefits and burdens (see also the entry on justice); in health policy circles these issues often play out as tensions between efficiency and equity. The justice literature in public health ethics also addresses broader concerns about structural injustice, fairness and power. Health and threats to health often vary significantly between different social groups or subpopulations within a defined public. Because these differences frequently co-travel with indices of disadvantage and power, and because health is viewed by many as a core dimension of human welfare or flourishing, some frame the foundation or justification of public health in terms of fairness and justice – much in the way that significant disparities in resources or liberties are generally framed. Although questions of justice in public health regularly occur within the same nation-state, these same questions also arise between countries and regions of the world. For instance, the life expectancy of individuals in many countries in the global south is far lower than in wealthier nations. To some, this is a clear injustice, one that should be front and center in debates about public health.
The second category in the public health ethics literature also focuses on the goals and targets of public health policies and programs but from the standpoint of the legitimacy or authority of the State to implement measures that promote or protect public health. (See also the entry on political legitimacy.) The normative perspective of legitimacy is particularly relevant in public health ethics because public health interventions are typically undertaken by government, and many maintain that various government interventions stand in special need of moral justification. Familiar debates about the tension between individual liberty and the common good or the moral permissibility of paternalistic interventions have traditionally animated this discussion. Others frame the challenges of state legitimacy or authority slightly differently in terms of what governments should do when citizens disagree about values, such as the importance of health – individual or public. Still others object to the framing of the foundations or justifications of public health from the standpoint of legitimacy in the liberal tradition.
Many real-world challenges in public health ethics require both the justice and the legitimacy standpoints in order to provide an adequate analysis of what is morally at stake. For instance, one way to interpret challenges to New York’s soda tax is that the state lacked the right to interfere with individual choice by imposing a tax, or that such a tax was objectionable because it rested on a contentious view about the disvalue of soft drinks. However, that framing is ethically incomplete without also addressing whether the regressive character of the tax meant that the costs of its attendant public health benefits would be borne disproportionately by subgroups in the population who are already disadvantaged in ways that cannot be justified.
Many writers in public health ethics are concerned to integrate both standpoints in their analyses of specific issues in public health policy that, like the soda tax example, importantly engage them both. However, because many debates within public health ethics are located in one standpoint or the other, we distinguish them in this entry. Before taking up these different debates, Section 1 articulates two distinctive features of public health that give shape to public health ethics and help to distinguish it from other areas of inquiry in bioethics, especially the ethics of clinical practice. The first and perhaps most defining of these two features is that public health is committed to advancing the health of collectives, and not the health of individuals. Much of Section 1 is taken up with several conceptual and ethics questions that emerge from this feature. The second distinctive feature of public health introduced in Section 1 is the prominent role that government action and government power play in the promotion of public health.
Section 2 discusses issues in public health ethics that are (primarily) animated by the perspective of justice. Some of these issues flow directly from public health’s focus on population health and the resultant need to aggregate goals and outcomes, as well as public health’s special connection to prevention which is also directly connected to its population-level focus. Section 3 discusses issues in public health ethics that are (primarily) animated by the perspective of legitimacy. These issues flow from the heavy reliance of public health on government action and government power.
- 1. What Makes Public Health, And Therefore Public Health Ethics, Distinctive?
- 2. Justice and Public Health
- 3. Political legitimacy and Public Health
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. What Makes Public Health, And Therefore Public Health Ethics, Distinctive?
There is no standard way of organizing the ethics of clinical practice, public health, and biomedical science. These different fields are often presented as discrete areas of inquiry that fall under the broader, umbrella term of bioethics, but sometimes bioethics is presented as the equivalent of medical ethics or in contrast to public health or population-level bioethics. Whichever approach is preferred, a key question remains: what distinguishes public health ethics from these other fields, and especially from the ethics of clinical care? The answer lies in two characteristics of public health that make it distinctive and that mark morally relevant differences between public health and clinical care- first, public health’s focus on the health of populations and second, the large role that government plays in this pursuit.
1.1 Population Focus
The first and perhaps most defining characteristic of public health is that it is committed to advancing health at the level of populations. By contrast, in clinical practice, the focus is on the health of each patient, as an individual. While health is primarily understood as a private good in clinical care, in public health, health is a good of a group or collective that, in some sense, constitutes the public.
Public health’s population focus necessitates that it deals only with aggregated health concerns when setting goals and assessing outcomes. This need in public health to aggregate – and therefore obscure individual or even sub-group – interests in health is, in turn, one of the reasons why so much of the literature in public health ethics engages questions of justice. We take up some of these questions in Section 2.
Public health’s population focus also positions it well to lead on the prevention of disease and injury (Rose 1985, Rose et al. 2008; Childress et al. 2002; Faden, Shebaya, and Siegel 2019). Although clinicians often incorporate preventive interventions in their practice with patients, no other social institution is generally recognized as so clearly having a prevention remit. Many public health agencies, including in the US the Centers for Disease Control and Prevention and the FDA’s Center for Food Safety and Nutrition are designed to prevent illness and injury at the population level. Public health’s commitment to prevention carries with it particular moral challenges. Eliminating or mitigating harm that already exists is sometimes viewed as being of greater moral importance – or simply as more immediately motivating action – than long-term strategies to prevent harm from materializing. Whether it is ethically justifiable to privilege the interests of the currently ill, who are often known and identifiable, over those of future people who cannot now be identified is a paradigmatic challenge of justice in public health ethics addressed briefly in Section 2.
1.1.1 Who is the Public in Public Health?
While many of the moral challenges that arise from public health’s population health focus are primarily questions of justice, in this Section and in Section 1.1.2 we consider some challenges, including some conceptual challenges, that are not.
That the object of moral concern in public health is the public rather than individuals (Rose 1985; Rose et al. 2008; Coggon 2012) raises a conceptual question: what or who is the public? While interesting in its own right, this question is also important because it informs justificatory challenges that public health ethics has to address: who is public health good for? Whose health are we concerned with, and what sacrifices is it acceptable to ask of individuals in order to achieve it? And why is public health a good worth promoting?
In attempting to answer these questions, it is worth beginning by querying whether, as has been used so far, the terms “public” and “population” are interchangeable to designate the entity whose health is the object of public health concern. Is there a significant conceptual difference, a difference in moral valence, or a difference in attitude and orientation between public health ethics on the one hand, and population-level health ethics on the other? The literature presents three general ways of denoting the object of public health: the community, the public, and populations. In one sense, the most morally laden manner of designating those who are subject to, and benefit from, public health measures, is to think about them as a community (Beauchamp and Steinbock 1999). Reference to “community” implies a cohesive group, usually with a shared language, culture, history, and geographical location. Characterizing the concern of public health as being the health of the community renders more natural (and possibly more plausible) appeal to the common good as a way of justifying public health interventions.
Reference to “the public” shares some of those same features but tends to be less morally laden. This is in part because “the public” is somewhat more anonymous than “the community” and does not necessarily signal a tight cultural connection. Rather, it connotes a relatively discrete unit with some common institutions and usually a shared political life. References to the public as well as to the community may encourage the perception that the good we are seeking to advance is that of a geographically bounded unit, with community connoting stronger cultural associations, and public connoting some kind of official political unit such as a state or a country with geographically defined boundaries. One reason to be hesitant to accept this characterization is its problematic fit with some threats to health. Communicable diseases, for example, have a way of ignoring national boundaries, and preventive measures in one country may be futile if other countries do not follow suit.
Characterizing the health we are trying to advance as that of populations, by contrast, may minimize the implication that special shared features or characteristics are needed in order for a group of individuals to constitute a collective unit whose health can be of concern. Because of that, it may lend itself more readily to an internationalist, less inward-looking orientation: any population, regardless of nationality or geographic location, has health interests that ought to be attended to and advanced (Wikler & Brock 2007). Populations can be more local or more global than a community or the public. This way of speaking also may dilute the emphasis on national borders as a way of delineating the scope of concern and provides more flexibility in the object of concern for public health. In much the same way, discussion of global health, as opposed to international health, is seen as helpful in emphasizing a focus on the health needs of all, as opposed to a focus on international cooperation and the health needs of peoples in countries other than one’s own. This is not, of course, to say that those who prefer the term “public health” to “population health” do not share a global orientation. Indeed, the World Health Organization is generally referred to as a global public health institution, and those who work to promote health transnationally are referred to as public health and not population health professionals. Indeed, although some see a substantive conceptual divergence in ways of thinking about whose health is to be protected and promoted, others see no conflict, at least between the concepts of public health and population health. For example, the Nuffield Council on Bioethics uses the term “population health” to refer to the collective state of health of members of a population and the term “public health” to refer to efforts made to improve the political, regulatory and economic environments that affect prospects for health. So understood, the object of public health is the improvement of population health (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2007, p. XV).
Depending on the particular health challenge we are concerned with, the public in question can be more local or more global than a single country’s population. National boundaries are relevant because individual countries usually set policies and regulations, which vary from country to country. They are also relevant for reasons having to do with government control: countries report their data about communicable disease outbreaks, the burdens of disease, and other health indicators to global institutions such as the WHO on a voluntary basis. Although International Health Regulations to which 196 countries (WHO 2014) are signatories provide an international structure for global public health, as with much international law and regulation, enforcement mechanisms are weak. The moral implications of these practical limitations for public health are profound. The structure of the problem is similar to environmental challenges such as climate change, which, as we note in 1.3, is itself increasingly being framed as a public health crisis. Some of the determinants of ill health are not restricted by national boundaries, nor can they be effectively addressed by any nation on its own.
1.1.2 What is the Health in Public Health?
Regardless of how one specifies the contours of the public – as a population, as a public, or as a more local community – a distinct set of conceptual challenges central to public health ethics concerns how to think about the nature of the health of the group and how this differs from the health of individuals.
There are significant debates about how to conceptualize health; is it the absence of disease, or does it involve more than that? Can health be defined without reference to normative concepts? Other debates concern the value of health, and whether health is good as an end, good as a means or both or neither; whether the attitudes towards a given condition of those who have it affect whether it counts as healthy or unhealthy; and a variety of other questions. (Ananth 2008; Boorse 1975; Coggon 2012; Hoffman 2010; Holland 2007; see the entry on concepts of health and disease). We will not rehearse these debates here. Even if we put these questions about the concept of health to the side, however, there are other questions that concern the nature of public health. Can the health of the public meaningfully be understood only as an aggregation of the health of each person that comprises the public, or is it something more than that? Is the health of the public something of value in its own right?
These questions are important because they have implications for particular views on the ethics of public health. Some theorists of public health treat the health of the public as something that cannot be reduced to healthy individuals – what we will call ‘anti-reductionist’ views. Anti-reductionist views often construe the public as a community or political entity rather than a population. (Coggon 2012; Jennings 2007). If one endorses anti-reductionism, then various values might seem especially central to theorizing about public health. For instance, some argue that communal values, such as solidarity, are integral to understanding the value of public health. (Dawson and Jennings 2012; Jennings and Dawson 2015). These views typically call for an extensive role for government interventions aimed at promoting public health, although this is not a conceptually necessary feature of such views.
Reductionists, by contrast, think that the health of a public is reducible to an aggregation of the health of individuals. This claim about reduction, however, need not signal an aversion to an extensive role for government in protecting or promoting public health. That is, some might deny that there is an entity, ‘the public,’ that matters morally in a way that cannot be reducible to individual interests or values but agree with anti-reductionists about policy measures. For example, it is possible that focusing on measures that reduce the incidence of disease in a population will be better at producing more value for individuals than a focus on treating or preventing disease for individuals. (Rose 1985; Rose et al. 2008) Presumably, various anti-reductionists would argue for a similar conclusion, although they would invoke other values to reach it.
A third class of views is also reductionist but calls for a more circumscribed range of public health interventions. For instance, classical liberals often argue that it is morally impermissible for government actors to intervene in ways that produce aggregate value when doing so infringes on individual liberty. More will be said about liberalism and public health in Section 3.2. Although these writers endorse a more restrictive view of the mandate of public health, some would nevertheless endorse governments producing health-related public goods, such as herd immunity (Anomaly 2011, 2012; Brennan 2018; Dees 2018; Epstein 2004; Flanigan 2014b, 2017; Horne 2019).
In the economic sense of the term, public goods are non-rivalrous, which means that one person’s enjoyment or consumption of the good does not reduce the ability of others to enjoy that good. Public goods are also non-excludable, which means it is very difficult to prevent others from enjoying the public good. (See the entry on the free-rider problem.) Paradigmatic public goods in public health include herd immunity, sanitation, and clean air. Not all the goods of public health are public goods in this sense, however.
Consider two concepts that are often invoked in debates about the justification for public health interventions- the ‘common good’ and the ‘public good.’ These terms are polysemous, and this sometimes leads to confusion. Some uses of these terms are associated with political values as, for example, when ‘the common good’ refers to values shared or pursued collectively by all members of a community. Many anti-reductionists will invoke ‘the common good,’ so understood, to justify public health interventions and policies. For instance, some argue that all members of the same community, qua members of the same community, have an interest in living in a social grouping in which all enjoy a high degree of health. Economists, by contrast, use ‘common good’ to refer to a pooled resource that is rivalrous (one person’s usage diminishes the ability of others to use it) but non-excludable (it is quite difficult to exclude others from using it). In some public health contexts, safe water, food and drugs can be understood as common goods in this sense.
1.2 Government Intervention
The second distinctive feature of public health with significant implications for public health ethics is the large role that government intervention and government power play in public health. So much of what is undertaken to advance public health requires the apparatus and power of the state to be effective. Some go as far as to claim that what makes public health ‘public’ is, at least partly, that public health is the business of the public, as contrasted with private individuals. To these theorists, the distinction between public and private health is not to be found merely in the collective rather than the individual-level focus. Instead, who or what is promoting the health of the populace is relevant (see Coggon 2012; Jennings 2007; Verweij and Dawson 2007; Dawson and Verweij 2008). For instance, in The Future of Public Health, the Institute of Medicine includes the following definition: “Public health is what we, as a society, do collectively to assure the conditions in which people can be healthy” (Institute of Medicine 1988, p. 1, emphasis added). If we assume that in a functional democracy action by the government is action by us, collectively, then we arrive at yet another way to understand the especially close connection between government action and public health. If one goes further and claims that an action is a public health action only if it is taken by the collective and that an action is performed by us, collectively, only if it is performed by government, then an intervention is a public health intervention only if a government is the relevant actor.
This conclusion will strike many in public health as unduly narrow, however. Private non-profit actors, especially charitable foundations and other non-governmental organizations (NGOs), frequently undertake measures that would be hard to characterize as anything other than public health interventions in their character and in the outcomes they secure. For instance, vaccine research and development is often supported by NGOs, and vaccines are often delivered in epidemic contexts by NGOs. Similarly, NGOs often mount health promotion campaigns and provide resources to communities to improve local public health infrastructure. It seems contrived, at best, to conclude that because NGOs operate in the private sector, their activities do not constitute efforts to advance public health. Perhaps a more natural description is that NGOs as private entities undertake interventions to directly improve public health without themselves being governmental public health entities (Coggon 2012). Of course, one could argue that NGOs lack the standing to engage in public health activities because they are not accountable to citizens and do not act in their name. This is a legitimacy-based concern that has been levied against the development interventions of large-scale philanthropies generally. (Reich 2018) The core of the concern is that these large scale NGOs have the power to set agendas and priorities in ways that sidestep or usurp what should otherwise be the prerogative of functional nation-states to determine. In other contexts, this concern may have little purchase, however. Consider, for example, when global NGOs undertake activities with the robust cooperation of or at the invitation of the state, or in failed or otherwise problematic national contexts that lack the resources or the will to protect the health of all or some of the populations that live within their borders. Also, global, pan-national organizations, most notably the World Health Organization, play a critical role in advancing public health. It would be bizarre to conclude that policies and guidance of the WHO, or interventions that WHO leads, are not public health policies or interventions because the WHO is not a state actor and does not have the enforcement or police powers of a state.
Although collective action in the form of government intervention is thus not a necessary condition of public health, government intervention is still central to public health. Achieving good public health outcomes frequently requires extensive coordination on the part of many actors. To secure coordination, incentive structures for individuals often need to be changed, and it is most often governments that have the authority to make these changes. Because of this authority, governments are especially well-suited to overcome characteristic challenges in promoting or realizing public health. Consider, for example, a paradigmatic challenge in deploying vaccines to combat infectious disease. If enough people are not willing to be vaccinated, then herd immunity is undermined. A central though contested function of government is to disincentivize going unvaccinated by implementing policies that penalize those who refuse vaccination.
This point about governments being especially well-suited to changing the incentive structure of individuals is significant for public health ethics insofar as many public health measures are coercive or are otherwise backed by the force of law. In this, as in all other areas of official state action, those concerned with the ethics of public health have to address tensions among justice, security, and the scope of legal restrictions and regulations. These tensions add to the peculiarity of the justificatory questions surrounding public health: the exercise of public authority and the imposition of public sanctions and penalties in an area as deeply personal as an individual’s health choices require strong justification. The same questions about trade-offs between personal freedom and collective benefits that arise in the political arena generally thus also arise for public health. It is in this context that concerns about the legitimacy of public health interventions and paternalism typically emerge – concerns we return to in Section 3.
1.3 Concluding Remarks
Common to both features of public health is the question of how broadly or narrowly to understand what public health entails (Powers and Faden 2006; Coggon 2012; Anomaly 2011; Dees 2018). In many national contexts, there is no sharp divide between what some consider the traditional functions of public health, such as ensuring that the water and food supply are safe, protecting the public from infectious disease, and health promotion, and the organization and financing of personal medical care services. This is especially the case when the provision or financing of personal medical care is solely or primarily a state function. In the bioethics literature, the ethics of health care policy is sometimes distinguished from the ethics of public health. As we will see in Section 2, much of the literature on justice and health has focused on medical care and the criteria that should be used to determine coverage decisions about specific personal medical care interventions that are delivered to individual patients in clinical facilities. One way to think about this is to conceptualize the ethics of health care policy as an intersecting territory between public health ethics and the ethics of clinical practice. Although we have focused in this section on two features of public health that distinguish it from clinical care, it is worth noting that there are these intersecting territories and that they have implications for public health ethics. For example, in the many contexts where government agencies have ultimate authority over what medical care services patients can receive, the ethics of coverage decisions must take account of their impact on the ethics of the doctor-patient relationship in addition to efficiency and other considerations of justice that public health allocation decisions standardly engage.
There are also intersecting territories between public health and biomedical science, again with implications for public health ethics. For example, advances in AI-assisted big data analysis, genomic database, and gene editing offer potentially unprecedented opportunities for public health to better predict and respond to health threats. (Geller et al., 2014) Questions are emerging about whether the use of these scientific advances in service of public health adds anything new or different from the ways in which the legitimacy issues discussed in Section 3 should be evaluated.
That there are overlapping territories between public health, clinical care and biomedical science is, of course, to be expected as these enterprises are all committed to advancing human health. The major challenge is to answer the question of how broadly or narrowly to understand what public health entails. Given a wide understanding of health and the factors affecting prospects for population health, public health can be viewed as being so expansive as to have no meaningful institutional, disciplinary, or social boundaries. Everything from crime, war, and natural disasters; to population genetics, environmental hazards, marketing and other corporate practices; to political oppression, income inequality, and individual behavior has been claimed under the rubric of public health. Although all of these threats to human well-being affect health, it would be hard to conceptualize public health as encompassing all of the societal resources that these threats demand for their mitigation. For example, while reducing violence is critical to population health, that does not mean that law enforcement, the criminal justice system, diplomacy and international relations should be considered tools of public health.
Whether or under what conditions it is ethically appropriate to frame or re-frame a social problem in public health terms is morally complex. For example, taking a public health rather than criminal justice orientation to gun violence or substance abuse can sometimes contribute to defusing tensions, decreasing negative impacts on racial or other minority groups, and leading to better overall outcomes (Dorfman and Wallack 2009). At the same time, however, interventions generally outside the purview of public health institutions and professionals such as early childhood education, income supports, literacy initiatives for girls, and safe housing programs all can be effective in preventing illness and injury. In some cases, such interventions may be more effective and efficient in achieving health gains than paradigmatic public health programs.
Morally responsible public health policy requires attentiveness to the multiple determinants of health. This requirement does not signal that public health has no boundaries. Rather, public health has a unique relationship of stewardship to health, and to the particular determinants that have a special strategic significance for health. Some of those determinants are the classic focus of public health, such as infectious disease control and the securing of safe food, water, and essential medications. However, exercising that stewardship requires responsiveness to the best available evidence about all the determinants, across the landscape of an interconnected social structure, that have a special strategic relation to health. These determinants often lie outside the conventional remits of public health agencies and authorities. Policies governing education, foreign assistance, agriculture, and the environment can all have a significant impact on health, just as health policies can impact international relations and national and global economies.
One worry raised by this interconnectedness across spheres of social life and policy is that classifying something as a public health matter could be an effective way of taking it out of the realm of legitimate discussion. (Anomaly 2011; Coggon 2012) If the goal of protecting public health is seen as clearly good, government actions aimed at securing health may be less scrutinized than actions aimed at more controversial ends, leaving public health officials with too much power and too little democratic accountability. As a practical matter, however, these concerns may not be realistic. Consider the recent example of climate change. Early in 2020, the American Medical Association and 23 other health and medical organizations sent a letter to the President of the United States calling climate change a public health emergency and declaring that “there is no single step that will do more for the health of all Americans than remaining in and meeting our obligations to the Paris Climate Agreement.” (Robeznieks 2020) It seems unlikely that framing climate change as a public health crisis risks taking climate policy out of the realm of legitimate discussion. Indeed, although data on this point are hard to come by, it is likely that the reverse is true: public health agencies and workers are more likely to have insufficient political power, authority, and resources at their disposal to achieve important and pressing goals than to wield too much. It is not usually individuals’ civil rights to which public health interventions stand in opposition, but rather private, corporate economic interests such as the tobacco industry, the meat and dairy industry, and so on. Nonetheless, it is worth raising these worries at least to keep them in view as a possible issue for public health ethics to address. And even if the worry that expanding the classification of something as a public health matter in some way threatens civil liberties is nothing more than fear-mongering, the breadth of what falls under public health may raise concerns about legitimacy, concerns taken up Section 3. But first, we turn to questions about justice in public health of the sort presaged in our discussion of the first distinctive characteristic of public health, its focus on the health of populations, not individuals.
2. Justice and Public Health
Many familiar debates between utilitarian and various egalitarian approaches to distributional questions play themselves out in public health. Public health professionals and policymakers are typically committed to bringing about as much health as possible with the resources available. This interpretation of the remit and responsibility of public health is understandable, and in many respects, laudable. There is no context in public health in which resources are unlimited, or even sufficient to bring about all the health that might be secured. Efficiency in the use of constrained resources, especially public resources, is clearly morally important, if not imperative. And from the perspective of some utilitarian accounts, maximizing the amount of net good, in this case, health, that can be secured is also the only just way to deploy resources. (See, for instance, the entry on justice.)
Public health professionals and policymakers are well aware, however, of concerns that the health maximizing approach to public health can often perpetuate and even exacerbate existing injustices in health and human well-being. At least since the 1990s, ethics scholars have challenged public health to look beyond efficiency to address other, generally egalitarian concerns of justice. Activists concerned about racial, gender and other social group injustices also frequently call on public health institutions to pursue health equity, particularly by reducing what are viewed as unjust health disparities.
Tensions between efficiency and egalitarian commitments arise in two stage-setting public health functions: the establishing of goals and priorities, for example, when the US Department of Health and Human Services sets goals and objectives to improve the health and well-being of people in the United States in its Healthy People Initiative, and the allocating of resources that have been budgeted to secure the goals that have been identified, for example, how to distribute the funds that are allocated to the goal of reducing cardiovascular deaths. As important as setting goals and allocating resources are, there are other questions in public health ethics that also engage considerations of justice but that are not centrally structured around tensions between efficiency and equity. These include the moral value of prevention, the moral responsibility of individuals for their health, and stigma in public health programming. Public health also affects other things that matter morally to people, like respectful treatment, personal security or personal relations. Depending on how one understands what social or structural justice entails, these other considerations may be matters of justice, or even in some cases of state legitimacy, but they are not typical of matters taken up in either literatures.
Section 2.1 begins with a review of different reasons that have been put forward for why health matters morally, and thus why health is or might be a matter of justice. Section 2.2 discusses general problems of aggregation, goal setting and resource allocation. Sections 2.3 takes on distinctive moral issues that arise due to public health’s emphasis on prevention, and sections 2.4 and 2.5 take on individual responsibility and stigma, respectively, as well as some other examples where public health’s engagement with justice goes to impacts that are not primarily health. (For instance, stigma can be conceptualized as a concern about social disrespect). Section 2.6 concludes with a brief review of global justice considerations.
2.1 The Value of Health: Why Health Matters Morally
Theories of justice relevant to public health ethics operate with accounts of the value of health that often mark key differences between them. In the case of utilitarian theorists, the value of health is often understood implicitly in terms of the contribution that health makes to utility or welfare. All health benefits are seen as contributing to welfare and all harms to health as diminishing welfare. How health benefits and harms should be conceptualized and therefore measured is a matter of debate, as is the case with the parent categories of utility and welfare, more generally. We will briefly review some of the health-specific debates in Section 2.2.
Egalitarian theories of justice, including those most relevant to public health ethics, continue to be profoundly influenced by Rawls. (See Rawls 1971, and the entry on John Rawls.) Health does not figure prominently in Rawls’ celebrated theory and is not included by him as a social primary good. (Rawls 1971, 62) Other theorists have, however, pursued what they understand to be the implications of Rawls’s theory for health policy and public health. The most sustained and notable development of Rawlsian thought comes from Norman Daniels. Daniels argues that the value of health as it matters to justice can be found in its critical connection to Rawls’ principle of “fair equality of opportunity,” which for Rawls centers on social offices and positions. Daniels maintains that health is of special importance to this principle. On this view, enjoying health up to some threshold is integral for each to have a ‘normal opportunity range,’ or the array of life plans reasonable persons are likely to develop for themselves within a particular society (Daniels 2008, p. 43). Thus, Daniels attempts to account for the moral significance of health, including public health, in terms of its connection to opportunities rather than to welfare (Daniels 1985; 2001; 2008). In other words, on this sort of view, health is a matter of justice because of its integral role in allowing us or, in the case of ill health, preventing us from pursuing what we, as a matter of justice, should be able to pursue.
In part in response to Rawls, Amartya Sen pioneered an alternative approach to justice, which has as its central focus the ability and power of individuals – their capabilities – to reach states of valuable functioning or well-being. Capability theory is concerned with the freedom of individuals to pursue these states; the justice of social systems is to be judged by the extent to which this freedom to be and do is promoted for all, a distinctly egalitarian commitment. (See the entry on the capability approach.) The most prominent capability approach to justice, and one with direct relevance to public health, is that of Martha Nussbaum. Nussbaum identifies ten central human capabilities that a just society should make available to its citizens. Bodily health is included within the ten, as is life, which she defines as “being able to live to the end of a human life of normal length; not dying prematurely, or before one’s life is so reduced as to be not worth living” (Nussbaum 2006, 76). Health is understood as necessary or partly constitutive of human dignity or a flourishing human life. For Nussbaum and other capability theorists, the capability for health is thus of direct importance to justice, and not as it is for Daniels, for whom health is of strategic importance to fair opportunity.
Powers and Faden have developed a different theory of structural justice that, like Nussbaum’s capability theory, also sees health as a direct matter of justice. However, while Nussbaum focuses on health capabilities, Powers and Faden focus on health itself. Their theory is anchored in an account of human well-being in which health is one of six core elements. Each element is defended because it is characteristically present in a decent human life and because it requires an appropriate social structure for its secure realization and cannot be experienced by individuals relying solely on their own efforts. Powers’ and Faden’s egalitarian commitments are evidenced in their view that structural justice entails ensuring that all individuals, globally, experience these six well-being elements and the human rights that are grounded in them, commensurate with a decent human life. They are also reflected in the theory’s focal concern with unfair relations of power and advantage as well as with human rights and with the intimate relationship between unfairness, well-being and human rights. (Powers and Faden 2019) Much of their theory is taken up with interconnections between these moving parts of structural injustice. Their view that a deprivation in one core element of well-being like health is likely both a cause and a consequence of deprivations in other elements of well-being has direct implications for public health policy. So, too, does their view that unfair patterns of disadvantage and unfair power relations are a powerful driver of deprivations and human rights violations, which in turn usher in and exacerbate these forms of structural unfairness.
Each of these different ways of explicating why health is a matter of justice – because health contributes to overall utility or welfare, because of its strategic importance to fair opportunity, because it is a central human capability, or because health is a core element of human well-being – provide reasons why national and global policy-setting structures should place a priority on health. Each provides justifications, some overlapping and some distinctive, for extensive collective investment in public health services and practices. They also have different implications for public health policy. For example, arguments from fair opportunity underscore the importance of, and arguably prioritize, interventions that will protect or restore aspects of health that relate to normal opportunity ranges and societal prospects. Theories that focus on capabilities for health and those that focus on securing health may have different implications for how public health institutions should set targets and priorities, and certainly for how health policies should be evaluated. And theories that advocate for the interconnectedness of health with other valued human states suggest a wider range of relevant outcomes for public health and public health ethics than theories that focus only on health. And each is open, in one way or another, to the familiar criticisms of utilitarian, Rawlsian, capability and well-being theories.
Yet another approach to articulating the value of health, and thus of public health, is found in the health and human rights literature (see Mann et al. 1994; Mann 1996; Beyrer et al. 2007; Beyrer and Pizer 2007; Tasioulas and Vayena 2015a; Tasioulas and Vayena 2015b; Gostin and Friedman 2013). In the early 1990s, Jonathan Mann pioneered an approach to public health that explicitly framed health as a human rights issue, and human rights violations as public health issues. Subsequent work in the health and human rights tradition has been dominated by scholars and advocates in health law and public health practice, with strong links to activist and humanitarian organizations. (Gostin 2008, 2010) As a general matter, the health and human rights tradition relies on international declarations of human rights and human rights law as its foundation and does not probe the philosophical underpinnings of human rights or their connection to theories of justice. This is not because philosophical accounts of human rights are not congenial to the inclusion of health as a basic human right, however. Quite the opposite. Multiple rival candidates for the justification of human rights, from interest-based theories (Powers and Faden 2019; Raz 1988; Griffin 2008; Beitz 2015) to control-based theories (Darwall 2006; Hart 1982) to dignity-based theories (Kamm 2007; Tasioulas 2015), can be interpreted to support the inclusion of health as a human right. (See the entry on human rights.) Regardless of one’s explanation of the grounds of human rights, by claiming that individuals have a human right to health, health is made a matter of justice, since each individual has an entitlement to health. Moreover, framing health as a human right is appealing in the context of discussions of public health ethics because this framing provides a basis for making states, as the first guarantors of human rights, responsible for promoting and protecting the health of individuals residing within their jurisdictions. However, just as approaching the value of health from the standpoint of different theories of justice is open to the general criticisms associated with each theory, so accounting for health in terms of human rights is open to the broad challenges that apply to accounts of human rights more generally (Buchanan 2012; Sreenivasan 2012)
2.2 Aggregation, Goal Setting and Resource Allocation
As we noted in Section 1.1, a defining characteristic of public health is that it is committed to advancing health at the level of populations. Public health relies on aggregated measures of health to identify health deficits, set health policy priorities, assess the impact of interventions, and allocate resources. It is this reliance on aggregation that sets the stage for numerous questions of justice in public health, including perhaps most prominently tensions between egalitarian approaches to justice and efficiency-oriented utilitarian approaches.
2.2.1 Justice and Natural Units Measures of Population Health
Although many challenges in aggregation taken up in the justice and public health literature relate to or are compounded by the way summary measures of health are constructed and deployed, even the simplest of health measures, once aggregated, raise justice concerns. Traditionally in public health, and still today, health outcomes are often measured in what are sometimes called natural units; examples include life expectancy, mortality, five-year survival, and immunization rates. These natural units are typically expressed in terms of averages, as in average life expectancy of American men, although sometimes medians or other ways of presenting the data are used. The problem is that, aggregated over a population, any of these natural measures can obscure differences within the population that are morally relevant. To continue with the example of average life expectancy of American men, focusing only on that measure obscures differences between white men and men of color, rural and urban men, and poorly and well-educated men that many view as mattering morally, and as potential injustices. Reliance on average summary measures of things like income or education can also have implications for public health ethics. To take a classic example, averaged national income data have been used as the basis for determining which countries are eligible for international philanthropic assistance in accessing lifesaving vaccines. Because this approach resulted in the withholding of global vaccine aid from middle-income countries, it was criticized as perpetuating injustices. In middle-income countries with large income inequalities, average income data obscured truly disadvantaged sub-populations who were not likely to receive the vaccine without global assistance. (Shebaya, Sutherland, Levine, and Faden 2010) One job of public health ethics is to stay attuned to the risk that averaged outcome measures and statistics can mask differences between subgroups within a population that point to unjust inequalities in need of redress.
At the same time, whether or how much group differences in aggregated natural measures of health matter morally is not necessarily obvious and may depend on the account of justice under consideration. Any sub-group difference in a natural measure of health suggests that it may be possible to secure more health for more people than is currently the case, a goal underscored by the public health’s utilitarian commitments. However, whether any group difference is also unjust from an egalitarian perspective cannot be read off of the existence or even the size of a between-group disparity. Theories of justice, or more directly accounts of injustice, are needed to fill in the gap between observing an inequality in health between groups and deciding whether or how egregiously the inequality constitutes an injustice. (Powers and Faden 2006, pp. 95–99)
2.2.2 Justice and Summary Measures of Population Health
From the standpoint of public health policymaking, there are several other problems with natural measures of population health, like life expectancy or infant survival rates. These measures cannot provide a summary picture of the overall state of health or burden of ill health of a population, nor do they allow for comparison of the value or impact of alternative investments in different health priorities. The latter is a particular problem for allocating health budgets and setting priorities for funding. Although classic cost-benefit analysis provides a solution that admits of comparisons across diverse health areas and outcomes, reducing all the benefits and risks at issue in public health to their monetary value is widely viewed as unsatisfactory. In response, a series of summary measures of population health have been developed that seek to reduce into one fungible metric both life expectancy and considerations of impact of disease and of medical interventions on function and disability. Operating out of the preference-satisfaction tradition, well-known summary metrics include Quality Adjusted Life Years (QALYs), Disability-Adjusted Life Years (DALYs), Disability-Adjusted Life Expectancy (DALE) and Healthy Life Year (HeaLY). Summary measures have been subject to extensive ethics critique. (See the entry on disability and health care rationing.) Some of these criticisms reflect difficulties with conceptualizing and operationalizing utility accounts of welfare. For example, these measures sometimes rely on assessments of what may be only vague individual preferences for trade-offs between different states of health or different kinds of benefits, or trade-offs made by samples of persons that are viewed as too narrow. These summary measures have also been critiqued to the extent that they rely on average trade-off assessments that may mask wide disagreement about the disvalue of a compromised health state.
Other criticisms focus on different, egalitarian-oriented justice concerns about morally contentious assumptions embedded in the measures, including whether to differentially value years saved in different stages of life and how to disvalue specific disabilities. Depending on how these and other assumptions are determined and specified, summary health measures have been criticized as being ageist or not ageist enough, as discriminating unfairly against people with disabilities, as failing to capture the moral uniqueness of lifesaving, and as treating as commensurable qualitatively different losses and benefits. (Brock 2002, 2006; Daniels 2008; Kappel and Sandoe 1992; Nord 2005; Powers and Faden 2006; Ubel 1999; Williams 2001; Whitehead and Ali 2010; Soares 2012; Pettit et al. 2016; Schroeder 2017).
A particularly influential deployment of the DALY summary measure of population health is the Burden of Disease Project. Supported by the World Health Organization, national burden of disease studies are conducted in many nations and are widely relied on to help characterize the state of ill health globally as well as within countries. Ethical concerns about DALYs and global disease studies, often discussed in the public health literature under the heading of social issues, include whether DALYs should be age-weighted or time-discounted. Because the results of global burden of disease studies can be influential in the setting of health priorities, they illustrate well the importance of the ethics of summary measures in public health practice.
2.2.3 Efficiency vs. Equity
Much of the literature in public health ethics that has addressed summary measures has looked at their role in cost-utility analysis. In cost-utility analysis, a summary measure is used to identify how to secure the most health for the resources available. The goal is to establish comparative value for money, with an eye to ensuring efficiency in resource allocation. In addition to ethical concerns about the construction of summary measures and the assumptions on which they are built, cost-utility analysis raises additional concerns of justice because it, like cost-benefit analysis and utilitarian theorizing more generally, is indifferent to questions of distribution. As a contingent matter, it is often the case that public health interventions that are good value-for-money advance the health of disadvantaged groups relative to their powerful counterparts. This is because a little money can often go a long way towards improving the health of those who have relatively little and whose health prospects are bleak. Consider, for example, investing in childhood immunizations and vitamin supplementation in low- and middle-income countries. That said, the worry remains that when public health policy rests on cost-utility analyses, the resultant priorities or allocations may entail injustices of various sorts. For example, policymaking that is mainly or largely driven by cost-utility findings may perpetuate or even exacerbate existing unjust health disparities when health gains are more efficiently secured for those who are better off or fail to treat fairly the needs of persons with rare diseases, diseases with poor outcomes, and diseases that are very expensive to prevent or treat.
In large part in response to these difficulties with cost-benefit analysis and treating maximization as the relevant principle, scholars in public health ethics have defended alternative principles of distribution. These principles mirror familiar debates in the literature on distributive justice. Although some theorists argue for some form of equality in the distribution of health-related resources (Marmot 2005; Wilkinson 2005), including equality of opportunities (Daniels 2004, 2008), much of the literature is taken up with debates between prioritarianism and sufficientarianism. Defenders of prioritarianism claim that while the overall goal of distribution should be the promotion of the health of the population, extra weighting or priority should be placed on the distributing resources in ways that promote the health needs of those who are worst-off (Parfit 1997; Ottersen et al. 2008; Ottersen, Mæstad, and Norheim, 2014). How to conceptualize who the worst-off are for purposes of public health policymaking remains contested territory. By contrast, those defending sufficientarianism maintain that a preferable distributional principle for health resources is helping to ensure that all persons experience or can achieve a certain threshold of health or health capabilities (see Nussbaum 2006; Powers and Faden 2006; Fourie and Rid 2017). On this view, a world in which everyone reaches a threshold for health capabilities or health states is more just than a world in which average population health exceeds that threshold but some subgroups do not reach it. A challenge here is conceptualizing and then operationalizing how much health or health capability counts as sufficient.
The challenges posed by the efficiency vs. equity tension in public health cannot be overstated (Daniels 2019). For example, in the United States, infant mortality rates are higher than in many other wealthy nations, and they are higher still among poor and minority children. Some state public health authorities have made reducing racial disparities in infant mortality a top priority, accepting the view that redressing this unjust inequality is an urgent moral concern. Other states have chosen the goal of improving infant survival statistics overall, on the grounds that the same resources will produce greater aggregate health outcomes while at the same time pointing to the special place that all children should hold in public health policy (HRSA 2014 in Other Internet Resources). It is not clear that theorizing about just distribution in health does or could provide definitive guidance as to which policy is more just.
Equity and efficiency frequently sit side by side in public health policymaking. Countries often explicitly include a range of diverse health equity objectives in national public health goals (Krubiner and Faden 2017). Several approaches have been put forward to assist policymakers who do not want to lose sight of these objectives as they also aim to be efficient in the use of the limited resources available for population health. One major concern is that cost-utility and cost-effectiveness can have an outsized influence on policymaking because the quantitative character of their results convey a kind of pseudo-scientific certainty or otherwise seem to provide an evidence-based grounding for what policymakers should do. To combat this concern, which of course is a risk in policymaking generally, some have argued the importance of treating CEA and CUA findings only as aids to decision-making that policymakers should take into account, but always in concert with other sources of relevant information, including explicit ethics analysis.
Several ethics frameworks directed at assisting policymakers in taking this broader perspective attempt to incorporate both value-for-money and other justice-based commitments in one guidance document (see Ottersen et al. 2014). Relatedly, there is increasing interest in multi-criteria decision analysis (MCDA) in public health, a formalized methodology in the operations research tradition that allows for systematic attention to a range of considerations inclusive of both efficiency and equity criteria. There is also continuing interest in incorporating equity- based concerns directly into formal economic methods, sometimes referred to as cost-value analysis. (Distefano and Levin 2019) Each of these different strategies to blunting the influence of cost-utility analysis in the service of more just policymaking is subject to different criticisms. For example, strategies that emphasize underscoring to policymakers that they broaden their scope of relevant inputs, including with the aid of purpose-built ethics frameworks, are challenged for failing to appreciate how numbers-oriented policymaking actually is. Conversely, strategies that incorporate empiricized versions of ethical considerations into economic methods and some quantitative MCDA approaches are open to critiques about making commensurable that which is not, and also obscuring from political and public view what is morally at stake, including where there are moral disagreements that bear on the policy decision.
2.2.4 Absolute Scarcity
As we have already noted, financial resources are always limited in public health. There is never enough money in the public health sector to pursue all the policies and practices that could advance population health. Although arguably a redistribution of resources among competing public sectors, for example from a country’s defense budget to its health budget, may be ethically warranted and could relieve some of the more pressing constraints, tough priority setting and allocation decisions are a constant feature of policymaking in public health and are likely ineliminable. There are also occasions in public health, however, when money is not the primary constraint and questions of just distribution can take on somewhat different features. Sometimes referred to as cases of absolute scarcity or of extreme rationing, an urgently needed intervention is in short supply, and the supply problem cannot be fixed in real-time simply by allocating more money to the problem. A classic example is countermeasures for epidemic diseases, where production of the countermeasure, typically a vaccine, lags behind the need. In these cases, standard debates between efficiency and various alternative distributive principles can take on new twists or are augmented by appeals to somewhat different principles. For example, when epidemic vaccines are in short supply many judge that health professionals and other first responders should enjoy high priority for receiving a vaccine. The rationale for this position appeals to a mix of utilitarian and non-utilitarian reasons. Some see the relevant distributive principle to be a combination of contribution and reciprocity; because these people are putting themselves at increased risk of acquiring the infection, literally putting their lives on the line for others, first responders are entitled to special consideration in access to preventive interventions. At the same time, the argument is also made that the public health system needs these experts to be both willing and able to perform their duties and thus that it is important to use guaranteed access to a scarce vaccine to both incentivize first responders to work on the public’s behalf and to keep them healthy.
Many cases of absolute scarcity lie at the intersection of public health and clinical ethics and, depending on the national health system, maybe more or less under public health authorities to resolve. These include the deployment of antivirals and ICU beds during an influenza pandemic but also the allocation of solid organs or of cancer drugs that are in short supply because of production challenges (Unguru et al. 2014). Consider the case of solid organs. Simple notions of fairness might suggest that scarce life-saving organs be distributed randomly among a pool of those in need or on a first-come, first-served basis (Arras 2005; Broome 1984; Silverman and Chalmers 2001). However, if, for example, either of these principles resulted in an 85-year-old being selected over a ten-year-old, objections could be mounted from a utilitarian, QALY or DALY perspective. Objections could also be mounted from what is sometimes called the “fair innings” perspective in which a priority is placed on ensuring that people survive to experience the later stages of life before anyone who has already experienced those stages is assisted. Competing concepts of fair chances and just outcomes have dominated this literature, and complex national systems have developed to allocate solid organs that generally rely on a mix of distributive principles. The Complete Lives System is one attempt to integrate several principles in one general strategy for allocating scarce resources (Persad, Wertheimer, and Emanuel 2009), while other integrated, multi-principle strategies have been proposed for the allocation of particular kinds of scarce resources like ventilators in the context of pandemic influenza (Daugherty Biddison et al. 2018).
2.2.5 Distribution of Health Burdens
Thus far, we have focused on questions of justice in priority setting and allocation of resources intended to improve health. The interventions the resources support often carry with them harms or risks, but these generally fall on the persons and groups who benefit from them. However, there are also contexts in public health where the benefits and harms do not fall on the same groups, raising somewhat different questions of justice. One example is Japan’s seasonal influenza immunization policy between 1962 and 1994, where children were immunized against influenza explicitly in order to protect the elderly, for whom contracting seasonal flu is more likely to be fatal, and immunization more likely to be burdensome (Reichert et al. 2001; Sugaya 2014). Another example of public health interventions that appear to be guided by this reasoning is rubella vaccination. Rubella is a disease that causes only mild illness except if contracted by pregnant women, where rubella can result in miscarriage or serious birth defects. In many countries in the world, children are routinely immunized for the sake of pregnant women and their fetuses (Miller et al. 1997; ACIP 2010 in Other Internet Resources). The question raised here is whether it is ethically acceptable for some groups within the population to be asked or required to take on risks, even minimal ones, in order to assist other groups in the population who cannot be directly protected. One argument appeals to reciprocity. In the case of rubella immunization, the children vaccinated today were spared the risks of in utero exposure to rubella because children before them were similarly vaccinated. (Of course, this rationale does not apply to the very first cohort of children who received the rubella vaccine.) Another argument is that the imposition of risk on some in order to protect the health of others is justified in order to make the overall distribution of disease burden in the population more equitable. This more general argument can explain why individuals are sometimes asked to bear public health burdens that do not directly benefit them. However, as with the case of taxes, the question of how far we can go in redistributing health-related burdens will likely continue to plague any proponent of this justificatory strategy. Moreover, questions about the plausibility of viewing health-related burdens as subject to distribution in this manner may also arise.
2.3 Public Health, Prevention, and Justice
A distinct set of questions of justice arises because promoting public health involves a significant commitment to the prevention of disease and injury. This commitment to prevention is often seen as a defining feature of public health institutions, even though public health agencies and services also engage in diagnosing and treating illnesses, with all the attendant clinical services that those activities require. Indeed, national health systems are increasingly understood to include both preventive functions and the delivery of personal medical services. Often these functions and services are integrated under a common political or administrative structure. Depending on the specific context in which population health is to be promoted, separating population health services and functions from personal medical care services and functions may or may not make sense. That said, policies and programs whose aim is to prevent illness and injury are paradigmatically the territory of public health. Certainly, no other social institution is recognized as so clearly having this remit.
Perhaps the foundational moral question at issue in public health’s commitment to prevention is whether preventing disease and injury is more important, as important or less important than treating disease and injury. If prevention and treatment are morally equivalent, such that preventing heart disease in one person is the moral equivalent of treating heart disease in one person, then because it is generally cheaper to prevent disease than to treat it, prevention would, at least from an ethics standpoint, have a leg up in utilitarian accounts of what justice in public health requires. However, in practice, investments in treatment more often than not swamp investments in prevention. We have already noted the ethically complicated convention in economic analyses of discounting health benefits and costs accrued in the future relative to current health benefits and costs, paralleling the convention of discounting future financial costs and benefits. But it is not only in economic analyses that this bias exists. Although in recent years there is arguably more emphasis on prevention in health policy, preventive public health interventions continue to receive less funding and public support than medical treatments. For example, despite the increasing focus on wellness in public policy and the workplace, both policymakers and the public still tend to place a higher priority on ensuring that heart patients have access to surgery and medications than on programs to prevent heart disease through diet and exercise. Is this privileging of treatment morally justified?
Answers to this question typically appeal to several related and sometimes conceptually unclear distinctions that are thought to be morally relevant. These include the aforementioned distinction between future and current costs and benefits, the distinction between identified and unidentified or statistical lives, and the distinction between currently existing and future persons. The impact of preventive interventions is more likely to be experienced in the future, while the impact of treatment interventions is typically experienced in the near term. Whether people should disvalue future benefits to themselves, relative to current benefits, is not clear. Because current beneficiaries are often identifiable and future beneficiaries typically are not, the differential valuing by temporality is often associated with the distinction between identified and statistical persons. The identified victim effect is the term given to the widely observed psychological phenomenon in which people have a greater inclination to assist (and avoid harming) persons and groups who are known by name or are otherwise identifiable than to assist (and avoid harming) persons and groups who will suffer (or already suffer) similar harm but are not (as yet) identifiable to them in any socially meaningful way. These unidentified persons are thus “merely” statistics or statistical lives (pp.1–2; Eyal et al. 2015; Jenni and Lowenstein 1997; Jonsen 1986; McKie and Richardson 2003; Small 2015).
The identified victim effect has clear implications for prevention vs. treatment. Although resources for both treatment and prevention are both generally allocated at the aggregate, population level, treatment interventions are typically delivered to identifiable patients whose experience of benefit will be witnessed by others, including the health professionals who care for them. By contrast, while prevention interventions may be delivered to identifiable people, as in immunization campaigns, they need not be. Consider, for example, interventions like cigarette taxes that reduce tobacco consumption among large numbers of faceless and nameless people. Moreover, even when the people receiving the prevention intervention are identifiable, as in vaccine campaigns, the identities of the sub-set of people who will benefit from the intervention remain unknowable; they are statistical persons.
Diverse moral defenses have been put forward for prioritizing the well-being of identified persons over statistical persons (Hare 2015; Slote 2015; Verweij 2015), and for the closely connected “rule of rescue,” a claim that there is a moral imperative to prioritize helping those currently in dire need. These defenses include the moral relevance of saving people from imminent death or disability, relieving suffering, and the role responsibilities of clinicians. A distinctive consequentialist argument is also made that the welfare of all is enhanced when everyone knows that societal resources will be expended to rescue them if they are ever so imperiled (McKie and Richardson 2003).
Those who find the identified victim effect ethically as well as psychologically compelling and who support the rule of rescue generally defend the view that public health policy decisions about allocation and priority setting should build in a bias in favor of treatment. Others, on the other hand, maintain that we should reject the rule of rescue and should not prioritize or assign greater value to identified than to statistical persons (Brock and Wikler, 2006, 2009; Hope 2001, 2004; Otsuka 2015). For instance, some argue that the considerations that appear to count in favor of prioritizing identified persons reduce to other moral considerations that apply equally to statistical persons – so prioritizing identified persons is, all else equal, unjustified (Brock 2015; Eyal 2015; Jecker 2013). If this is correct, then the identified victim effect should be overlooked when allocating resources or setting priorities. If anything, we should worry that to prioritize the health of identified, current persons over statistical, future persons fails to treat the latter as moral equals (Jecker 2013, 2015).
So far, we have restricted our discussion to already existing persons. Whether the benefits accrue in the present or the future, and to identified or statistical persons, the beneficiaries all currently exist. A further complication arises when we consider preventive measures that primarily benefit future persons (Parfit 1987; see also the entry on the non-identity problem). For instance, the eradication of polio or smallpox provides little benefit to those who have already acquired immunity (either due to vaccination or contracting the disease). The primary beneficiaries of these disease eradication programs are both vulnerable existing persons and future persons who will be born into a world without these diseases. Indeed, arguments in favor of eradication efforts often appeal to the interests of future persons and intergenerational justice (Emerson 2010; 2014). Here, familiar questions re-emerge. Should we prioritize currently existing (identified or statistical) persons over future persons? If so, there are difficult additional questions about how much more weight existing persons should receive.
A somewhat different set of issues emerge when public health efforts that aim to benefit the future require the participation of those who are currently suffering from unjust unmet health needs. When, for example, individuals and groups in lower and middle-income countries argue that there are more urgent health priorities than eliminating various diseases, is this just a variant of the failure to properly prioritize resources to reduce unjust health inequalities, or is there something distinctive about the resource allocation going to benefit future persons or about the involvement of the currently disadvantaged in the intervention designed to benefit future persons? (Rubincam and Naysmith 2009)
Some but not all of the issues we have thus far reviewed are addressed in an influential analysis of questions of justice, prevention and public health by Geoffrey Rose (1985; Rose et al. 2008). Rose’s analysis focuses on the complex relationship between two by now familiar distinctions (prevention vs. cure or treatment and identifiable vs. statistical beneficiaries), the amount of benefit an intervention confers, and on whom, and the cost of the intervention. Ross also examines two different approaches to prevention – the “high-risk strategy” and the “population approach.” The high-risk strategy involves identifying particular individuals at heightened risk for some condition, such as heart attacks or strokes, and then intervening with various preventive therapies such as statins to lower cholesterol. The population approach involves implementing prevention interventions that affect an entire population, and not just individuals identified as high risk. Consider soda taxes or regulations restricting the use of trans fats in processed foods. Rose articulates what he calls the ‘prevention paradox’: when compared to high-risk strategy interventions, population-wide interventions often afford relatively small benefits to each individual. However, although these interventions only slightly decrease each individual’s risk, aggregating this small benefit for each member of a very large population adds up to a very large benefit to population health that is sometimes larger and more efficiently secured than with an alternative, high-risk strategy (Rose 1985, 1993; Rose et al. 2008). The extent to which we should prioritize the population approach will depend on how one answers the questions discussed in this section – about statistical versus identified lives, the rule of rescue, and the standing of future persons.
2.4 The Relevance, Or Not, of Individual Responsibility
As we have already noted, not all issues of justice in public health are captured by challenges in the setting of priorities or the allocation of resources. One persistent issue concerns the extent to which individuals should be held responsible for their health. For instance, various luck egalitarians argue that people should be compensated for brute luck or various factors outside of their control but should not be compensated for the choices within their control (Albertsen 2015; see also the entry on justice and bad luck). One apparent implication of (unsophisticated) forms of luck egalitarianism, then, is that individuals are not entitled to the resources needed to prevent or treat ill health that is the result of their own behavior. Instead, when the bad health of some or all of the public is due to an aggregation of self-harming and irresponsible choices, it could be argued that any related public health efforts are better understood as a matter of beneficence rather than justice, and that justice does not require public health attend to various health conditions caused by irresponsible choice. Of course, many luck egalitarians argue that their view does not yield this implication (see Albertsen 2015; Knight 2015; Segall 2010). Nonetheless, this objection to unsophisticated forms of luck egalitarianism is informative, insofar as it reflects a general tension between notions of individual responsibility and the appropriate role of public health.
Framing public health interventions as a matter of beneficence and not justice is but one response to self-imposed risks to health. Some go further and argue that because individuals who engage in self-harming behavior impose costs on the rest of us, as a matter of justice, the individuals who make such choices ought to have to pay to offset these extra costs. The kinds of costs of concern include imposing burdens on public health resources that distract from other, more worthy health needs, draining emergency medical services, and increasing medical care costs and health insurance premiums. Cigarette smoking is one arena where this debate has played itself out. It has been argued, for example, that smokers should pay for the costs they impose on others through taxes on cigarettes pegged to defray these costs. Another twist on the justice-implications of self-imposed risks focuses on restrictions that can be imposed on risk-takers. For example, some proponents of motorcycle helmet laws note that cyclists who ride without a helmet are more likely to have a serious injury that requires the immediate attention of emergency medical personnel and, as a consequence, these experts are not free to provide care to other more prudent patients who are also acutely ill (Bayer and Jones 2007). On this view, mandatory helmet laws, as well as cigarette taxes, are a matter of justice insofar as these policies are aimed at preventing or offsetting the costs imposed on the rest of us by those who take discretionary risks with their health.
Many, however, object to these lines of argument. Some grant that individuals are responsible for their risky health decisions but deny that this licenses the conclusion that justice requires the sorts of policies just described. These critics articulate alternative ways for people to bear the costs of their decisions, including, for example, allowing people who engage in risky behaviors to self-insure in some way (Flanigan 2014b). A different line of argument, specific to the financing of health care services, is that the whole purpose of community or public support of medical care through health insurance schemes or government health care programs is to spread the costs of health care across the population. These costs should include those that flow from the full range of negative externalities, including those that have their source in what some consider irresponsible, risky behaviors. One way of putting this point is that the entitlement to medical care includes medical costs that are incurred by engaging in all kinds of behavior, such as working very long hours (Wikler 1987, 2002). Once the myriad ways in which we impose costs on one another is recognized, this line of argument continues, the focus on certain behaviors is undermotivated or even discriminatory. Indeed, if we look at various behaviors that are often condemned as irresponsible health decisions in public health policymaking, they are often behaviors associated with disadvantaged or marginalized groups (Wikler 1987, 2002). For instance, the sugary beverage tax in New York applied to soda but not to more expensive but very sugary beverages, such as frappuccinos.
A different concern with arguments that aim to hold individuals responsible for unhealthy choices focuses on the concept of ‘responsibility’ at play, and whether attributions of responsibility are fitting. (Dworkin 1981) Whether, to what extent, and in what sense individuals are responsible for risky behaviors is contested at every turn, in part because of both conceptual and empirical debates about notions like addiction and voluntariness. For years, scientists and humanists have argued over the concept of addiction, and how that concept should play into our views about behaviors like smoking, drinking and the use of drugs. Also thrown into the mix are contested views about the impact on the public of the full force of marketing tools available to industries who peddle unhealthy products, and the related imbalance in power and influence between these industries and the public health institutions that try to level the information and influence playing fields.
But perhaps most fundamental is the mounting epidemiological evidence that unhealthy behaviors are frequently disproportionately represented in disadvantaged subgroups of the population. There are many structural explanations why, for example, poor people are more likely than those who are better off to eat poorly, smoke more, exercise less and become dependent on drugs and alcohol. As we have already noted, many theorists and activists in public health place a priority, grounded in accounts of the demands of justice, on reducing disparities in health between groups that differ in social and economic advantage and power (Powers and Faden 2006; Venkatapuram 2019). Indeed, many claim that a central mission of public health is to correct for unjust health inequalities (Powers and Faden 2006). When the root causes of certain unhealthy behaviors are background injustices, responding by imposing additional costs on individuals in those unjust circumstances is perverse and at odds with this central mission. (Buchanan 2019, Resnik, 2013; Arno et al., 1996; Hoffman and Tan, 2015; Nestle and Bittman, 2015; Pomeranz, 2012.) From this perspective, to penalize individuals who make unhealthy choices due to injustice is to add insult to injury and constitutes victim-blaming.
As this discussion suggests, much of the work addressing public health takes as its starting point that health-related burdens are often caused by injustices, a point that Margaret-Chen, then director-general of the WHO, captured well with the following remark: “The social conditions in which people are born, live, and work are the single most important determinant of good health or ill health, of a long and productive life, or a short and miserable one.” (2008). Inequalities in health frequently exist between socially dominant and socially disadvantaged groups, and they frequently occur in conjunction with other injustices and compound them (Wolff and de-Shalit 2007; Powers and Faden 2006). In many contexts, poverty co-travels with the systematic disadvantage associated with racism, sexism, and other forms of denigrated group membership. However, even when it does not, the dramatic differential in material resources, social influence, and social status that is the hallmark of severe poverty brings with it systematic patterns of disadvantage that are extremely difficult, if not impossible, to escape. Even when these patterns are lessened, the life prospects of persons living in severe poverty or in dominated groups often continue to be far below that of others. In light of the connection between other forms of injustice and public health inequalities, in particular, some argue that a critical moral function of public health is to vigilantly monitor the health of systematically disadvantaged groups and intervene to reduce the inequalities so-identified as aggressively as possible. Keeping obligations to such groups at the forefront of public health thinking can result in significant changes in public health policy.
The final difficulties for trying to formulate policy that compensates people for bad luck but not for irresponsible decisions are epistemic and practical. Even if one grants that there are cases where individuals should be held responsible for engaging in unhealthy behaviors by holding them to book for the costs of their behavior or denying them certain interventions, the fact that many health conditions are multi-factorial in their causal origins poses significant epistemic challenges for formulating responsive public policies. Take lung cancer, for example. There are many people who smoke who do not develop lung cancer and many who have never smoked that do. It is daunting to envision determining for an individual person, let alone groups of people, what causal role risky behavior played in their becoming ill. Moreover, even if this epistemic difficulty could be resolved, it remains the case that public health policy, like all public policy, is a blunt instrument. We should worry that public health policies that try to ensure that individuals pay for their own irresponsible choices will often fail to penalize irresponsible behavior, or, more worrisomely, penalize individuals who should not be held responsible for their ill health.
2.5 Justice and Stigma
As we noted in sections 2.3 and 2.4, not all issues of justice in public health are captured by challenges in the setting of priorities or the allocation of resources. What to do about individual responsibility is one such issue; another is whether some public health interventions unfairly stigmatize certain groups. There are lots of ways to think about stigmatization, but at its core to stigmatize is to deem some characteristic or behavior of others as falling short of communal norms of desirability (see Courtwright 2011; Bayer 2008; Burris 2008; Link and Hatzenbuehler, Phelan, and Link 2013). Typically, stigmatization has a distinctive set of negative consequences, especially loss of social status and social isolation. Many claim that to stigmatize someone is morally wrong because of the harms stigmatization causes. Depending on your account of justice, stigmatization can also be unjust, particularly when the stigmatizing actor is the state or some other powerful institutions or agents. Stigmatizing by powerful actors can reinforce structural patterns of disadvantage and unfair power relations, and it can also fail to treat members of stigmatized groups as moral equals (Powers and Faden 2019, 35–36).
Concerns about stigmatization in public health can emerge in a range of public health policies, including when some groups are identified as “at increased risk” for diseases that have socially contentious associations and are themselves stigmatizing. For example, although itself unfair, in some contexts, people with mental illness and AIDs continue to be shunned and worse. Being labeled as at increased risk for these illnesses carries with it the potential for stigmatizing effects. Questions about targeting public health interventions become all the more complex when the stigmatizing effects would be borne by already disadvantaged groups. On the one hand, tailoring a public health program to those who are poor or members of disadvantaged gender or racial groups can sometimes serve equity concerns and be efficient if, for example, the health problem the intervention targets occurs disproportionately in these groups. On the other hand, however, if the health problem is itself associated with stigma or shame, targeting these already disadvantaged groups may reinforce existing invidious stereotypes, thereby undermining other critical concerns of justice, such as equality of social respect (Powers and Faden 2008). Thus, in cases where interventions will incidentally stigmatize already disadvantaged groups, public health authorities face a different kind of efficiency vs. equity challenge from those already mentioned. They may need to decide whether a commitment to justice requires foregoing a more efficient, targeted program in favor of a relatively inefficient, universal program that may produce not only less improvement in health for the population as a whole but also less improvement in health for the disadvantaged groups (thus failing to narrow unjust inequalities) in order to avoid exacerbating existing disrespectful social attitudes (Faden, Kass, and Powers 1991).
Another context in which stigma concerns emerge is in public health education campaigns. The methodology for these campaigns often entails not only informing the public about the health risks or benefits of particular behaviors but also changing public attitudes in ways that dispose the public to feel more negatively about those who engage or fail to engage in them. One way of interpreting what is going on is that an aim of the public health campaign is to shift public values towards the stigmatizing of unhealthy behaviors or ways of life. Some contributors to the public health ethics literature endorse measures that are intended to stigmatize certain unhealthy conduct such as condomless sex, smoking, or various unhealthy eating habits (Courtwright 2011; Kim and Shanahan 2003; Brown-Johnson and Prochaska 2015) or even certain conditions, such as obesity (Callahan 2013). The argument in defense of public health implementing interventions that intentionally stigmatize turns on several assumptions, including that the public health problem of concern (e.g. obesity) constitutes an injustice and that intentional stigmatization will be very if not uniquely effective in reducing the problem and its associated unjust effects.
Unsurprisingly, this sort of argument is extremely controversial and has led to heated debates. Some object on empirical grounds; for example, that there is insufficient evidence that intentional stigmatization is effective at reducing the prevalence of health problems (Goldberg and Puhl 2013) or that there is some evidence to suggest that stigmatization can actually increase the prevalence of a concerning behavior (Goldberg and Puhl 2013; Burris 2008.). Still others object because of the psychological or social harm that is caused to individuals who have the relevant condition or engage in the concerning behavior (Burris 2008; Goldberg and Puhl 2013) or that any use of stigmatization is dehumanizing and morally unacceptable for that reason (Burris 2008). A related objection is that stigmatization is reductive; it treats someone as nothing more than a particular ‘spoiled social identity’ – those who smoke cigarettes are thought of as smokers; individuals with obesity are just viewed as obese (Burris 2008; Nussbaum 2004).
Yet another line of objection engages victim-blaming concerns similar to those raised against policies that would penalize those who engage in unhealthy behaviors. This objection challenges the arguments in defense of stigma as a public health tool by highlighting that the individuals and groups to be stigmatized are the ones subject to the injustice. In particular, there are significant concerns about whether stigmatization involves victim-blaming, encourages a culture of victim-blaming, punishes individuals who are unhealthy because they are unjustly socially disadvantaged or for other reasons that are completely outside their control. As with the debate about individual responsibility, there are often discussions about the underlying causes of the relevant behavior that public health interventions aim to prevent. For example, if unjust social structures are a root cause of obesity in some group, then encouraging the use of stigmatizing messaging or changing social norms to encourage feelings of shame in those who are or might become obese amounts to shaming people for being subject to other injustices (Goldberg and Puhl 2013). Similarly, to the extent that genetic or metabolic considerations are a root cause of obesity in some people, then stigmatizing interventions are also unjust.
Although some continue to defend stigmatization in public health despite these objections (Callahan 2013), others have provided more moderate defenses of various stigmatizing measures by emphasizing that there can be morally important differences between different targets of stigmatization. So, for instance, campaigns aimed at stigmatizing condom-less sex seem from a justice perspective to be relatively unproblematic. This kind of campaign targets a wide range of people and groups and does not tightly track social disadvantage. Nor does it dehumanize people who have certain illnesses or lifestyles or reduce them to some single feature or condition. Stigmatizing obesity, on the other hand, does engage important concerns about justice. Obesity is a medical condition and a bodily characteristic of people rather than a behavior, and even if effective, stigmatizing obesity causes significant harm to people who are already stigmatized for their size in many social contexts (Courtwright 2013).
2.6 Public Health, Global Concerns, and Global Justice
It is commonplace and yet correct to say that threats to health know no borders and that the promotion of public health requires attention beyond national boundaries. Three types of reasons can be advanced in favor of viewing public health as transcending nation-states: self-interest (2.5.1); humanitarian considerations (2.5.2); and justice, rights, and duties (2.5.3) (Wolff 2012). Of note, the first two of these reasons do not originate from the standpoint of justice, though, as we shall see, they engage important questions of justice in their pursuit. The third set of reasons engages all the issues discussed thus far in Section 2, and also encounters general debates about the meaning, reach and plausibility of global justice generally (Powers and Faden 2019, 145–186; Brock 2013; Miller 2007; see also the entries on international distributive justice and global justice).
2.6.1 Self-Interest and Global Justice
The paradigmatic example of national self-interest is the motivation every country has to prevent and contain emerging and re-emerging infectious diseases. Outbreaks of these diseases typically occur in low- and middle-income countries, but many have the potential to become threats to health in other parts of the world. It is in the interests of wealthier nations to provide financial and technical support to poorer countries to build up their surveillance and rapid response capabilities, and to provide emergency assistance when outbreaks strike. Preventing and containing infectious diseases as they emerge in the global south is an important way for wealthy countries to reduce the likelihood of negative consequences in their own backyards.
It is also in the interests of all nations, but arguably especially wealthy nations, to participate in the global sharing of surveillance data about and biosamples of suspect pathogens through mechanisms maintained by the WHO. As we noted in Section 1.1.1, nearly 200 countries are signatories to International Health Regulations, which, among other things, obligate them to do so. However, it is here that serious clashes between self-interest and global justice can emerge. Shared bio-samples are used to develop vaccines, diagnostics, and treatments that, depending on the context, may be made available first or only affordable in higher income countries where these counter measures will likely be financed and developed. The fairness of this state of affairs was challenged dramatically by Indonesia in January 2007, when it refused to hand over viral samples during an outbreak of H5N1 influenza (bird flu) in that country. Although Indonesia cited what it viewed as multiple ethical breaches, Indonesia’s main objection was a complaint of injustice that samples provided freely by low- and middle-income countries were used by companies in wealthy nations to develop vaccines and other products that developing countries cannot afford (Sedyaningsih et al. 2008). An interesting twist on the justice issues was whether, because the viral samples that would be used by wealthy country companies to develop and produce vaccine would be of Indonesian origin, Indonesia had any greater claim to the vaccine than other low- and middle-income countries who also could be seriously threatened by H5N1 but had the “bad luck” to not be among the first countries to supply viral samples.
Several steps have since been taken to address Indonesia’s and related complaints, including a 2011 WHO framework for the sharing of influenza viruses and access to vaccines and other counter-measures (see World Health Organization 2012 in Other Internet Resources). However, associated challenges in justice around global biosamples and epidemic preparedness and response continue. In 2019, a somewhat similar claim of exploitation and injustice arose when it was reported that blood samples from patients with Ebola in several West African countries had made their way to laboratories in the US, UK and other wealthy nations under conditions that some in West Africa and elsewhere considered unfair, exploitative and disrespectful (Freudenthal 2019).
In the context of emerging infections, there is yet another, related way in which national self-interest and justice can collide. When the burdens of a public health intervention fall heavily on those who are already disadvantaged, the justificatory hurdle is particularly high. This problem regularly emerges in global epidemic preparedness and is at the heart of many global justice questions, including most notably in environmental justice controversies, such as the locating of hazardous waste facilities and hazardous industries in low-income countries, typically in the poorest communities within those countries. (Powers and Faden 2019, 204–206). Because infectious disease threats so often emerge first in poorer countries, global efforts to prevent and contain pandemic influenzas can place significant burdens on the world’s poor and, as we have already noted, not always with sufficient or guaranteed offsetting benefit. For example, a principal strategy employed to prevent avian influenza H5N1 from becoming a human pandemic in the mid-2000s was the destruction of infected birds and the banning of household poultry in urban settings in affected countries. This policy was most burdensome for poor women and their families who relied on backyard poultry as their only source of disposable income. Because there was often no or little compensation for the losses, they were economically devastated as a consequence (Bellagio Working Group 2007 in Other Internet Resources; Faden and Karron 2009; Uscher-Pines, Duggan, Garoon, Karron, and Faden 2007).
Perhaps most foundationally, the self-interest reason for nations to engage globally in public health cannot be separated from questions of global structural injustice in international relations more broadly. Many threats to public health, including the threats from climate change, cannot be effectively addressed absent collective global action. However, in today’s global order in which nations differ greatly in wealth and other forms of power, the likelihood that agreements and coordinated action will fairly represent and fairly protect the interests of people living in poorer nations is not good. In the case of climate change, although the hottest, poorest, most agriculturally dependent countries have contributed the least to greenhouse gas emissions, they are being hurt “first and worst” by global warming (Powers and Faden 2019, 172–178). And yet enforceable requirements to reduce emissions continue to be blocked by high emission countries. In infectious disease as well, it is typically the poorest countries and the poorest people who are hit hardest in outbreaks and epidemics, but their power to influence global preparedness and response does not match their outsized vulnerability.
2.6.2 Humanitarian Considerations and Global Justice
Humanitarian interventions are among the most visible examples of global public health in action. These interventions are implemented and organized by diverse actors, including NGOs, philanthropies, and multinational organizations like the UN and WHO, often with support from health and military agencies from diverse countries. One way to conceptualize humanitarian interventions is as the public health response to the general moral position that it is wrong to stand by and allow others to suffer in a crisis when we have the resources to help. Under this framework, we have humanitarian duties or duties of beneficence to help those in desperate circumstances, and those duties transcend national borders. Public health services, material, and personnel are often among the most important responses in humanitarian crises, not only in outbreaks and epidemics but also in natural disasters, wars and violent conflict, displaced populations and mass migrations, famines, and droughts.
Commitments to global humanitarian assistance in public health do not entail a commitment to a robust understanding of global justice. Even theorists who are strong statists acknowledge that there are obligations of humanitarian assistance to those in dire need in other countries (see, e.g., Cohen and Sabel 2006; the entry on international distributive justice). This is not to say, however, that there are no moral controversies or issues of justice in humanitarian assistance. Humanitarian health organizations and health workers are regularly confronted with ethical challenges that include, for example, tensions between humanitarian principles of impartiality and neutrality and ethical commitments to the just distribution of limited health resources (Broussard et al. 2019). Looming large over the entirety of humanitarian assistance is the question of whether individuals and especially nations have adequately fulfilled their obligations of global humanitarian assistance. It is unclear what that question might mean if humanitarian assistance is understood as falling under obligations of beneficence rather than obligations of justice, since obligations of beneficence are less determinate than obligations of justice. Some accounts of justice might be interpreted as including duties of international humanitarian assistance, for example, if these duties are considered to fall under minimal global obligations to fulfill human rights or the threshold in sufficientarian approaches to global justice. However, these accounts do not provide guidance on what is arguably an important global justice question – whether countries are doing their fair share in humanitarian aid.
2.6.3 Public Health, Global Justice, Rights, and Duties
As important as humanitarian assistance is in global public health, it cannot even begin to address the central global justice challenge in public health – the stark differences in health between populations living in wealthy countries and populations living in low and some middle-income countries, especially the poorest in these countries. The global justice challenge in health cannot, of course, be separated from the global justice challenge in well-being, generally. And all the debates in justice theory between strong statists and theorists who defend accounts of utilitarian and egalitarian transnational obligation are relevant as well. Still, there are some reasons to think that public health, and therefore public health ethics, hold a special and very interesting location vis-à-vis discussions of global justice and our duties to the distant poor (Holland 2007). If nothing else, questions about whether there are duties of justice across national borders occur way too frequently in public health for them to be ignored. Consider just a few.
Even when vaccines are not developed using biosamples sourced from low-income countries, is it just for wealthy countries to produce and stockpile only the amount of vaccine needed to protect their own populations when low- and middle-income countries do not have a comparable capacity? While outbreaks rage in poor countries and deaths mount, should wealthy countries continue to reserve their entire vaccine supply for their own population?
Intellectual property regimes and international trade agreements provide tremendous protections for pharmaceutical companies in wealthy countries, with the result that many drugs and biologics are priced well beyond what low-income countries can afford. To take what some consider the most egregious case, should restrictions on the production and distribution of generics be upheld even when they hinder the containment of easily treatable diseases in poor countries (Pogge 2002; Grover, Citro, Mankad and Lander 2012)?
Only wealthy countries have the financial and human resources to make sizable investments in biomedical research. Do these countries have obligations in justice to allocate resources to address the major health problems of the world’s poor? And finally, public health infrastructures in low-income countries struggle from shortages of health professionals, in part because of migration of professionals to wealthy countries. Is this a problem that health authorities in wealthy countries should work to contain, even as the health of their own populations benefit?
One response to these specific challenges is to frame them all as justifiable claims of justice against the world’s wealthy countries and persons. On one of the most compelling arguments for this view, wealthy countries and their citizens are responsible for transnational institutional structures that contribute to and exacerbate unjust global inequalities, including global health inequalities. The continuing beneficiaries of these structures have a duty not only to reform these structures but also to ensure that the effects of resultant unjust inequalities are mitigated. In public health, this includes providing resources to meet the needs generated in health crises and also helping to build effective public health infrastructures in impoverished countries so that crises can be averted in the future. So understood, failing to do so is an injustice and not merely a failure to act charitably or in accordance with humanitarian obligations. Ultimately, that is why we cannot escape responsibility for intervening when something like an Ebola outbreak occurs and not merely because of concerns about self-interest or humanitarian sentiments (Powers and Faden 2019).
Those who make the case for viewing global health inequalities as unjust often appeal to health as a fundamental human right, drawing on the field of health and human rights. As we have already noted, many in public health accept that health is a fundamental right, as codified in the United Nations Universal Declaration of Human Rights or otherwise (General Assembly 1948). As is true for all human rights, difficult questions immediately emerge about the assignment of responsibility for protecting, promoting, and fulfilling the right to health and the specification of the content of the right (Millum and Emanuel 2012; Tasioulas and Vayena 2015a; Tasioulas and Vayena 2015b). At least as long as the global order is organized as it is, there are good reasons to view the nation-state as having first line responsibility for the health and other human rights of those living within its borders. However, this does not absolve nation-states of obligations to at least forebear from undermining the ability of other countries to meet their own human rights obligations. Arguably, nation-states have an obligation in justice to address impediments to human rights fulfillment that flow from unjust differentials of interstate and global institutional power (Powers and Faden 2019, 146). Also, acknowledging that nation-states are the first line of defense in human rights fulfillment does not address who is responsible for the human rights of people living in countries who cannot or will not protect their interests, including the human right to health (Powers and Faden 2019, 146–177).
If we view inequalities between people living in wealthy nations and those living in the rest of the world as a matter of justice rather than as a humanitarian concern, then those who view public health ethics through the perspective of justice have plenty to think about. To these theorists, the extraordinary disparities in life expectancy, child survival, and health that distinguish those who live in rich and poor countries constitute a profound injustice that it is the duty of the global community to redress. The necessary steps to ameliorate these injustices go beyond simple medical care and classical public health interventions. Improving the health of the world’s poor is indelibly tied to economic, social, educational, and environmental improvements as well, and health-related justice claims are not easily separable from justice claims that arise in those other contexts.
The fact that there are people who live in such poverty and deprivation that they and their children die of starvation and the simplest infection should be a sufficient indicator that these global institutional schemes are seriously unjust.
3. Political legitimacy and Public Health
As we noted in section 1.2, a distinctive feature of public health is the large role that government policy and government power play in its promotion. Although private non-profit actors, as well as pan-national organizations, make major contributions to advancing public health, much of the work of public health occurs within nation-states and is backed by governmental enforcement and the exercise of police powers. A substantial literature in public health ethics focuses on the legitimacy of these state actions.
Challenges to the authority of public health institutions and the legitimacy of public health policies occur in a wide range of political contexts. In countries with distinctly illiberal political institutions, questions of state legitimacy are cashed out quite differently than in the liberal tradition. The public health ethics literature has focused largely on the latter, relying on the liberal tradition as the touchstone for most writing on political legitimacy in public health. In Section 3, we address the major themes in this literature. Section 3.1 considers how appeals to overall benefit, the necessity of collective action, and efficiency are used to justify the general mandate of public health agencies. Section 3.2 takes up the major strands of argument from within the liberal tradition that are used to assess the permissibility of particular policies or intervention. After an overview of an influential heuristic developed to help map the relative impact of various types of public health interventions on individual liberty, we turn to four different responses to concerns about the intrusiveness and legitimacy of public health policies and practices: paternalism (3.2.1); the harm principle, as attributed to John Stuart Mill (3.2.2), the “liberty tradition” (3.2.3) and libertarian paternalism (3.2.4)
In 3.3, we consider a different set of legitimacy-related concerns also associated with liberalism that focus on the problem of how to respect values disagreements among individuals affected by a public health policy. Here we take up two responses, an appeal to public reasons (3.3.1) and an appeal to authoritative decision-procedures (3.3.2). We then move in 3.4 to the civic republicanism view in public health ethics, which denies altogether the liberal presumption against interfering with free and equal persons.
3.1 Legitimacy, Efficiency, and Overall Benefit
Some argue that public health institutions are legitimate in virtue of the particular kinds of benefits they produce. Specifically, these are benefits that are experienced by each of us as individuals but that we cannot secure for ourselves on our own. Moreover, these benefits are so important that successfully producing them overcomes the presumption against interfering with free and equal persons. For example, we all want to be protected from infectious diseases and unsafe or ineffective medication. However, these kinds of benefits cannot be secured absent regulatory agencies such as the Center for Disease Control and Prevention (CDC) or the Food and Drug Administration (FDA) which have the expertise and authority to respond to a potential epidemic or permit only safe and effective drugs to be marketed to the public. According to this line of reasoning, public health policies made by experts and enforced by the state are better for us overall, even if particular decisions may not directly benefit all of us all of the time.
According to this rationale, the task of public health ethics is not necessarily to justify each particular decision or intervention directly. Rather, as long as it stays within certain pre-established parameters, public health public health in general can be justified in the same way a market economy, the laws of private property, or other similarly broad and useful institutions that involve some interference with free and equal persons but also enable individuals to access greater benefits can be justified: when properly regulated and managed, their existence is by and large better than their absence for everyone. So structured, the justification for particular public health interventions, requirements, or restrictions is derivative of or parasitic on a higher-level rationale.
A closely related justification emphasizes that the pursuit of health is not possible without ground rules for coordinated action and near-universal participation. Thus, public health is viewed as having the structure of a coordination or collective efficiency problem. If one person (or at least, a sufficient number of such persons) decides to go when the traffic light is red and stop when the traffic light is green, it does not matter that everyone else is following the rules: this person will disrupt the smooth functioning of the system, with potentially dangerous results. Similarly, if one person (or a sufficient critical mass of such persons) decides not to abide by a public health regulation because the regulation does not directly benefit her or she otherwise objects, the ramifications will likely be felt by others in her environment and beyond. Almost everybody has to participate because, failing their involvement, neither they nor anyone else is likely to be as healthy as they might otherwise be, and none can fully reap the benefit of a healthy society.
In many public health contexts, the only feasible or acceptably efficient way to implement a policy affects the entire population, leaving no or only very burdensome options open to individual non-cooperation. Perhaps the most celebrated such example is water fluoridation, but all safety regulations affecting the food and drug supply and consumer products share this character, as do many environmental and occupational health standards. Here collective efficiency considerations loom large. Although we want healthy environments and products, individuals are simply not positioned on their own to ensure that the air is safe to breathe, nor can they make meaningful decisions about the safety of the hundreds of thousands of food and other products available in the modern marketplace. According to this rationale, ceding this function to government institutions staffed with health experts is justified in the same way as ceding protection of our interests in personal physical security to government institutions staffed with law enforcement and national defense experts (Mill 1859).
Collective efficiency arguments rely on claims about the sheer number and technical complexity of the decisions that need to be made to protect health in the environment and in the marketplace, as well as the indivisible character of responses to some health threats. These arguments are buttressed by claims about the cognitive limitations and bounded rationality of individual human decision-makers and by the disproportionate political power of corporate interests and the practices they use to manipulate and exploit our cognitive weaknesses against our health interests (Ubel 2009).
The appeal to overall benefit or collective efficiency has considerable attractiveness, particularly as a way of justifying the existence of regulatory government agencies such as the EPA, FDA, or CDC. However, it is ultimately insufficient on its own and needs to be supplemented by other kinds of ethical arguments, since it does not provide the basis for the parameters within which such agencies should operate, or for ethical oversight or scrutiny with regards to the particular decisions such agencies take.
3.2 Individual Liberty, Legitimacy, and Public Health
Different kinds of interventions raise different issues for assessing questions of legitimacy. The Nuffield Council on Bioethics has provided an influential “intervention ladder” (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2007), which effectively rank orders various types of interventions on a continuum that is meant to function as a guide to the acceptability and justification of public health policies. The ladder is anchored at one end by what is presented as the least intrusive option, doing nothing, and at the other end by what is presented as the most intrusive option, eliminating choice altogether (as in compulsory isolation). The Council makes plain that all rungs on the ladder, including doing nothing, require justification and that the ladder is to be taken only as a tool in the moral analysis of public health policies.
|Eliminate Choice||quarantining individuals infected with Ebola|
|Restrict Choice||trans fat ban; seatbelt and helmet laws; vaccine mandates; water fluoridation|
|Guide Choice by Disincentives||soda tax; cigarette tax; efforts to engender social norms against soda consumption|
|Guide Choice by Incentives||tax breaks for those who bike to work; pharmacy coupons in exchange for getting vaccinated against seasonal influenza|
|Guide Choice by Changing the Default (also known as ‘nudging’)||making salads the default side whereas fries have to be requested; requiring that sugary foods be placed further back in grocery stores|
|Enable Choice||offer free smoking cessation classes; ensure access to clean water|
|Provide Information||educational campaigns; requirements for food labels|
Table. Intervention Ladder (Nuffield Council on Bioethics, Policy Process and Practice, 2007)
While useful, the Nuffield ladder has at least three problems. First, the ladder does not canvas all of the paradigmatic interventions of public health. Surveillance, for instance, does not fit under any of the types of measures that appear on the ladder. Yet public health agencies engage in surveillance extensively; it is integral to promoting and protecting public health. And surveillance activities, too, raise difficult justificatory questions about citizen’s rights against intrusions by the state (Lee 2019; Taylor 2019; Fairchild and Bayer 2004).
Second, continua like the Nuffield Ladder oversimplify the complex impact of interventions on choice and liberty and on relations between citizens and the state. When public health authorities do nothing, it does not follow that choice and liberty are necessarily the winners. For example, with no government intervention to serve as a counter ballast, private sector actors in the pharmaceutical, food, and energy sectors may undermine both individual choice and health through misinformation, manipulative advertising, or anti-competitive practices. Similarly, incentives are not always less restrictive of choice than disincentives, and some object to both because they are manipulative and autonomy-undermining (Quong 2011). Nudges and health promotion campaigns also raise concerns about unwarranted state intrusion, depending on the context. For example, ad campaigns that are transparently sponsored by public health agencies, such as those to prevent transmission of influenza by promoting personal infection control practices or reduce obesity by encouraging exercise and healthy eating, do not raise the same moral issues as the embedding of anti-drug or food messages in the storylines of entertainment television programming by these same authorities (FCC 2000; Forbes 2000 (Other Internet Resources); Goodman 2006; Krauthammer 2000; Kurtz and Waxman 2000). Much like corporate advertising, these embedded messages, as well as some nudges, may succeed in shaping people’s preferences without their awareness. These undetected effects lead to questions about whether such interventions constitute insidious manipulation by government and, as a consequence whether they are really less objectionable than more overt interventions like taxing or restricting liberty.
Third, the Nuffield Ladder ranks types of public health measures on only one set of considerations that is relevant to justifying the impact of that measure on choice and liberty. Justifications of policies must also include an assessment of the benefit produced by the intervention as discussed in Section 3.1, as well as considerations of who benefits and who is harmed by alternative government responses (including doing nothing) in ways that are sensitive to the range of worries about justice raised in section 2.
The Nuffield Ladder is ultimately motivated by concerns about the appropriate scope of state activity, and how the rights or interests of citizens should restrict such activities. One helpful framing of this concern comes from familiar discussions of political legitimacy (see the entry on political legitimacy). In these discussions, there are typically three claims that are presented as though they are in tension:
- Exercises of political power interfere with free and equal persons – some of whom do not consent to such interference.
- There is a moral presumption against interfering with non-consenting free and equal persons.
- Public health interventions are (often) exercises of political power.
The use of ‘interference’ is intentionally broad and can be specified to be more or less inclusive. As we saw from the Nuffield Ladder, the most paradigmatic cases of interference are laws restricting or eliminating individual choice. Arguably, however, other interventions interfere with free and equal persons, such as disincentivizing or incentivizing choice, altering choice architecture, or conducting surveillance. Others charge that even subsidized smoking cessation programs funded by taxpayer money constitute an interference with free and equal persons on the grounds that taxation is coercive – and so constitutes interference (Quong 2011).
The conception of ‘free and equal persons’ is also open to multiple specifications (see the entry on liberalism). The basic idea behind the ‘free’ qualifier is to limit discussion to individuals who have the requisite psychological abilities to govern their lives in accordance with their values or plan of life. Children and, arguably, adults with severe cognitive disabilities do not count as free in this sense, and so the tension between (1) and (2) does not arise for them as straightforwardly. The ‘equal’ qualifier is meant to convey that free persons are moral equals, and no person has a natural right to govern others.
Resolving the tension between (1) and (2) is not unique to public health; it is widely treated as a central problem for theorists of political morality generally, especially by those who consider themselves liberals. Nonetheless, as (3) indicates, the tension between (1) and (2) frequently arises in the context of public health practice and policy. We now consider a variety of responses to this tension.
Perhaps no issue has driven more debates about the legitimacy of public health interventions than paternalism, and when, if ever, paternalism is morally permissible. There is no consensus on how to best define paternalism, and resolving disputes about this definition is beyond the scope of this entry (see the entry on paternalism). But paternalism is classically understood as successfully interfering with the liberty of action of a person, against her will, to protect or promote her welfare (Dworkin 2005; Feinberg 1986). ‘Strong’ or ‘hard’ paternalism, the variant of paternalism that is most controversial, typically refers to interference with someone’s informed and value-based preferences for the sake of advancing that person’s best interests or welfare. To illustrate with a case, imagine someone who chooses to ride a motorcycle without a helmet rather than with a helmet despite knowing the greater risk of injury and death that accompanies this choice because the person values the enhanced sense of freedom they experience when riding bareheaded. In this case, interference with this decision for their own good by issuing fines that are ultimately backed by loss of driving privileges or some other significant penalty would be a case of strong or hard paternalism.
Strong or hard paternalism is quite controversial in all domains, and liberals rarely claim that interventions can be justified on strong or hard paternalistic grounds when it comes to autonomous, competent, and informed persons. And very few public health interventions are justified exclusively or even primarily on grounds of hard or strong paternalism. Even proponents of motorcycle helmet laws often eschew paternalistic arguments in favor of arguments about the costs the cyclist imposes on others by riding without a helmet (Jones and Bayer 2007).
A distinct class of paternalistic arguments more popular with public health advocates appeals to soft paternalism or weak paternalism. Soft paternalism concerns interference with individuals to ensure that they are not acting on false beliefs when endangering themselves such as John Stuart Mill’s influential example of the person who intends to cross an unstable bridge, when it is unclear whether he knows that the bridge is dangerous. In this case, to engage in soft paternalism would be to make sure that the individual knows that the bridge is unstable and if that person does, allowing them to cross nonetheless. Weak paternalism includes correcting more general failures to take one’s means to one’s ends due to, say, weakness of will (Dworkin 2005). Both weak and soft paternalism share the feature that they are interferences with choices that are compromised by ignorance or non-voluntariness.
A challenge for both soft and especially weak paternalism is how to respond when the person who is to be interfered with voices or holds a preference that is inconsistent with the ends pursued on her behalf. A general view is that preferences are not entitled to robust respect if formed under conditions that significantly compromise their autonomy or voluntariness, such as cognitive disability or immaturity and, in very limited cases, ignorance or false beliefs. Although rarely employed as a justification in public health, adaptive preferences formed in response to difficult or unjust circumstances are viewed by some as being less autonomous and consequently more subject to permissible interference than preferences formed under just or normal background conditions (see the entry on feminist perspectives on autonomy).
More typically in public health, the obligation to respect preferences is challenged by appeal to other claimed compromises of autonomy or voluntariness. For example, public health interventions aimed at adolescents, such as minimum age requirements for the purchasing of alcohol, tobacco products, and driver’s licenses, appeal to views about the immaturity of judgment of adolescents whose brains are still developing and who have limited life experience. For adults as well as teenagers, claims about the addictive properties of some substances, as well as the power of corporate marketing strategies to manipulate preferences, are often used to justify interference. For example, this line of reasoning has been used to help defend some drug, alcohol, and tobacco policies, as well as policies to restrict access to sugar-sweetened beverages.
It warrants emphasizing that in all these cases, justified interference would be based on a finding of significantly compromised autonomy, competence, or rationality in the formation or continued holding of particular preferences. This should not be confused with interference based on the content of the preferences. Only the former would be justifiable under soft or weak paternalism, whereas the latter would constitute hard or strong paternalism.
These demarcations are not, of course, as clear in real life as they are in theory, and in practice, the content of preferences is often precisely what is appealed to in illustrating that a particular preference is compromised. However, by and large, what distinguishes weak paternalism from strong paternalism is the requirement that the decision or preference be fundamentally compromised, and not simply that it be mistaken or ignorant. This principled distinction remains important not least because it reflects a difference in approach or attitude: in the case of hard or strong paternalism, the interference is based on the content of a preference that, purportedly, does not reflect what is in the preference holder’s interest. In the case of soft or weak paternalism, persons might hold all manner of preferences not in their best interest that are nonetheless not justifiably interfered with because the relevant compromising conditions do not obtain.
Despite the general tendency to eschew paternalistic arguments in public health ethics, there have been some notable defenses of unabashed paternalism in recent years. However, the exact form of paternalism that these authors defend varies (Conly 2013, 2014; Hanna 2019). To take one prominent defender of paternalism, Sarah Conly appears to defend weak paternalism insofar as she claims the appropriate goal of paternalism is to enable as many individuals as possible to act on their genuine values or higher-order preferences. For instance, Conly argues in favor of various paternalist forms of public health legislation, such as banning trans-fats, because individuals value their health more than they value consuming trans-fats (Conly 2013, 2014).
3.2.2 John Stuart Mill, Liberty, and the Harm Principle
Likely no classic philosophical work is cited more often in the public health ethics literature than John Stuart Mill’s influential essay, “On Liberty” (Mill 1869). In that essay, Mill articulates and defends what has come to be called ‘the harm principle,’ although Mill himself never used the term. The harm principle has been interpreted as holding that the only justification for interfering with the liberty of an individual, against her will, is to prevent direct, non-consensual harm to others. The harm principle is used to both challenge and support public health policies.
Policies that interfere with conduct that does not produce direct harm to others are sometimes criticized as government overreach in virtue of failing to satisfy the harm principle (Jones and Bayer 2007; Quong 2011; Flanigan 2014b). For instance, opponents of motorcycle helmet laws in Massachusetts explicitly invoked Mill when pressing their case in court (Jones and Bayer 2007, 211). Conversely, the harm principle is invoked to justify policies where harm to others is a paramount concern, paradigmatically for various infectious disease control interventions such as quarantine, isolation, and compulsory treatment (Flanigan 2014a; Holland 2007; Navin 2016; Giubilini 2019). In liberal democracies, the harm principle is often viewed as the most compelling justification for public health policies that interfere with individual liberty. For example, some claim that in the United States it was not until the public became persuaded of the harmful effects of “second-hand smoke” that the first significant intrusion into smoking practices – the banning of smoking in public places – became politically possible.
As with all such moral and political principles, questions remain about the specification of the harm principle. There are questions about the nature of harm, which is typically understood as setting back the interests of individuals in which they have rights, including economic interests. How significant must the threat of harm be, with regard to both its likelihood and magnitude? Are physical harms to the health of others to be weighted more than economic harms or other setbacks to interests? It is undeniable that individuals have much broader and more multi-dimensional interests than narrowly self-directed physical ones. In that sense, it is not unreasonable to have a fairly expansive understanding of “harm” in a public health context. And given how self-harming behavior influences others, some might question the usefulness of sharply delineating self-regarding and other-regarding harm. Others, however, charge that to interpret harm in this way is too expansive (Jones and Bayer 2007).
For instance, consider the claim that one harms others by riding a motorcycle without a helmet because, in so doing, cyclists risk diverting important medical resources and personnel to the care of people who get into accidents without helmets. Some have charged that this construal of harm is unduly broad and, accordingly, this construal of harm would entail that the harm principle permits various government interventions that it should prohibit (Jones and Bayer 2007). Actions that are primarily self-harming frequently raise concerns about how broadly to interpret the harm principle.
Because the impact of J.S. Mill on public health ethics cannot be overstated, it is also important to recognize that Mill does not hold that in the formulation of public policies all liberty interests enjoy an equal presumption in their favor. Mill distinguishes interests that are so important that they are immune from state interference, interests that enjoy a presumption in favor of liberty, and interests that enjoy no such presumption. The harm principle figures prominently only when the second kind of liberty interest is involved. Some public health interventions target the third kind of liberty interest, which is not privileged in the same way. For example, is not clear that the interest individuals have in eating foods with trans-fats is an interest that enjoys a presumption in favor of liberty (Powers, Faden and Saghai 2012).
Finally, it is worth mentioning that the harm principle has also enjoyed more attention in public health ethics in recent years because some of Mill’s arguments have been subject to increased scrutiny. One of Mill’s arguments rests on the claim that others, including the State, are not as well-positioned to know the best interests of the individual as the individual herself, and the individual has the greatest interest in her own well-being. Accordingly, restricting the individual’s liberty for her own good will typically fail. Yet in recent years, some have drawn on findings in behavioral economics and social psychology to challenge this empirical claim about our self-knowledge, incentives, and competence at pursuing our own interests – and thereby challenge a claim that underlies the harm principle. This challenge can be specified in various ways. One specification is that we are quite bad at means-end reasoning due to ignorance; many would like to lead healthy lives but lack knowledge of nutrition. Another version of this is that individuals are bad at taking the requisite means to their ends due to various cognitive biases, such as temporal discounting, or lack of executive function. Individuals often know what is in their best interest, but they still succumb to temptation or otherwise act in ways that, arguably, are not conducive to what they as well as others appreciate is in their interest (Conly 2013, 2014; Hanna 2019; Sunstein 2013; Thaler and Sunstein 2003; 2008).
Needless to say, whether these empirical claims are correct will turn on how we specify the requisite conditions for knowledge of one’s own best interest; what constitutes successfully acting on one’s best interests; and whether various cognitive biases do, in fact, prevent individuals from acting on their own best interests. Moreover, as we will see in the following section, even if we grant that individuals are subject to the relevant shortcomings, this might not undercut Mill’s more general point.
3.2.3 The Liberty Tradition
Regardless of how we interpret the harm principle or whether we accept the various arguments for it, some liberals have appealed to the moral significance of individual liberty to argue that various liberal governments currently overstep their mandate when it comes to promoting public health. To borrow a label from Eric Mack and Gerald Gaus, this class of views constitutes ‘the liberty tradition.’ (Mack and Gaus 2004; Brennan 2018). The liberty tradition includes (non-left and anti-paternalist) libertarianism and various forms of classical liberalism. In recent years, some advocates of the liberty tradition have become increasingly interested in public health ethics. Their views are distinctive insofar as they place a significant normative premium on individual liberty, and they typically do not countenance public health interventions based on principles of justice other than principles of transfer or repair. Moreover, these theorists frequently call out perceived excesses on the part of the State’s pursuit of public health.
One argument that frequently appears in this literature turns on skepticism that government actors are sufficiently knowledgeable, competent, or well-motivated to effectively improve the public’s health. In other words, some object to a wide variety of public health interventions because of empirical claims about government actors, including those who attempt to promote public health. While we have seen that some challenge the presumption in favor of liberty by providing evidence that individuals are not, in fact, especially good at pursuing their own interests – due to ignorance, lack of willpower, or cognitive bias – those in the liberty tradition sometimes counter that even if we grant these empirical claims, it does not follow that governments are any better. In other words, to show that governments may interfere with free and equal persons, one would need to show that policy can better secure the interests of individuals than individuals themselves can. And when it comes to public health interventions aimed at protecting individuals from themselves, these theorists claim that we should doubt that government actors are up to the task (Brennan 2017; Epstein 2004; Flanigan 2014b).
The argument so far rests on empirical claims about the questionable competence and motivation of government actors, but many (if not most) in the liberty tradition also oppose such interventions on normative grounds as well. That is, even if public health officials were competent, well-motivated, and knew the interests of individuals better than individuals themselves, those in the liberty tradition object that this still would not justify various public health policies aimed at improving the health of citizens (see Brennan 2018; Epstein 2004; Flanigan 2014b; Quong 2011; Anomaly 2011; Gaus 2010). This point can be summarized with the following quote from David Estlund (although Estlund uses it in a markedly different context): “You might be right, but who made you boss?” (Estlund 2007). There are a variety of rationales for this normative conclusion; some appeal to natural rights or broadly deontological views, whereas others appeal to requirements of public justification (more on this below). Others still draw on consequentialist reasoning and appear to argue on grounds of efficiency or aggregate benefit. That is, one could grant that overall benefit or efficiency would justify public health interventions but deny that many public health interventions are, in fact, efficient in the relevant ways (Brennan 2018).
The common thread in the liberty tradition is the moral presumption in favor of individual liberty. This thread manifests in a variety of ways in the context of public health. Some object to the ways in which public health authorities provide information to citizens, such as ‘traffic light’ labels on foods, or especially graphic images that depict the deleterious effects of smoking cigarettes (Bonotti 2014). Others in the liberty tradition object to government-created disincentives, such as soda taxes (Anomaly 2011, 2012). And, of course, proponents of the liberty tradition object to restrictions of choice. For instance, some charge that regulatory bodies, such as the FDA, illegitimately restrict individual liberty when they prohibit individuals from purchasing and using drugs that the FDA deems unsafe (Anomaly 2011, 2012; Flanigan 2014b, 2017; Epstein 2004).
As with the harm principle, those in the liberty tradition are not necessarily opposed to public health measures that prohibit people from harming others. Yet we might wonder whether the liberty tradition’s premium on individual liberty constrains various public health interventions that its proponents wish to endorse. An interesting boundary case concerns whether members of the liberty tradition can endorse vaccine mandates, especially for the measles-mumps-rubella vaccine (Bernstein 2017; Brennan 2018; Flanigan 2014a; Giubilini 2019; Navin 2015). Collectively, parents who delay or refuse vaccination can impose considerable risk on others, collectively. Individually, however, each unvaccinated child does not impose much risk. Given this low risk of harm, it would seem that the most natural argument in defense of mandatory vaccination would be to justify a restriction of individual parental liberty for the sake of some sort of overall benefit. Insofar as libertarians view interference with free and equal persons for promoting overall benefit as illegitimate, however, this argument is not available for them. And self-identified libertarians outside of academia have objected to vaccine mandates as unjustified infringements on individual liberty. (For instance, in 2015, Senator Rand Paul argued against vaccine mandates because “The state doesn’t own your children. Parents own their children.”) But this is a striking conclusion, one that arguably counts against the plausibility of libertarianism rather than against the legitimacy of vaccine mandates (Brennan 2018; Bernstein 2017).
Perhaps in response to this position, some self-described libertarians have attempted to defend vaccine mandates by arguing that allowing one’s child to go unvaccinated violates the rights of others (Flanigan 2014a; Brennan 2018). If their arguments succeed, libertarians can place a premium on individual liberty without being committed to the ostensibly unpalatable implication that vaccine mandates are illegitimate. In reply, however, some have objected that if vaccine delayal or refusal violates rights in virtue of imposing risk of harm on others, then so too do many other activities. Think of the risks associated with owning guns or private pools or driving large, fuel-inefficient cars. If this is correct, then a libertarian defense of vaccine mandates is either unsuccessful or entails the permissibility of widespread government restrictions of various liberties, thereby raising the question as to whether the defense genuinely counts as libertarian (Bernstein 2017).
3.2.4 Libertarian Paternalism
Some have sought a third way between paternalism and the liberty tradition. The proponents of this third way describe their view as ‘libertarian paternalism.’ (Thaler and Sunstein 2003; Thaler and Sunstein 2008; Sunstein 2013). Libertarian paternalism aims to be responsive to our well-documented shortcomings at pursuing our own interests while also assuaging the liberty tradition’s concerns about paternalistic measures that disincentivize, restrict, or eliminate choice. ‘Nudges,’ understood typically as interventions in choice architecture, are the focus of libertarian paternalism. And public health policy and liberal governments have increasingly employed nudges to influence health behaviors in desirable directions. Libertarian paternalism endorses interventions by planners (such as public health authorities) in the environmental architecture in which individuals decide and act in order to make it easier for people to behave in ways that are in their best interests (including their health), provided two conditions are satisfied (Thaler and Sunstein 2003; Thaler and Sunstein 2008). First, individuals are steered by these interventions in ways that make them better off, as judged by themselves. Thus, in libertarian paternalism, there is no attempt to contravene the will of individuals, in contrast to what some hold to be a necessary feature of paternalism. Second, the interventions must not overly burden individuals who want to exercise their freedom in ways that run counter to their own welfare. Thaler and Sunstein suggest, for example, that salads rather than French fries could be made the default “side” on restaurant menus, with diners free to request fries if that remains their preference. By nudging people to eat salads, public health outcomes would improve, but this intervention does not objectionably interfere with individual liberty.
A key conceptual question about paternalism is whether the interference with individual liberty must be against the person’s will (Beauchamp 2010). If this feature is a necessary condition of paternalism, then libertarian paternalism is inappropriately titled. Similarly, we might wonder whether the view is genuinely libertarian in any informative sense since libertarianism is concerned to protect individual liberty not only from coercion but also from other forms of interference – most notably manipulation. Both supporters and opponents of paternalistic interventions and those in favor of them have charged that choice architecture is manipulative (Conly 2013; Quong 2011).
From the standpoint of public health ethics, however, whether libertarian paternalism is appropriately titled is less important than any moral issues it raises and how it is justified. There is a large and still-growing literature on the ethics of nudges, much of it focusing on health (Engelen 2019; Levy 2017; Moles 2015; Muldoon 2018; Noggle 2018; Saghai 2013a; Saghai 2013b; Soccia 2019; Quigley 2013; Hollands et al. 2013; Quong 2011).
Those who believe that nudging is manipulative and that manipulation is objectionable for the same sorts of reasons as coercion is objectionable do not see libertarian paternalism as a viable middle path between paternalism and the liberty tradition. Instead, they argue that it is simply a different form of paternalism, one that raises the same or very similar concerns about respect for individuals as coercive paternalism (see Quong 2011; Noggle 2018; Soccia 2019). Moreover, as noted above in the discussion of the liberty tradition, some have granted that individuals are not good at the relevant kinds of decision-making but deny that government actors are sufficiently competent or well-motivated to design nudges that do more good than harm. Whether this objection to libertarian paternalism sticks is a complicated empirical question. But insofar as one accepts that libertarian paternalism is manipulative, it does not avoid worries from those in the liberty tradition.
Others, by contrast, see libertarian paternalism as too restrictive in its conditions (and therefore too weak) to be applicable or adequate for many public health contexts (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2007; Ubel 2009; Conly 2013; Conly 2014; Menard 2010). For instance, some charge that libertarian paternalism is so concerned with individual decision-making that it is not well-suited to producing public goods associated with public health, nor is it effective at removing underlying social determinants of bad public health outcomes (Menard 2010). And some restrictions of liberty have yielded significant public health benefits, such as seatbelt or motorcycle laws, or bans on the use of trans fats (Conly 2013; Conly 2014; Menard 2010). In other words, those unmoved by the objections to restricting individual liberty for the sake of realizing public health gains find the libertarian paternalist proposal to be too concessive to the liberty tradition. Because policies that conform to libertarian paternalist criteria are too limited in their effects, libertarian paternalism is unable to accomplish central tasks of public health – and therefore does not satisfy those who reject the liberty tradition.
3.3 Normative Disagreement and Legitimacy
A small but growing literature addressing concerns about legitimacy accepts a broadly liberal view of political morality but emphasizes a slightly different set of concerns. More specifically, some argue that the distinctive problems of public health ethics do not merely extend to offering answers to moral questions about, say, whether the state is permitted to try to reduce the incidence of obesity or whether such a policy is just. Instead, the public health ethicist also faces moral questions about the normatively appropriate ways for governments to respond to disagreements among its citizen about how to distribute resources or what considerations (if any) justify attempts to reduce the incidence of obesity. That is, given the plurality of views about the good life or justice, how should we ultimately arrive at particular policies designed to promote public health? (Kristine Bærøe et al. 2014; Anomaly 2011; Coggon 2012; Daniels and Sabin 1997; Daniels and Sabin 2008; Bonotti 2014; Bonotti and Barnhill 2019)
Consider, for example, a municipal tax on sugar-sweetened beverages. Public health authorities and policymakers may defend the tax by pointing to the health burdens of rising obesity rates, which are fueled by the consumption of sugary beverages that have no redeeming nutritional value. Not everyone in the population affected by the tax shares the values that underlie this position, however. Some citizens reject the view that overweight bodies are somehow objectionable and instead see them as something else entirely – large or traditionally built bodies that are particularly attractive and beautiful. Other citizens greatly enjoy the pleasures associated with sweets, including sweetened beverages. These citizens might object that they value sweets or having a beautiful body so much that they are more than willing to assume any associated elevated risk of, say, hypertension or diabetes. Here, there is genuine disagreement within the affected population about standards of beauty, the worth of sweet drinks, and how important these values are compared to health. (Other disagreements concern what conception of health we should accept.) If the soda tax is implemented in the name of promoting population health, then a distinctive issue arises: the justification for the soda tax appeals to a conception of what is overall valuable or good that not all citizens accept. Disagreements about values also plague public health concerns about justice. As we have already noted, there are competing theories about why health matters, morally, as well as whether health policy should aim to maximize overall population health or reducing unjust inequalities in health status or health care access. In the face of these kinds of disagreements about the good life or justice, what makes public health policies legitimate?
3.3.1 Public Reason Liberalism
One line of response to normative disagreement draws on work in political philosophy that develops theories of public reason or public justification (see the entry on public reason, and the entry on public justification). According to public reason theorizing, political power is legitimate if and only if it is exercised in accordance with shared political values or normative reasons that idealized members of a political community can accept, would accept, could not reject, or would not reject. To return to the earlier example, imagine that when defending a soda tax to citizens, some legislators point to passages in their preferred religious texts to support the tax. Other supporters claim that smaller bodies are more beautiful than larger ones, and so we should try to reduce the incidence of obesity. Neither of these considerations would count as public reasons because reasonable citizens have different aesthetic standards and disagree about which (if any) religious texts are authoritative. According to public reason liberalism, to justify a policy on the basis of these sorts of reasons when some (idealized) citizens could not or would not accept those reasons would be to run afoul of a requirement of legitimacy.
Public justification theorists also offer competing explanations as to why political officials ought only to exercise political power on the basis of values that satisfy requirements of public justification. For instance, some argue that if policies are coercively enforced on the basis of reasons that at least some citizens cannot accept, then we fail to accord them the respect to which they are entitled. Others focus less on coercion but nonetheless insist that considerations of reciprocity or community generate requirements of public reason. (For a variety of views about the normative significance of satisfying requirements of public reason, see esp., Quong 2011; Rawls 1993; Gaus 2010; the entry on public reason; and the entry on public justification.)
Regardless of the preferred rationale, if one accepts the claim that policies are legitimate only if they are justifiable on the basis of public reasons, a great deal turns on how one specifies public reasons. And such specifications have significant implications for the scope of the mandate of public health. Some argue that public reasons include reasons that are acceptable given shared epistemic standards or values internal to a political culture, or a society’s shared conception of justice. Shared conceptions of justice or values in a political culture are presumably consonant with a broad array of public health interventions. For instance, imagine someone justifying various programs that would provide access to healthier foods. This person could invoke shared epistemic standards by pointing to evidence that lack of access to adequately nutritious food as a child is correlated with health outcomes that no rational or reasonable person would want, such as diabetes. The person could invoke a shared conception of justice by claiming that the neighborhood one is born into should not determine one’s health prospects (Bonotti and Barnhill 2019; Moles 2013; Nielsen and Jensen 2016).
Others, by contrast, argue for more restrictive conceptions of public reasons. For instance, one popular theory of public reason liberalism claims that a reason is public if and only if it is compatible with the ‘motivational set’ – which includes desires, dispositions of evaluation, and patterns of emotional reaction – of each (idealized) person (Bonotti and Barnhill 2019). Given that at least a few (idealized) people will have a motivational set that is incompatible with reasons offered in defense of a public health measure, very few public health interventions will be supported by public health reasons. Accordingly, this restrictive conception of public reasons has restrictive implications for the mandate of public health. Without further specification of what is meant by ‘idealized’ taking this position may mean that virtually no public health measures could ever be considered legitimate. Because public health policies are by design intended to affect large numbers of people, it is hard to imagine any public health policy, or indeed any kind of policy, that is compatible with the motivational set of every affected person. There will always be some who object to a proposed policy because it is incompatible with their values. It is not, therefore, a coincidence that those who endorse restrictive conceptions of public reasons also tend to identify with the liberty tradition. To return to an earlier example, one reason offered in defense of a soda tax is that the tax will reduce overall obesity and thereby improve population health. Yet, as we saw, at least some people have motivational sets that prioritize having a larger body or enjoying sweet drinks over being healthy – even if we assume a shared conception of health. Since the reason given in defense of the policy is incompatible with the motivational set of some individuals, it is not a public reason. If the health argument was the only reason in defense of a soda tax, then this version of public reason liberalism would claim that the soda tax is illegitimate – it is not justifiable to (idealized) citizens (Bonotti and Barnhill 2019).
3.3.2 Authoritative Decision – Procedures
A distinct set of responses to disagreement-based concerns about legitimacy focus on designing authoritative decision-procedures. Many defend the claim that when we disagree about conceptions of the good life or justice, allowing the majority to vote is normatively attractive – or even strictly necessary – because it respectfully resolves such disagreements (see, e.g., Waldron 1999). Some theorists addressing topics in public health have taken a similar tack. Given disagreement about various values relevant to population health, some emphasize the importance of utilizing decision-procedures that include stakeholder input, are transparent, or satisfy various other values that are discussed in the context of debates about disagreement and authority (Childress et al. 2002; Emanuel 2002; Goold et al. 2005; Upshur 2002; Marckmann et al. 2015).
While less explored, a different set of questions about institutional design and disagreement concerns the connection between administrative agencies, public health, and democratic decision-making. Public health decision-making often occurs within administrative agencies, where unelected officials make value judgments about how to interpret or implement legislation or executive directives (Weinstock 2016). This feature of public health raises interesting legitimacy questions, questions that also crop up for national defense or environmental agencies or appointed judges. While of considerable interest and importance for public health ethics, there has been relatively little work addressing this topic. Adequately addressing this gap in the literature would require bringing together work on democratic legitimacy, the legitimacy of administrative agencies, and the implications of both for public health, in particular.
Perhaps the most extensive discussion about legitimate decision-procedures as an appropriate response to normative disagreement concerns disagreements about priority-setting. To give a sense of these debates and the broader philosophical issues they raise, it is worth focusing on an especially influential framework for assessing the legitimacy of decision-making about priority setting and coverage issues relevant to public health, Norman Daniels’s and James Sabin’s Accountability for Reasonableness (A4R). Initially intended to inform decision-making by private insurance companies, A4R has since been extended to apply to priority setting generally and health technology assessment.
The underlying assumption of A4R is that it is easier to reach agreement about a decision-procedure for how to go forward in the face of substantive moral disagreements about the appropriate distribution of health resources than it is to resolve the underlying substantive disagreements themselves (Daniels 2000; Daniels and Sabin 1997; Daniels and Sabin 2008). A4R articulates four conditions that, if satisfied, render a decision-procedure legitimate – even when individuals disagree about fundamental questions about values or justice or the decision reached by the procedure. These four conditions are as follows:
- The publicity condition requires that rationales for resource allocation must be publicly accessible.
- The relevance condition requires that decisions must invoke relevant reasons that ‘fair-minded people’ would accept, where ‘fair-minded people’ are those who are ‘disposed to finding mutually justifiable terms of cooperation’ (Daniels 2008, 118). Here, A4R draws on the aforementioned work in public reason theorizing as well as work on deliberative democracy; having fair-minded people offering reasons for different policies will yield some degree of consensus, at the very least about which reasons are relevant for making a decision (see the entry on democracy).
- The revision and appeals condition requires that mechanisms be in place to allow for challenges and revisions of decisions when new evidence or arguments come to light.
- The regulative condition (also referred to as the enforcement condition) requires that there be voluntary or public regulation of the process of decision-making.
Despite its popularity, many object to A4R. A fundamental objection questions the assumption that motivates A4R – that arriving at agreement on a decision-procedure is more feasible than arriving at consensus on substantive values (Friedman 2008; Dawson and Verweij 2014; Sabik and Lie 2008). Others debate whether the publicity and revision and appeals conditions are sufficiently democratic (Friedman 2008, 102) or whether publicity is necessary for legitimacy (de Fine Licht 2011; Martin and Giacomini and Singer 2002).
Perhaps the most scrutinized aspect of the A4R is the relevance condition. As we saw in the discussion of public reason, political theorists disagree about which sorts of reasons count as public. Daniels claims the only relevant class of reasons are those that fair-minded people would accept. He argues that to allow every consideration to count equally would make a consensus impossible and that it would be misguided to accord significant weight to considerations that fair-minded people would reject (Daniels 2009, 144).
Yet narrowing the class of reasons that count in favor of decisions leads to its own problems. The fair-minded and unfair-minded alike might very well disagree about who counts as fair-minded, and, accordingly, about which sorts of reasons should count when making policy decisions (Hasman and Holm 2005; Friedman 2008). This leads to a puzzle about how to determine who counts as fair-minded – should we use another procedure that people could accept in order to determine which reasons count as those that fair-minded people would invoke? And what should we say to those who espouse reasons that are deemed unsuitable because only the unfair-minded would advance them?
A more fundamental worry is that the focus on which reasons count complicates rather than helps when trying to reach an acceptable resolution to disagreements about various questions relevant to public health. That is, we need not just to resolve disagreements about the importance of various competing normative considerations when engaged in priority-setting, but to resolve disagreements about which considerations and which reasons should be excluded. Perhaps the most significant worry about the relevance condition is that it avoids questions of legitimacy that arise due to normative disagreement rather than answering such questions. It is not difficult to come to a consensus if we only consider the views of those who antecedently agree. Presumably, however, if we accept the importance of reaching a decision that is acceptable to people who ultimately disagree with it, then gerrymandering the array of reasons that are relevant to decision-making would seem to be counter-productive.
3.4 Alternatives to Liberalism
Finally, a different class of views rejects altogether the position that liberalism should be given pride of place in thinking about the justification of public health interventions. Recurring charges include that liberalism fails to accommodate communal values like solidarity; (Dawson and Jennings 2012); that the conception of persons as free and equal involves a skewed account of human nature; and that liberalism lacks the resources to provide an adequate conception of the public or the common good. For instance, in an agenda-setting paper for a non-liberal feminist framework for public health ethics, Baylis, Kenny, and Sherwin write, “We agree with Bruce Jennings that ’[t]he liberal framing of public health ethics is useful up to a point, but it is ultimately too narrow to provide normative justification for – or adequate moral insight about – the kinds of social change public health must strive to bring about,’” (Baylis and Kenny and Sherwin 2008, 196).
Civic republicans agree with liberals that freedom is a central – or perhaps the central – value of political morality. Yet republicans offer a definition of freedom that rivals the one that the liberal proposes. Rather than espousing the liberal position that freedom consists of negative liberty or freedom as non-interference, republicans claim that conditions of non-domination constitute freedom (Pettit 1997; Pettit 2012). While there are a variety of definitions of non-domination, two claims typically lie at its core: first, to enjoy true freedom, one must be free from arbitrary interference, and second, one’s freedom from arbitrary interference must be robust – one must enjoy it in a variety of nearby possible worlds. An oft-employed example to illustrate the distinction between non-interference and non-domination is the case of an enslaved person who has a benevolent slave-owner who permits the enslaved person to do whatever they wish and provides the enslaved person with plentiful resources. Yet the enslaver could, if they so chose, prohibit the enslaved person from using the provided resources or performing various actions. Because the enslaver has this power over the enslaved person and could exercise it, the enslaved person does not enjoy genuine freedom. Instead, the enslaved person is dominated (Lovett 2001; Lovett 2018; Pettit 1997; Pettit 2012; Skinner 1998; Skinner 2008; see also the entry on republicanism).
Republicans argue that the power to interfere is non-arbitrary – and thus non-dominating – when it is genuinely public. In order for power to be genuinely public, it needs to be subject to procedures that track the interests of those subject to it, typically citizens. For procedures to track these interests, republicans often argue that constitutionally protected rights, as well as a representative and reasonably well-functioning democracy, are all necessary. When such conditions are satisfied, the public exercises political power in a way that ensures that each is free. When political institutions fail to track the interests of citizens in the requisite ways, however, citizens are subjection to the arbitrary will of states. Accordingly, rather than construing legislation as freedom-restricting, when such legislation tracks the interests of citizens and enables individuals to avoid being subject to the arbitrary will of others, democratic legislation enhances freedom (Pettit 1997, 2012).
When it comes to public health, some have claimed that civic republicanism is better-suited than liberalism as a foundational theory (see Jennings 2007; Jennings 2009; Weinstock 2016). Rather than focusing on a purported tension between government action that promotes public health and freedom as non-interference, republicans argue government has an indispensable role in ensuring that individuals are not subject to the arbitrary will of others as a consequence, for example, of poverty or the need to maintain employer-provided medical insurance. One natural extension of republican thought in the domain of public health concerns how powerful private actors can subject us to their arbitrary will through manipulative advertising or pricing, and unhealthy labor practices. On this proposed application of republican theory, a major role of public health is to prevent domination by these powerful private actors. Public health agencies are thus described not as interfering with freedom, but as enhancing it.
Various liberal theorists of public health resist the republican characterization of their view and the republicans’ claims about the defects of liberalism (Rajczi 2016; Radoilska 2009). Moreover, while the republican approach to public health is provocative, it faces significant challenges. Some of these problems apply to republicanism generally. For instance, some object that republicanism gives short shrift to the moral importance of non-interference (Larmore 2001; Wall 2001; List and Valentini 2016). Others have objected that the ‘non-arbitrary’ qualification of being subject to the will of another yields counter-intuitive results. For instance, if someone is non-arbitrarily imprisoned, then they certainly seem to be dominated in any ordinary understanding of ‘domination.’ However, it seems to follow from the republican definition that the individual is not dominated (List and Valentini 2016).
Other concerns about republicanism focus on the central importance of democratic decision-making to ensure freedom from non-domination, and here some distinctive issues for public health ethics emerge. As we have noted, public health interventions are frequently implemented or decided upon by agencies that have a relatively limited democratic pedigree. Advocates of public health can defend the large role of administrative agencies by appeal to a range of justifications, including realizing conditions of justice, overall benefit, or even some form of paternalism, but it is less clear what republicans can say here (Weinstock 2016). Some might insist that, contrary to what some republican health ethicists claim, republicanism limits the scope of public health as currently practiced, since the relatively attenuated democratic pedigree of administrative agencies limits their mandate. On this sort of view, public health should be more subject to democratic control. But making public health more democratic to avoid worries about non-domination so understood engenders its own problems. One worry is that the rich notions of the public and citizenship as proposed by civic republicans are objectionably demanding, given the amount of time individuals would have to spend engaged in the work of politics (Latham 2016). More fundamentally, to claim that public health needs to be much more democratic and, therefore, that it enjoys less legitimacy than public health advocates currently claim appears to undercut the initial motivation for adopting republicanism: to find a theory that is better-suited than liberalism for legitimating a broad mandate for public health.
Another worry specific to public health ethics concerns how much of the public health portfolio actually engages in activities that promote freedom as non-domination. While many public health interventions, such as those that regulate the health claims of food and drug manufacturers, can plausibly be construed as helping to advance freedom as non-domination, many others are harder to fit under this description. Consider, for example, infectious disease surveillance and vaccine programs, or educational campaigns promoting physical activity. It is something of a stretch to claim that these kinds of public health policies and practices constitute an improvement to freedom as non-domination. But even if we accept such a description, any advances to freedom as non-domination seem to be a desirable side effect of the policy rather than the real grounds for enacting it. Others – e.g., (Viens 2016) – charge that the emphasis on individual freedom as non-domination is not much of an improvement over individual freedom as non-interference, since public health should ultimately be concerned with the well-being of populations rather than individuals.
Perhaps because of these concerns, some who take a republican approach to public health ethics work with a more expansive understanding of the appropriate role of government in public health, one that includes advancing the common good as well as promoting freedom as non-domination (Jennings 2007, 46-47). Yet if the promotion of the common good ultimately justifies a justification for public health policy, then it would seem that we are stuck with something close to the familiar tension between individual freedom, albeit construed as freedom as non-domination, and the common good – the tension that animates the concerns of those operating out of the liberal tradition. And just as the liberal faces questions about how to reconcile tensions between the common good and freedom as non-interference, it would seem the republican faces difficult questions about how to reconcile tensions between the common good and freedom as non-domination.
3.5 Frameworks that Include both Justice and Legitimacy Considerations
As we noted in the introduction to this entry, many real-world challenges in public health require attending to both questions of justice as well as questions of legitimacy in order to provide an adequate analysis of what is morally at stake. In keeping with this observation, some have proposed approaches to public health ethics that accord normative importance to individual liberty while also allowing for the possibility that, depending on the context, other moral considerations may justifiably outweigh or override this normative importance. Several influential frameworks for public ethics that are meant to provide practical guidance to public health professionals who wish to consider ethical issues in their decision-making are structured around this view (Kass 2002; Childress et al. 2002; Marckmann et al. 2015; Petrini 2010; ten Have et al. 2010). A common thread in these approaches is an endorsement of something like principlism developed by Tom Beauchamp and James Childress in their influential work on biomedical ethics (Beauchamp and Childress 2019). Ethical decision-making is understood to require the balancing or weighing of different moral considerations whose relative relevance or importance can only be discerned in the context of a specific policy or action.
In addition to concerns about legitimacy, individual liberty and autonomy, justice, overall benefit and efficiency, these models generally include other substantive moral considerations such as expressing solidarity, building trust, and giving reasons to the public (Childress et al. 2002) as well as procedural conditions to help guarantee a fair decision process (Marckmann, et al. 2015; Bernstein et al. 2020).
Each of these substantive moral considerations can provide a prima facie justification for implementing or rejecting a policy. However, when these considerations conflict, we must assess their relative importance for the public health policy at issue. Ultimately, both public health ethicists and public health decision-makers need to employ considerable practical judgment to weigh these different kinds of considerations in a particular public health context to determine what policy, if any, ought to be implemented.
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We thank Anne Barnhill and Michael DiStefano for helpful feedback on earlier versions of this draft. We gratefully acknowledge Kelly Whalen for her invaluable assistance in preparing this manuscript.