Pufendorf’s Moral and Political Philosophy

First published Fri Sep 3, 2010; substantive revision Wed Mar 31, 2021

Samuel Freiherr von Pufendorf (1632–1694) was almost as unknown during most of the 19th and 20th centuries as he had been familiar during the preceding hundred years and more. His fate shows well how philosophical interests shape historical background narratives. More or less consciously, individual thinkers and the traditions they spawn frame themselves in terms of an edited past which – as in other forms of genealogy – they either appropriate, reject, revise, or ignore. Thus intellectual ancestry is always more controversial than biological inheritance, and the mere presence or absence of thinkers in particular developmental accounts is not necessarily an accurate indication of their actual historical role or importance.

Pufendorf’s thought is situated in post-Westphalian Europe, as the Holy Roman Empire underwent a reconfiguration of power relationships among its quasi-autonomous constituent states (Austria, Bavaria, Palatinate, Saxony, Brandenburg, and others), while maintaining a guarded posture toward external, competing powers such as France, England, the United Provinces, Sweden, Denmark, Poland, and Spain. Its main goals were to avoid relapse into confessional warfare, and to ward off the respective French and Ottoman threats on its western and eastern borders. In this context Pufendorf developed a theory about the moral relationships of agents (individuals and groups), the authority and duties of states, and the lawful interactions among these. His chief objective, too, was to avoid destructive social conflict and the devolution on any level into the antagonistic and, he thought, self-defeating condition known as the state of nature.

Pufendorf’s approach was secular, non-metaphysical, and anti-authoritarian; it eschewed religious appeals, scholastic dogma, essentialism, teleology, and the frequent mix of these that appealed to many German thinkers, Catholic and Protestant alike. Instead, it built on Bodin, Lipsius, Grotius, Hobbes, and the Italian reason-of-state tradition. Because of it, Pufendorf is known as a voluntarist in ethics, a sovereignty theorist in politics, and a realist in international relations theory. His kind of natural law is called ‘modern’ or ‘Protestant’ (Tuck 1987, Haakonssen 2004), in contrast to the metaphysical, neoscholastic, rationalist, or even Platonic version of the genre represented not only by the School of Salamanca (Suarez, Vitoria) but also Leibniz and then Wolff. Known as a philosopher and a jurist, Pufendorf was also a respected historian whose accounts of (mostly, the external relations of) various European states exemplified his basic philosophical concepts. He wrote notably on church-state relations, on intellectual and religious toleration, and on the Baconian theme of innovation in philosophy. Because of the clarity and comprehensiveness of his works, their intellectual acuity, and their polemical edge and consequent notoriety, they were translated into many European languages and thus provided – often in the form of pedagogical tools – many of the basic concepts and distinctions operative in the 18th-century discourse about morality, society, politics, history, and international affairs. Indeed, both directly and through his many editors, translators, and imitators, Pufendorf was largely responsible for the so-called ubiquity of natural law as a shared discourse during the following century (Haakonssen 2012).

1. Life & Works

Samuel Pufendorf was born on January 8, 1632 in Dorfchemnitz, a small town southwest of Chemnitz in Saxony. The region’s Protestant elector, Johann Georg, had just been compelled by the Imperial Edict of Restitution (1629), and by Tilly’s sack of Magdeburg (1631), to abandon his neutral stance in the Thirty Years War and join the newly arrived (1630) Swedes under Gustavus Adolphus in an anti-Habsburg alliance. This, and his return to the Imperial fold in 1635, exposed his territories to previously avoided predations that would influence the young Pufendorf’s outlook on the Empire, religion, and political power – if not also the human condition more generally. Samuel’s father, Esaias Pufendorf, assumed the Lutheran pastorate at nearby Flöha in 1633, and it was there a few years later that the family experienced first-hand the terrors of the war (Döring 1996a). There were ten children beside Samuel, seven of whom survived to adulthood. Of these he was the second youngest of four brothers, some three years behind Esaias (1628–1687), who would become one of Europe’s most accomplished diplomats and remained, as well, Samuel’s lifelong confidant and benefactor (Bérenger 1993, Fiedler 2003). The dedication in Pufendorf’s Select Academic Dissertations (DAS 1675b) acknowledges the debt.

Like his brothers, Pufendorf was home-schooled until age thirteen (1645), when his poverty and Latinity qualified him for admission to the subsidized Fürstenschule at Grimma, near Leipzig. There he studied grammar, logic, rhetoric, the Bible, Lutheran theology, and the Greek and Latin classics (Meyer 1894). His particular relish for the latter laid the foundations of the broad philological competence evident in and formative of his natural law writings. Indeed, shortly before leaving for Leipzig in the fall of 1650 he was chosen to compose a Latin poem celebrating the 100th anniversary of the school.

Leipzig: The university at Leipzig was far more cultivated and diverse than acknowledged by 19th-century authors like Treitschke (Treitschke 1897; Döring 2004, 1994), though it remained a center of Lutheran orthodoxy, polemically anti-Calvinist and anti-Catholic, and generally devoted to a metaphysical scholasticism and Aristotelianism closely tied to theology. Samuel’s studies there included this discipline, which his father had intended as a preparation for the ministry. However, like his brother Esaias, and as indicated by his own extra-curricular activities in the Collegium Anthologicum – a student academic society before which he made some fifty presentations on philological, biblical, historical, and political themes (in KVS 1995e, pp. 21–86]; see Döring 1988,1992) – he also expanded his studies into other areas including philosophy, jurisprudence, and mathematics. He remained at Leipzig until early 1658, with an intervening year (1657) at Jena where he received his Magister (bachelor’s) degree. In Jena, Pufendorf (like Leibniz after him) lived and studied with Erhard Weigel (1625–1699), the eclectic mathematician and polymath (who had moved there from Leipzig several years earlier) by whom he was introduced to Galileo, Grotius, Descartes, and Hobbes – authors without whom his future views would have been unimaginable. It was from Weigel, too, that Pufendorf seems to have derived the important distinction between physical and moral entities, as well as the methodological ideal of a mathematically rigorous, or demonstrative system of moral philosophy (Sprenger 1996) to which he initially aspired (especially in distinguishing himself from Aristotelian virtue theory).

Denmark: Sweden’s involvement in the Thirty Years War and its stake in the Westphalian treaty that ended it increased the presence of its aristocrats at many German courts and universities, including Leipzig and Heidelberg. Esaias had already parlayed such contacts into a Swedish diplomatic career and now urged his brother to do the same, in view of the limited professional prospects in Saxony. Thus, in April 1658 Samuel assumed the post of tutor to the family of Sweden’s special envoy to Copenhagen, Peter Julius Coyet. This choice proved eventful, for when Charles X. Gustav unexpectedly renewed the First Northern War (1655–1660) against Denmark, the Swedish delegation was imprisoned for eight months. It was then, without access to library or books, that Pufendorf wrote his first major work, Elements of Universal Jurisprudence (EJU 1660), which is explicitly based on Grotius and Hobbes. Upon being released in 1659, and after a serious illness and nearly dying by shipwreck in the Baltic, Pufendorf went to Holland as Coyet’s secretary. In spring 1660 he was enrolled at Leiden University, and though we have few details about this period it appears that he turned to philology again. He became acquainted with the classical scholar Johann Friedrich Gronovius and prepared editions of several Neo-Latin works, including Johannes Meursius, Miscellanea Laconica (1660) and Johannes Lauremberg, Graecia antiqua (1661). More important, however, was his acquaintance with Peter de Groot, Hugo’s son and the Palatine Elector’s representative in Holland. For it was at his suggestion that Pufendorf strategically dedicated his captivity manuscript to Karl Ludwig (1617–1680), who promptly responded with the offer of a university position at Heidelberg (Döring 2006).

Heidelberg: The Palatinate was one of the most devastated and depopulated regions during the Thirty Years War, and its university reopened only in 1652. Karl Ludwig sought initially to install Pufendorf in the (upper) law faculty there, as there was a vacancy in Roman law (Justinian’s Institutes). However, when both Pufendorf and the faculty senate demurred, the offer became a professorship in “philology and the law of nations” within the (lower, or preparatory) philosophy faculty – a position that addressed both the university’s needs and Pufendorf’s more obvious qualifications. There is no clear basis for Pufendorf’s claim to have held the very first chair in “the law of nature and of nations” in Germany, and no support for the academic legend that he later sought a position in the law faculty and, when passed over, spitefully wrote The Present State of Germany (Monz. 1667) – a severe critique of legal theories about the Empire – to prove his qualifications (Döring 2006). Much of Pufendorf’s time in Heidelberg was taken up with lecturing (on Grotius and Tacitus), and with developing the ideas of the Elements, particularly through a series of dissertations that – according to the practice of the time – were written mostly by himself but defended orally by his students. The latter included a number of Swedish nobles – such as his former charge, the young (Wilhelm Julius) Coyet, and the son of the Swedish chancellor Gabriel Gabrielsson Oxenstierna, and the (illegitimate) son of the late Charles X. Gustav (Gustav Carlsson) – some of whom also resided with Pufendorf. These and other services on behalf of Sweden’s interests in Heidelberg, and the continuing support of Esaias, led to the offer, in late 1666, of a position at the newly established University of Lund (in Scania, the Danish province recently acquired by Sweden). Pufendorf’s departure from Heidelberg was apparently a career move and he always spoke positively of his time there, explicitly valuing the “freedom to philosophize” that he had enjoyed (Jägerskjöld 1985).

Sweden: Pufendorf arrived in Lund in mid-1668 to assume his position as professor primarius of the law of nature and of nations (in the Law faculty), and of ethics and politics (in the Philosophy faculty). Immediately popular as a teacher, well-connected at court, as well as confident and outspoken, he was soon embroiled in personal and academic conflicts with some of his colleagues, particularly the jurist Nikolaus Beckmann and the theologian Josua Schwartz, who recruited the Lutheran bishop of Lund (Peter Winstrup) to their cause. Their discontent with Pufendorf’s On the Law of Nature and of Nations (DJN 1672), whose publication they actively tried to hinder, was articulated in An Index of Certain Novelties … against the Foundations of Orthodoxy (Index quarundam novitatum … contra orthodoxa fundamenta [1673]) – a list of thirty-one supposed errors in that work. The religious coloration of some accusations made it a dangerous matter for Pufendorf, yet he managed through his court connections to suppress both the Index and the relentless attacks in Lund (Beckmann was eventually banished). Still, the Index led to the prohibition of Pufendorf’s work in Saxony and embroiled him in bitter conflicts with professors there for many years. His articulate responses during this prolonged debate, including his self-justificatory autobiography, were later published under the title of Scandinavian Quarrel (ES 1686c). The collection not only reveals Pufendorf as a consummate polemicist but is also valuable for the clarification of important points in his natural law treatises, and as an entry into the bitter debates (in Germany) between secular natural lawyers and the Lutheran scholastics and theologians whom they challenged (De Angelis 2004).

In 1673 Pufendorf published On the Duty of Man and Citizen According to Natural Law (DO 1673), a short compendium based on DJN that guaranteed him a place in university curricula for a century. Moreover, a collection of his dissertations from both the Heidelberg and Lund periods appeared in 1675 as Select Academic Dissertations (DAS). That year also saw the appearance of a lengthy political tract (Discussion of Certain Writers of Brandenburg [Discussio, in KVS 1995e, pp. 235–336]) justifying Sweden’s entry into the Dutch War (1672–1678) on the side of France, particularly its unprovoked attack (1674) on Brandenburg. This war also occasioned a Danish invasion of Scania, including Lund, and even though the young Charles XI (1655–1697) defeated the invaders, the university remained closed for years. So Pufendorf moved to Stockholm (1677), assuming the duties of royal Swedish historiographer and, later, privy councillor and private secretary (1682) to the dowager queen, Hedwig Eleonora. He continued to cultivate his relations with the Swedish ruling class, wrote additional political opinions (including Dissertation on the Alliances between Sweden and France [Occas. 1680, in KVS, pp. 337–385]; see Saunders 2009), and began the laborious archival work that underlay his large histories of Sweden (Gust. Ad., C. Gust.). These accounts focused mainly on external, international affairs. However, Pufendorf’s detailed knowledge of internal Swedish politics is evident in Les anecdotes de Suède (Pufendorf 1719), which was written during Sweden’s turn toward royal absolutism in the 1680s (the Reduktion). That piece has sometimes been attributed to Esaias, though there is an autograph in Samuel’s hand (Döring 2012, p. 199, n. 58).

Pufendorf had also lectured on history at Lund and Heidelberg, and in 1682 after the appearance of a pirated, Swedish version of this material based on student notes, he issued (one of only two works in German) An Introduction to the History of the Principal Kingdoms and States of Europe (Einl.). The twelfth chapter of this work contains a long, critical account of the papacy that had appeared pseudonymously several years earlier (Basilii Hyperetae historische und politische Beschreibung der geistlichen Monarchie des Stuhls zu Rom [1679]). Moreover, through the 1695 English version it acquired a thirteenth chapter, which is a actually a condensation – by the translator (Jodocus Crull, see Seidler 2013) – of the independent volume on Sweden (Continued Introduction [Einl. 1686b]) whereby Pufendorf had supplemented the Introduction in 1686. Both Introductions underwent multiple editions in many languages well into the 18th century. During the early 1680s Pufendorf also prepared a significantly revised edition (1684) of DJN which emphasized the similarities to Cumberland and Stoicism (Palladini 2002, Saastamoinen 1999/2000) to make its problematic Hobbesian inheritance less obvious and, perhaps, his life easier (Palladini 1990, 2008).

Berlin: During one of his trips to the Continent to gather archival materials and see to the publication of his Twenty-six Books of Commentary on Swedish Affairs from the Expedition of King Gustav Adolph into Germany up to the Abdication of [Queen] Christina (Gust. Ad. 1686a), Pufendorf entered into negotiations with the Great Elector, Frederick William of Brandenburg, who issued a formal invitation in 1686. This was doubly attractive at the time. For not only had Brandenburg replaced Sweden as the main defender of an increasingly beleaguered Protestantism, now squeezed between Austria and France, but Sweden’s internal affairs had taken a sharp turn to the right, toward monarchical absolutism and religious conservatism. In Berlin, by contrast, Frederick William’s long-standing toleration politics met Louis XIV’s recent revocation of the Edict of Nantes with the Edict of Potsdam (1685), which invited the fleeing Huguenots to his territories. Also in Stockholm, despite Pufendorf’s still close relations to Charles XI and Hedwig Eleonora, some of his main supporters at court had been dismissed, and his brother Esaias – whose pro-French stance was now out of favor – would soon leave Swedish service (1687) and be sentenced to death in absentia (1689). Among the last works written by Pufendorf in Sweden was a defense of Cartesianism (in the sense of independent philosophical inquiry) against the Swedish clergy, who had sought to ban it from the universities there (in KVS 1995e, pp. 432–47), and Of the Nature and Qualification of Religion in Reference to Civil Society (Habitu 1687), a treatise that condemned the French dragonades and argued for the separation of church and state as a means to religious toleration.

Given the Swedes’ past hostilities with Brandenburg, Pufendorf’s thorough knowledge of their archives, and the fact that he had yet to complete his history of Charles X. Gustav, the Swedes were loath to send him to Berlin. However, after considerable delay he was given what was technically a leave of absence (Döring 1996b, Riches 2004, 2013). He arrived in Berlin in early 1688, actually to prepare a history of Frederick William (who died later that year) but formally as an aulic and privy councillor, positions with greater status at court than royal historian. During the next six years Pufendorf completed his history of the Great Elector (Fr. Wilh. 1695b) and began an account of his successor, Frederick III (1657–1713), which is notable for its long (and unregarded) narrative of the 1688 English Revolution (Pufendorf 1784, see Seidler 1996). Moreover, he prepared a revised edition of The Present State of Germany (published by Nikolaus Gundling in 1706) and he wrote The Divine Feudal Law (Feciale 1695a), a work on inter-confessional reconciliation (among Lutherans and Calvinists) and, barring that, religious and political toleration. In 1694 Pufendorf returned briefly to Sweden to arrange for the publication of his On the Deeds of Charles Gustav, King of Sweden (C. Gust. 1696), to collect a baronetcy (thus, his Freiherr status), and to conduct some diplomatic business between the two monarchs. A stroke or aneurism while in Stockholm led to other medical complications that resulted in his death, in Berlin, on Oct. 26, 1694. Quite appropriately, given his life-long interest in lay theology and his involvement with informal religious gatherings called collegia pietatis, as well as his emphasis on the biblical and moral dimensions of religion rather than its doctrinal aspects, the funeral sermon at the Nikolai-Kirche, where he lies buried, was delivered by his close friend, Philipp Jakob Spener (1635–1705), one of the founders of German Pietism.

2. The Method of Modern Natural Law

2.1 Modern Natural Law

The intellectual tradition with which Pufendorf is associated, and to which he was later seen as central, has been variously termed modern, secular, or Protestant. Indeed, the first chapter of his Sample of Controversies (Specimen controversiarum, 1678; in ES) originated the historiography of the genre. (See section 5.2 below.) As critics of that self-interpretation have pointed out and Pufendorf himself admitted, elements of the approach were already present in previous traditions, including Stoicism, Roman law, Christian and scholastic thought (particularly Vitoria, Vasquez, and Suarez), and the Grotius commentary literature (Tierney 1997, Brett 1997, Haakonssen 1998, Seelmann 2000, Oakley 2005, Behme 1996, Hartung 2008, Reibstein 1953–54). Still, Pufendorf and those who shared his outlook claimed a kind of Baconian novelty for their enterprise. This lay in its eschewal of metaphysics and theology as foundations for philosophy, in its rejection of appeals to authority, and in its assertion of an ‘eclectic’ privilege not only to mix and compare different perspectives, but also to place new bodies of knowledge on a so-called scientific footing (BW #137, 1996, p.194; Hochstrasser 2000). The founder (in the sense of first practitioner) of this so-called “noble discipline of natural law” was according to Pufendorf “the incomparable Hugo Grotius,” who “set out to construct a work wherein he was not ruled by the influence of his precedessors” and that resisted the fragmenting tendencies of discrepant opinions (ES 2002b, p. 126). Pufendorf’s assessment was seconded by his French translator, Jean Barbeyrac (1674–1744), who noted too – in his famous Preface (1706), §28 – that with Bacon and Grotius “the Science of Morality was … rais’d again from the Dead” (in DJN 2005 [1729], p. 78), and that it was Pufendorf who had corrected, improved, and systematized it. (§31)

The controversial beginning (and eventual locus classicus) of the new approach, which would aspire to rigor and persuasion in morals and politics in the way that Descartes had sought them for science and metaphysics, was Grotius’s “Preliminary Discourse” or “Prolegomena” (§§ 5–8) to On the Right of War and Peace (1625). For there, the Dutch classicist, ambassador, and corporate counsel for the Dutch East India Company challenged the moral relativism advocated by the ancient skeptic, Carneades, by laying out the basic requirements of communal living. Unlike Carneades, his professional concerns were not epistemological argument, moral proof, or philosophical system as such, but rather the concrete mitigation of conflicts and the maintenance of peace. Appealing to a so-called principle of sociality or sociability (conceived as both presupposition and requirement), he sought to identify the most general or minimal, and thus most widely acceptable, rights and laws of human association. These focused mainly, in his own case, on international matters of war and peace, but in other natural lawyers like Pufendorf they addressed the entire range of human affairs. The modernity of the project, as well as its secularism, lay as noted in the intentional avoidance of biblical, theological, and confessional presuppositions, and in the rejection of the essentialism and associated teleology of classical (abstract) realism – which were thought to generate or exacerbate rather than to resolve intellectual and practical controversies (Forbes 1975, Tuck 1979 and 1987, Todescan 2001, Ekardt and Richter 2006, Hunter 2007b). Instead, and in the manner of the physical sciences, the new discipline devised explanations that emulated (somehow) mathematical reasoning and appealed to concrete observation, attempting thereby to create a shared outlook possessing theoretical coherence, empirical plausibility, and pragmatic effect (Röd 1970, Dufour 1980).

This reading of the modern natural law project is rooted in the texts, it was promoted by Barbeyrac, and it has been persuasively articulated mainly by Tuck (1979, 1987). However, aside from criticisms focused on its casting of Grotius and Hobbes (Mautner 2005, Sommerville 2001, Zagorin 2000), it also seems wanting now as a comprehensive interpretation of Pufendorf by being too inattentive to his more immediate social and intellectual contexts. These included the political and confessional status of the Empire and, more specifically, the metaphysical, theological, and Lutheran culture of northern Germany, Saxony in particular – as represented by conservative, Platonizing scholastics like Johann Benedict Carpzov, Adam Scherzer, Valentin Veltheim, and Valentin Alberti, with whom Pufendorf and his younger colleague, Christian Thomasius (1655–1728), contended through much of their academic lives (Hunter 2007b, 2001; Palladini 1978; Sparn 1976). This conflict was practical and immediate as well as theoretical, affecting German academic culture for another century up to and including Kant (Hunter 2005). For the opponents propounded a theocratic politics guided by Scriptural interpretation and supernatural metaphysics accessible only or especially to (philosophical) theologians, in contrast to the secular conception of the state and its subsidiary institutions (such as the judiciary and the universities) proposed by Pufendorf and Thomasius. In fact, the two readings may intersect and complement one another. For Grotius, Hobbes, and also Descartes (especially his idea of philosophical liberation and innovation) certainly influenced Pufendorf, albeit in a characteristically German, Protestant, and Lutheran setting that he helped to transform with their assistance (Friedeburg 2008, Friedeburg and Seidler 2007, Dufour 2005, Schmoeckel 2013b).

Clearly, early modern Protestantism was in this as well as other respects a house divided, pitting those inclined to transcendent metaphysics and theological authority against the innovators who rejected this approach. Of course, it is the latter stream – to which Grotius, Hobbes, Pufendorf, C. Thomasius, (and sometimes Wolff) are seen to belong – that is intended by the characterization of early modern natural law as distinctively ‘Protestant’. Because of its rejection of scholastic rationalism and universalism, and its interest in the particular, the singular, and the irregular (Seidler 2011) on various levels of analysis (i.e., its appreciation of difference and insistence on dissent, its ‘protestant’ and broadly anti-‘imperial’ character), the discipline is also aptly described as ‘individualistic’ (Haakonssen 2004). And this feature links it, in turn, to the characteristic ‘voluntarism’ of the genre (Schneewind 1998, Haakonssen 1998), in distinction to the generally intellectualist bent of both ancient and medieval natural law (Hunter 2003b, Haakonssen and Seidler 2015). Voluntarism acknowledged not only God’s supreme and singular omnipotence (exercised through the divine will), and thus the (to us) arbitrariness, contingency, and cognitive imperviousness of the (created) world, but also humans’ individual and collective power over, and thus responsibility for, their own actions and the institutional contexts regulating them. In sum, the approach was secular rather than atheistic, as it typically combined relatively sparse convictions derived from natural theology (understood as a minimalist philosophical view about a creative, providential deity and his formal role in generating moral obligation) with an emphasis on personal religiosity and confessional neutrality, especially in the political sphere. That is, it privatized (and to some extent moralized) religion, it demarcated theology from philosophy (Tully 1991), and it denied theoretical and political advantage to dogmatists, including those inclined to play the God card from the side of reason or philosophical metaphysics.

2.2 Pufendorf’s Philosophical Method

Like other early modern reformist schemes, Pufendorf’s project faced the central question of method in more specific terms. Initially he followed the example of Weigel, his Cartesian mentor at Jena (whose own Arithmetic Description of Moral Wisdom would appear only in 1674; see Weigel 2003), by employing a quasi-mathematical approach that aspired to demonstrative certitude in moral matters in place of Aristotelian probabilism. Thus, the early EJU (1660) was formally divided into Definitions (Bk.1) and Principles (Bk.2), with the latter subdivided into Axioms and Observations. The truth and necessity of the Axioms flowed directly “from reason itself” and a “bare intuition of the mind,” without the apprehension of particulars, or interpersonal discussion, while the certainty of the Observations was known by the “collation and perception of individual things corresponding to one another,” and by “common sense and experience” (EJU 1999, pp. 6, 117; Dufour 1980, Röd 1970, Bach 2013).

However, Pufendorf adapted this approach in subsequent works. Though he purported still to favor a ‘mathematical’ over an (“lubrica, infinita, et vere invia”) empirical approach when writing to (Johan Christian von) Boineburg (1622–1672) in January 1663 (BW #16, 1996, p. 24), criticism by Hermann Conring (1601–1681) and Johann Heinrich Boecler (1611–1672; see Palladini 1997a), which urged him to include a consideration of other writers, particularly the ancients, soon led to a change in style. Thus, beginning with his dissertations at Heidelberg, and then in the major natural law writings at Lund that emerged therefrom, Pufendorf eliminated the formal scaffolding of the mos geometricus and interacted more explicitly and directly with other, historical authors. The new approach enlisted his considerable erudition (DAS cites over two hundred sources) – in a transitional culture where a reputation for being learned remained important – while avoiding mere commentary or appeal to intellectual authority, procedures which he explicitly dismissed. Instead, Pufendorf now employed an ‘eclectic’ method that still involved rational analysis and argument, to be sure, but that also acknowledged the contingency of both his worldly subject matter and its intellectual construal (Hochstrasser 2000). The goal remained comprehensive understanding and demonstrative certitude, but one informed by wide and reflectively appropriated experience (derived from a careful study of history and contemporary events), and thus yielding a more empirically grounded and realistic (think Thucydides, Tacitus, Machiavelli, Lipsius, Hobbes) sort of moral and political argument.

3. Moral Philosophy

Pufendorf’s ethical voluntarism is articulated through the notion of “moral entities” (entia moralia, derived from Weigel), to which most of EJU Book I is devoted (Röd 1969, Kobusch 1996, Lutterbeck 2009, Hunter 2019). Moral entities specify the basic terms, concepts, categories, distinctions, and classifications – in a sense, the metaethical grammar and vocabulary – out of which shared moral discourse is constituted. Conversely, they designate the ontological correlates or referents of this discourse, which are reliant on and yet distinct from the merely physical beings or settings in which they actually inhere. (See Statu #1, 1990, pp. 83–84, 109–10), for the compositional metaphor.) Much of the machinery of moral entities was carried forward from the EJU to DJN where, after being formally elaborated in the early chapters, it clearly structures the whole work.

3.1 Moral Entities

Pufendorf begins DJN by noting the relative inattention to moral entities as such in comparison to the much-studied objects of the physical sciences, even though “it greatly behooves man to know the nature of such entities, which he has received the faculty to produce, and whose power deeply suffuses itself throughout his life” (I.1.1; Pufendorf 1994a, p. 99). He calls them “modes” – in accord with their dependence on self-subsistent entities (cf. Forde 2011, on Lockean “mixed modes”) – and says that they are invented (inventis) by reflective beings who, by comparing things, form certain notions “superadded” to or “imposed” on the world in order to direct or temper free and voluntary human acts. (DJN I.1.2–3) Some moral entities are said to “flow naturally from things themselves, as it were, while others are superadded to physical things … by an intelligent power” (DJN I.1.3; Pufendorf 1994a, p. 100). This is a relative distinction within Pufendorf’s general voluntarist framework, where God is thought to impose a basic normative dimension on the world (conjointly and compatibly with its creation), but where humans in fact devise the (further) distinctions that regulate their lives together – both in philosophizing about these and by enacting concrete practices and institutions to regulate them. Accordingly, one might describe the former as foundational or structural categories, and the latter as subsidiary, instrumental, or discretionary tools of analysis. All moral entities, however, of whatever type, depend for their existence on the will of intelligent beings who externally assign normative, action-directing significance to things intrinsically lacking this, but nonetheless somehow compatible with or receptive to it.

There are four types of moral entities, says Pufendorf, analogous to categories applied to physical things: (1) states or conditions (status), (2) substances (specifically, persons), and modes in a more specific sense – namely, (3) moral qualities (affective/effective modes) and (4) moral quantities (estimative modes). As in the physical realm, moral ‘states’ designate a kind of (moral-legal) space in which persons (like bodies) operate and orient themselves; they are sub-posed by the latter even though they also, in a sense, depend on them for their existence. Pufendorf distinguishes two such states, natural and adventitious, the former referring to the natural state occupied by all humans as such (thus, the “state of humanity”), and the latter to the special conditions, institutions, or standing (e.g., commercial, marital, civil) that differentially accompany it, in being created by and imposed on particular sorts of persons. Personhood or moral substantiality refers in turn to the various roles or agencies that humans play or assume in such contexts, either simply as individuals, or as composites or collectives, and either on their own behalf or for others (e.g., sovereigns, ambassadors). Since we typically enact multiple, overlapping moral personae, it is possible for these to conflict, not only in the case of individuals but also collectives like economic associations, religious groups, and political entities like states, empires, or confederations. It is therefore important to articulate the respective obligations and rights of (different kinds of) persons, and to assess and rank them in terms of their relative moral importance.

Such distinctions require the use of moral qualities and quantities, which are respectively affective and estimative modes. The latter involve the valuation of persons, things, or actions in terms of their social status or esteem, their price (economic value), or their desert (as in punishment and reward) – all of which are inexact, comparative, and subject to alteration or adjustment (i.e., moral imposition is an ongoing process) (Seidler 2018). Moral qualities, in turn, affect (have an effect on) persons and are either formal (e.g., titles) or operative, with the latter subdivided into passive and active varieties. Passive operative qualities enable someone “rightly to have, suffer, admit, or receive something” (DJN I.1.20), while active operative qualities are those by which we can morally affect or move others, as it were. (See Auer 2008, for an association with Hohfeld.) They are divided into the more familiar notions of power/authority (potestas), obligation (obligatio), and right (ius) – which constitute the moral dynamics of social life. All such notions or entities, it is important to keep in mind, are imposed or assigned rather than given or found; the scheme is fundamentally ‘positivistic’.

The inherited term ‘right’ (ius) is ambiguous, says Pufendorf, and it sometimes stands for law (lex). Though it may also be classed as a passive moral quality (as in allowing someone rightly [recte] to receive things), it is active insofar as it permits us to command persons and possess things. It is similar, in the latter respect, to power or authority (potestas), which is subdivided into four types depending on whether it is wielded over persons or things – either one’s own or those of others. Authority over one’s own person and actions is freedom (libertas), and over those of others sovereignty (imperium); moral power over one’s own things is ownership or dominion (dominium), and over those of others lordship (servitus). Each kind of power may be acquired, lost, or held in certain ways: for example, the efficacy or strength of authority may be ‘perfect’ (complete, exceptionless, enforceable) or ‘imperfect’ (limited, flexible, merely hortatory or desirable), as may the force of rights; and the rest of DJN is essentially an account of how this occurs in the different areas (spaces, or states) of life. The influence of Pufendorf’s distinctions and their exhaustive application to particular life sectors was enormous, creating the basic scaffolding of modern moral discourse. (See Hruschka [2015 et alia].)

3.2 Moral Necessity

Obligation refers to the “moral necessity” at work in such relationships, by which one is “bound” to do, admit, or suffer something (DJN I.1.21), and thus it applies to all spheres where authority, right, or other forms of moral normativity operate. Pufendorf clarifies obligation at DJN I.6, in his discussion of law, sanction, and the claims of lawgivers. Law differs, he says there (referring to Hobbes, On the Citizen [De cive {1642}] 14.1), from counsel, agreement, and right alike, because by it an obligation is “introduced into a man’s mind by a superior, that is by someone who not only has the strength to threaten some evil against those who resist him, but also legitimate reasons allowing him to demand that our freedom be restricted at his discretion.” (DJN I.6.9; Pufendorf 1994a, p.123) That is, obligation has a dual aspect involving both reason and strength, neither of which can separately give rise to it: the former generates reverence or respect in those who are (or take themselves to be) obligated, and the latter fear. Both are needed, since reverence without fear does not explain the compellingness of obligation, while fear without reverence does not explain its legitimacy (DJN III.4.6). This analysis applies to obligation under both divine and human law, and in the former case, especially, it raises the question of whether voluntarism or intellectualism, or an amalgam, offers a more adequate account of moral duty. The matter has been much debated, starting with Leibniz’s critique (1706; in Leibniz 1972) and Barbeyrac’s defense (1718; in Pufendorf 2003) of Pufendorf (see Schneewind 1996a; Hunter 2004; Lipscomb 2005; Haakonssen 1998; Grunert 2000), and still in recent discussions (see section 5.3 below) of normativity referring back to those earlier treatments (Darwall 2012, Irwin 2011a–b, Pink 2009).

More so than Grotius, Pufendorf clearly distinguished natural and moral goods (DJN I.2.6), maintaining that the former are morally indifferent even if generally agreed upon by humans (DJN I.4.4, II.3.4). Thus, since moral norms are not directly linked to the intrinsic natures or purposes of things, or to the outcomes of actions, he was neither a teleologist nor a consequentialist in ethics (in the sense of maintaining an obligation to achieve or realize natural ‘goods’ or ‘the good’, which are assumed already to be morally compelling). However, the so-called natural goodness or evil of things, their ability to benefit or harm us, provide the rationale for the imposition of moral entities by intelligent beings from which obligation springs. That is, they have (especially in the case of natural goods) a sort of evidentiary function, explaining why the obliger wills such-and-such, and why the obligee wills (or might be motivated to) its acceptance. Thus, when discussing moral persons Pufendorf says that the impositions which produce that rank or status should have a positive effect (solidus effectus) on humankind and not be made frivolously, as when Caligula declared his horse a senator, when the ancient Romans deified their emperors, and when papists, still, declare saints by a similar sort of post-mortem canonization – all with normative impact (DJN I.1.15). Similarly, when explaining the legitimating aspect of commands or obligations (human or divine), or that in them which evokes our reverence or respect, Pufendorf stresses the commanding party’s ability and willingness to benefit (or his having done so) those on whom the obligation lies (DJN I.6.12, DO I.5). In sum, while natural good and evil are not the source of obligation per se, and moral necessity is not hypothetical in that sense, they do explain why there is such a thing as obligation at all, or what the point of it is. Moreover, since what benefits or harms humans is known through experience, empirical investigation, and knowledge of the past (history), these operate as heuristics for determining our obligations and explain why, in some cases, there may be disagreement about them. Of course, such differences do not concern whether moral commands as such formally obligate or not, but whether specific actions are in fact morally commanded. That at least some of them are (Pufendorf also allowed for indifferent actions), and that in particular moral spaces or contexts we can usually determine which ones, is a basic assumption of Pufendorf’s theory.

3.3 The Natural State

The concept of a natural state is so important to Pufendorf’s theory that he considered political tracts which ignore it “gravely defective” (Statu #1, 1990, p. 110). The idea is discussed in no less than five of his works (EJU, DJN, DO, DAS, and ES), which basically agree on its characterization and distinctions (Seidler 1990, Fetscher 1960). DJN alone contains two versions: one (II.2) to establish the general need for law and moral authority, and the other (VII.1) to justify civil power or political sovereignty (imperium). These two treatments share a common conception of legal obligation as justified imposition by a beneficent superior with access to sanctions. This does not make them redundant, however, even if the political institutions created to eliminate the second, pre-civil state of nature are enjoined by same natural law that also commands (or induces) humans to leave their prior, pre-cultural (and bestial) states. Civil sovereignty and its mechanisms are needed precisely because the cooperative institutions (e.g., language, contract, property, marriage, family, household) that lift humans out of their previous, natural condition eventually create analogous coordination problems on another level. Indeed, since similar difficulties arise among civil states themselves, in an international state of nature, there is need for yet another solution at that level. In sum, Pufendorf’s conceptions of morality, politics, and international law are set against analogous natural states at each level; this facilitates the respective analyses, though the remaining differences also prevent their standardization.

The first DJN treatment of the natural state is preceded by a chapter (II.1) on the concrete importance of law. This discussion provides a bridge between the conceptual analysis of law and obligation, in Book I, and the following chapter (II.2) on the natural state, which leads in turn to the derivation of the natural law in DJN II.3. In it, Pufendorf presents a moral anthropology suggesting what kinds of moral entities, or what obligations and laws, should be imposed in view of “the natural inclinations and pursuits of us mortals” (DJN II.1.6; Pufendorf 1994a, p. 138). These reveal – especially in comparison to beasts – that humans’ greater freedom would actually be disadvantageous to them without further regulation; that is, randomized freedom, or license, is self-defeating. The argument is expectably framed by Pufendorf’s general assumption that such counterproductivity would violate the divine intention of having human actions display a certain “order, decorum, or beauty” (DJN II.1.5; Pufendorf 1994a, p. 138); however, it is solidly based as well on a description of observable human tendencies and behaviors. The latter show humans to be weak, diverse, and sometimes perverse: not only are they anxious, ambitious, envious, superstitious, resentful, vain, vindictive, and the like; but they often disagree with one another as well, even themselves; and yet (unlike other living things) they are incapable of securing their basic needs without the aid of creatures like themselves. For mutual assistance to be possible, however, and to avoid the difficulties continually generated by the traits above, human action must be constrained by laws of freedom, as it were. Without these, humans would sink below the level of brutes, whose welfare is non-voluntarily secured by physical laws, and they would remain at liberty only to disrupt and destroy one another. This sort of inconsistency in human nature was – on religious, rational, prudential, and it seems aesthetic grounds – unacceptable to Pufendorf.

The natural state is a theoretical mechanism for further articulating these considerations. A relative notion, it appears in three distinct but overlapping versions, the third of which is specially elaborated by the DJN VII.1 account mentioned above. Each version involves a polarity or implied contrast: the natural state toward God (ad Deum), that in regard to oneself (in se), and that toward other human beings (ad alios homines). The first of these designates the human condition as such, conceived negatively as a “state of humanity” in contrast to both the amoral state of beasts but also “toward [or against] God.” Humans emerge from it – using their de facto traits and capacities (which Pufendorf associates with “soul”) – by moralizing themselves through social interaction, gradually articulating a normative sphere of rights and duties only formally imposed by their creator. The second natural state, with respect to oneself (in se), designates the basic helplessness of solitary humans and their almost inevitable lapse into an uncultivated, bestial life without mutual assistance. Classical accounts of this state depict individual humans as frustrated in their most basic needs and desires, and as incapable of the refinement needed to develop their distinctive faculties and exercise their freedom. Human interaction can sometimes and to some extent eliminate the natural state in this sense – a process facilitated by their prior, and concurrent, emergence from the mere state of humanity. As the third natural state shows, however, humans may also threaten, endanger, or interfere with one another unless their freedom is effectively restrained by law. Here law means more than the self-interpreted moral law already operative in the first two states of nature (which, pace Hobbes, are not entirely lawless or amoral); rather it refers to civil law which must be imposed by a political superior with both the authority and the effective power to command. Hence this natural state is best described as a pre-civil state, in contrast to the pre-cultural and merely human states. Note: in none of the three states does ‘natural’ function normatively in the sense of a model or ideal to be realized, as in some other forms of natural law theory. Instead, norms emerge as one leaves such natural conditions.

As already suggested, the three conditions overlap. Thus, imperfect humans always remain (albeit tenuously) in the initial state of (mere) humanity (DJN II.2.9–10), even when the other two natural states have been partially sublated by culture and politics; for they are always subject to, and somehow responsible for, the norms deriving from divine imposition or, alternatively, required by and for human beings as such. That is, as neither beasts nor gods, they lack the automatism of the former and the spontaneous goodness of the latter, and always carry a fallible burden of judgment, as it were. The latter two states may coincide as well, though usually incompletely, in that humans may exit a pre-cultural state of need while still in a pre-civil state of insecurity, or they may enjoy the security of a civil state while relatively deprived of cultural goods. As well, even though need satisfaction and cultural development typically occur before and apart from political order, in cities as opposed to states, the latter sometimes seem a precondition of the former processes – as Pufendorf knew well from the circumstances of the Thirty Years War.

The pre-cultural and pre-civil states of nature especially (i.e., those conditions respectively lacking in these respects) are further distinguished into full or perfect, and partial or limited versions. The former is purely mythical or hypothetical in that no humans can exist without their fellows. Complete non-cooperation or complete hostility are simply impossible, since no one would survive, and the only reason to consider such scenarios is as heuristic devices highlighting the conditions that humans actually inhabit (Behme 2009a). Indeed, as Rousseau would iterate in his own way, extreme versions of the natural state are mere extrapolations from the more limited, or mixed, conditions found in actual human history and experience – as when rival families, clans, states, or (occasionally) formerly cultivated and civil-ized individuals (e.g., Crusoe), are temporarily left to their own devices. Much of Pufendorf’s discussion on the topic takes place through critical interaction with Grotius, Hobbes, and Spinoza, whose comments on the natural state he appropriates, alters, or rejects. The paradoxical upshot of his examination is that humans as such never were, are, or will be in a pure, full, or perfect natural state, since it would be a completely barbarous, bellicose, and thus deadly condition. Thus far, Hobbes was correct. However, as Pufendorf says in rhetorical opposition to him, Hobbes rather overstated the case; for the natural state is actually a state of ‘peace’ (DJN II.2.7) – albeit an imperfect, unstable, and insecure peace (DJN II.2.12). Accordingly, humans cannot ever – at least in this life – entirely leave the natural state (in all three senses) behind, as they are always imperfectly socialized, (only) partially cultivated, and incompletely or inadequately civil-ized (politic-ized). This explains their lifelong subjection to moral law and obligation (however understood), and their need – Pufendorf thought – for some sort of civil subjugation. That is, insofar as they manage to survive and thrive at all, they do so through incompletely realized forms of social cooperation that must (in a variety of ways) be constantly maintained and improved.

3.4 The Law of Nature

Accordingly, “the most common rule [regula]” of actions, called the right (ius) or law (lex) of nature, enjoins that humans “must, inasmuch as [they] can, cultivate and maintain toward others a peaceable sociality that is consistent with the native character and end of humankind in general” (DJN II.3. 1 and 15; Pufendorf 1994a, pp. 148, 152). This law does not rest on an intrinsic morality of actions, an absolute value of persons, on common agreement among humans, or even on the long-term utility that generally follows compliance with its injunctions (DJN II.3.4, 7–8,10) – though the latter two are not denied. Rather, it appeals to a divine superior who is taken to enjoin that which right reason itself can discover to be in humans’ interest. (DJN II.3.19) That is, while the law’s content or practical purposiveness is articulated by right reason observing “man’s nature, condition, and inclinations, … other things external to man, especially those capable of benefiting or harming him in some way[,] … and the kinds of assistance and restraint he needs” (DJN II.3.14; Pufendorf 1994a, p. 151), its normative force as law depends formally on the will of a super-human authority with the power of sanction (DJN II.3.19–20). Pufendorf grants that the latter relationship remains “somewhat obscure” for those who follow the light of reason alone, since natural sanctions are imperfect and supernatural sanctions out of play (DJN II.3.21, III.4.6). However, the voluntarist problem of arbitrariness is avoided by positing (Pufendorf thinks proving, through natural theology [DO I.4]) divine benevolence (providence) and consistency: human nature and the law regulating it are willed together by God for human benefit (DJN II.3.4–5). (More agnostically, one might refer to the benignity of things, as it were, the starting assumption that, at the least, the world is not decidedly against us.) And that supposition in turn is supported by the evidence of actual experience (both historical and contemporary), which is in any case the only way to discern and understand the law’s requirements (DJN II.3.12). In short, God is not perverse, and the world not entirely inhospitable to morality and human welfare.

Pufendorf acknowledges the fundamental reality of self-love and the possibility of reading the natural law as a merely instrumental rule. However, he denies that self-love is the only human motive or necessarily in conflict with other motives, and argues that in fact its aims can be fully or really achieved only through the natural law; this does command humans to love themselves, albeit in a mitigated, restrained, and thus more successful way (DJN II.3.14 and 18). That is, humans are not totally selfish or totally altruistic, but partially both. Hence the natural law does not forbid the pursuit of self-interest but merely regulates it, enjoining both the care of self and the care of others that humans already seek (in a limited and inadequate fashion). If human nature tended toward one or other extreme, the law’s injunctions would be either impossible or unnecessary (i.e., pointless); it is precisely humans’ medial nature, their motivationally mixed constitution, that accounts for the law’s normative force – in both its rational (legitimate reasons) and sanctional (strength) aspects. The argument certainly requires its voluntarist (and theistic) premise, but it relies as much on the compatible (and, supposedly, confirmatory) deliverances of general human experience. In practice, given the stakes involved according to either interpretation, it often may not matter which is emphasized. And this was undoubtedly why (beside its non-theological foundation) Pufendorf’s more perceptive religious critics resisted it and often accused him of Hobbism, and why in turn his secular adherents were not alienated by the deity lingering in the background.

3.5 Types of Duties

Toward the end of his discussion of the natural law’s main principle, Pufendorf joins Hobbes in subsuming international (ius gentium) under natural law (DJN II.3.23) – which is critical for understanding both – and makes some distinctions that shape the rest of the work (Reibstein 1955, Seidler 2015). Like Grotius, he contrasts “matters which the natural law disposes by direct precept or prohibition from those that reason has persuaded men to institute on account of sociality, or that may be undertaken by virtue of a license flowing directly from these institutions – in which case they are said to have a reductive relation to the natural law” (DJN II.3.22; Pufendorf 1994a, p. 156; emphasis added). More formatively, he divides the law’s injunctions – loosely reflecting the divisions of the natural state – into those toward God (adversus Deum), toward ourselves (adversus seipsum), and toward other humans (adversus alios homines). The first category is treated separately in the pedagogically oriented DO (I.4), written while Pufendorf was fighting charges of atheism in Lund. However, DJN (II.4.3–4, III.4.4) folds it into the second group, particularly the law’s (i.e., God’s) command that we cultivate our minds by developing appropriate beliefs about God through careful consideration of the supposedly convincing arguments of natural theology – a strategy that recalls the difficulties noted above. The third category’s precepts regarding other humans are divided into absolute and hypothetical injunctions, the former obligating all men and women as such, whatever their status, and the latter – as in the direct/reductive distinction above – presupposing certain states or institutions introduced by them (DJN II.3.24). Hypothetical injunctions are also distinguished from positive civil laws that may appeal to them for justification, even if based on particular states’ advantage or specific legislators’ volitions. The three most important human institutions governed by hypothetical laws of nature are speech, dominion over things (property) and price (the valuation of things), and human sovereignty (including the civil state) – the subjects of DJN IV–V and VI–VIII. Book II concludes with three more chapters treating the various duties toward ourselves (II.4), the right and limits of self-defense (II.5), and the right of necessity (II.6).

Before turning to various categories of hypothetical duties in Book III, Pufendorf examines several absolute requirements toward other humans. The first is the prime natural law directive – also found in Grotius and Hobbes – without which social life could not exist: that no one should injure another and, if they have, that reparation should be made (DJN III.1). Second, since injury can be done to others not only by damaging their bodies or things, but also their self-esteem, humans must show mutual respect and treat one another as natural equals: for “one cannot lead a social life with someone by whom one is not esteemed at least as a man, …” (DJN III.2.1; Pufendorf 1994a, p. 159). The basis of this requirement is not human nature regarded metaphysically (or transcendentally) as an absolute value, but a so-called equality of right or law (ius) consisting merely of our joint obligation (per natural law) to cultivate a social life (DJN III.2.2; (Fiorillo 2013a, Saastamoinen 2010, Haakonssen 2011). Human moral equality so conceived also leads Pufendorf to reject the notion of natural slavery, even though he allows its compatibility with certain kinds of contractual subjection in both pre-civil and civil society (DJN III.2.8–9). Third, beside observing the minimalist requirements not to injure or insult others, Pufendorf notes, one must also seek to benefit them, “so that I am glad that others who share my nature also live upon this earth” (DJN III.3.1; Pufendorf 1994a, p. 165). This introduces the important distinction between perfect and imperfect duties, the latter consisting of so-called duties of humanity which, though owed in the same sense as perfect duties, cannot be compelled. There are a number of interesting discussions here, addressing the right of passage “for legitimate reasons” (justas causas, DJN III.3.5), the duty of hospitality, and the right of immigration – some of which recur in the fuller treatment of international law at the end of DJN VIII. Duties of humanity often depend on special circumstances. Thus, Pufendorf could consistently approve of Frederick William’s liberal (and self-serving) pro-Huguenot immigration policy in Brandenburg while supporting Charles XI’s tighter restrictions in Sweden (KVS 1995e, pp. 472, 505; Habitu §54, 2002c, pp. 118–21). Moreover, in the immediate context, he disagrees with Vitoria (DJN III.3.9) by limiting the so-called right of commerce, including territorial access for such purposes, especially as it was used by Europeans in their conquest of America (Cavallar 2002, 2008; Hunter 2007a).

Since imperfect duties of humanity do not suffice for maintaining social relations, particularly those involving precise mutual expectations, Pufendorf introduces (DJN III.4) another class of absolute duties arising from pacts among individuals. The natural law stipulates no specifics here but merely commands that we enter into some such consensual arrangements, since without them sociality would be hampered and humans remain in the natural state. Pact-generated obligations are both adventitious, or based upon some antecedent human deed responding to circumstance, and perfect in the sense of specific and compellable. They arise from either unilateral promises or bilateral agreements, and they create perfect rights (i.e., justified expectations of exact performance) in others (DJN I.7.7). It appears here that Pufendorf is an obligation theorist in that rights derive from obligations (DJN III.5.1; cf. VIII.3.5), yet there are also rights without corresponding obligations; that is, correlativity exists, but incompletely (Mautner 1991, 1989). He also rejects once more Hobbes’s notion of a right to all things and maintains that rights claims to natural objects must rest, if they are to have normative force, on the express or tacit consent of others (DJN III.5.2–3); that is, they arise out of social interaction and are not presupposed by it. Given its importance for the development of human social life, five more chapters are devoted to the topic of promises and pacts: on their nature, subject-matter, types, and conditionality, as well as the sorts of individual and collective agents capable of generating consent-based obligations by promising or agreeing with one another. The discussion as a whole is fundamental to the hypothetical laws of nature articulated in the rest of the work, in the context of various consensually created adventitious human institutions.

3.6 Speech, Property, and Commerce

Since humans’ emergence from the pre-cultural and pre-civil states of nature is neither strictly concomitant or parallel, nor sequential, the development of DJN after Book III cannot be strictly continuous in either a topical or historical sense. Rather, it falls into two partially overlapping sectors. Books IV–V deal with human efforts to leave the natural state of need (indigentia), while Books VI–VIII address the problem of security created by weakness (imbecillitas). Both require the creation of new, complex, and formally organized kinds of human cooperation that address both the growing diversity and inconsistency of human desires, and the increase in human numbers.

Fundamental to both developments, however, is the institution of human speech and the rules that make it effective, or possible (DJN IV.1; Hochstrasser 2000). For without speech in the sense of symbolic communication human sociality would remain at a primitive and unsustainable level, in that the terms of human cooperation could not be articulated and agreed upon. Conversely – and hinting at the general providentialism that Pufendorf substitutes for traditional metaphysical teleology – speech, or the communication of thought to others via sound, would be “of hardly any use” without a social life (DJN IV.1.1). Unlike natural signs or associations (e.g., dawn, smoke, groans), speech is an artificial construct of humans over time: learned rather than congenital, and arbitrary or accidental instead of naturally uniform, it is a clear instance of the willful imposition of moral entities upon the world so as to give rise to new obligations. (DJN IV.1.4–5) Its utility depends upon consent (tacit or express) and on the concomitant requirements of consistency and veracity, which are both instrumentally and – insofar as humans are obligated to be social – morally necessary. However, though humans are bound by the general conventions of language and by the requirement of not lying to one another, they retain a certain flexibility of action based on others’ varying right to know one’s thoughts, and the actual consequences of such revelations. Thus Pufendorf distinguishes between lies (mendacia) and untruths (falsiloquia) and also allows for noninjurious deceptions (DJN IV.1.9). This proviso applies not only to everyday life and its “harmless arts of simulation and dissimulation,” but also to the realm of politics and international relations, where total candor or naivete may be counterproductive and defeat the injunctions of sociality (DJN IV.1.17; Martin 2009). Pufendorf returns to it repeatedly in discussing the duties of (esp. contemporary) historians (Seidler 1997, Piirimäe 2008).

It is clear in this as well as other discussions how Pufendorf’s anthropological and social realism allows or actually requires a certain flexibility in articulating context-specific obligations of the natural law, even or especially within the particular human institutions created to enact sociality. It is because of this flexibility and consequent slipperiness of language that he goes on to treat of oaths (DJN IV.2) which, presuming “human diffidence, infidelity, ignorance, and impotence” (DJN IV.2.2), are a special means for assuring others (through associated divine or civil sanctions) of the reliability of our speech acts and the promises and pacts that rest thereon. Of course, since oaths themselves involve presumptions and tacit conditions arising from the nature of particular cases (DJN IV.2.14), they too may require further regulation. Thus, like other human institutions based on pacts, the rules of speech both antedate civil sovereignty but come eventually to depend on it in certain ways as well.

A fundamental use of speech is to regulate humans’ use of external things by appeal to the right of appropriation or dominion. The latter rests on things’ necessity or utility for humans, and their presumed (and divinely intended) availability for man’s use because of these features (DJN IV.3.1–3). Property designates a moral quality imposed on things, and it has a moral effect on other humans rather than (or beside) a physical impact on the things or animals owned (DJN IV.4.1). That is, it is a social relationship among humans (thus, solitary Adam’s relation to things was not ownership per se, and could not be transmitted) based on express or tacit agreements that may vary according to circumstances, so long as the ends of human sociality are served (DJN IV.4.4). Before or without such agreements, worldly objects are in a state of negative community, meaning that they belong to no one in particular but lie open for anyone to use as needed (DJN IV.4.2–3, 4.13).

While Pufendorf acknowledges a kind of primitive community within family units, under the aegis of the father, he distinguishes this from positive communion in the sense of common ownership (Buckle 1991). Both this and private dominion, or property properly speaking, arise gradually with the proliferation and dispersion of family units, as humans and their needs multiply (DJN IV.4.12). For under such conditions it becomes necessary to distinguish mine from thine through certain exclusionary conventions, if quarrels are to be avoided. Typically (but optionally), humans agree to a right of first occupancy or direct use, limited by the proviso of actual utility and the ability to defend what is occupied (DJN IV.6.3) – though this does not suffice for ownership without consent. Some things like the open ocean may (or can) not be owned, and so peaceful navigation thereon “belongs to everyone and is free.” However, other kinds of exclusive restrictions, such as unequal trade relationships among nations, are permitted, and “that vaunted freedom of trade does not prevent a state from favoring its own citizens over outsiders” (DJN IV.5.9–10). Also, since property is a moral relationship rather than a physical quality, the same things may be subject to different types of overlapping ownership (DJN IV.4.2). Dominion need not be exclusive, and humans may grant others a perfect or imperfect right over their possessions. Indeed, they may be obligated to do so (DJN IV.8).

Since owned objects serve different uses and are not equally valued by everyone, their exchange requires a common measure of comparison to determine their so-called moral quantity, or price (DJN V.1.1–2). Price is either ordinary or eminent, the latter determined by money as an independent, or objective, unit of value. Money is explicitly created to serve the ends of exchange among both individuals and states, and without it commercial pacts, or contracts, regarding both goods and services are inconceivable (DJN V.2.4). While civil rulers have the authority to regulate property relationships in their realms (particularly specific forms of acquisition like hunting and fishing), and trade with outsiders, they are less free to determine the relative price of things since such arbitrariness would disrupt economic exchange, especially interstate commerce (DJN IV.6.5; V.1.14). In general, sovereign determinations are less apt or useful in pre- or non-civil institutions that relieve human need, than in regard to those that insure human security – if these can be distinguished. Nonetheless, economic tools like contracts may need a civil sanction to insure their reliability and thus efficacy, and rulers may regulate property insofar as it affects the state’s basic security interests and welfare – not only by taxation and eminent domain but also through controls on foreign trade and on the growth of luxury (e.g., sumptuary laws), whereby the state’s economic strength and independence are affected (DJN VII.4.7, VIII.5; Saeter 1996, Gaertner 2005, Young 2008, Skinner 1995, Seidler 2018).

4. Political Philosophy

4.1 Pre-Civil Societies

Like physical bodies, the moral body of the state is substantively composed of lesser members, particularly the simple and thus primary associations (collegia) of marriage, family, and household (DJN VI.1.1). In their reproductive, rearing, and economic functions, these basic societies mainly address the problem of human want or need, though they also offer a minimal level of security. Their existence shows that social cooperation is not suddenly imposed on isolated human beings with the creation of states, but that the latter is an additional form of association introduced to protect and maintain already existing social units. Despite the natural inclinations that induce individuals to form or enter them, these proto-civil arrangements are, like states, based on agreements, and they exhibit authority relations more or less analogous to civil sovereignty (DJN VI.2.11). The latter becomes necessary only when pre-civil societies increase in size, number, and complexity to the point where their interactions become dysfunctional and security problems unmanageable. As in the case of other moral entities that are superimposed on one another, states do not replace pre-civil societies but only protect, order, and – under certain conditions – utilize them. At the same time, especially in the case of other types of sub-state associations such as churches, they may also liberate individuals from them (by divorcing civil from religious authority, and allowing religious diversity in the state). (See Seidler 2002.)

4.1.1 Marriage

Since it regulates reproduction, without which human society would cease to exist, the institution of marriage is “the foundation of social life” (DJN VI.1.7; Dufour 1972, Ehrle 1952). Humans are obligated to enter it, though only in a general way that presupposes capacity, opportunity, and other facilitating conditions. Despite being commanded by God – like other natural law obligations – its immediate origins lie in each instance in a consensual pact between basically equal partners (DJN VI.1.12). This holds even where a woman’s (express or tacit) consent – like terms of captivity in general – follows upon (a just) war (DJN VI.1.9, 1.12; VI.3.5–6). Though its end differs from that of the state (reproduction vs. security), the marital unification of wills may establish a hierarchical, quasi-sovereignty relationship between spouses, one of whom agrees to submit to the other’s authority; on the other hand, marriage may have the character of an “unequal confederation,” which also requires diverse but mutual performance (i.e., command and obedience; DJN VI.1.11). What is impermissible in both cases and institutions, however, because of its supposed dysfunctionality for governance, is a divided command or two heads.

This forces a choice upon Pufendorf’s contractual egalitarianism, which is tempered here by his material assumptions about the “preeminence” of the husband’s sex, and about women’s allegedly unreasonable demand for additional responsibilities. These are not absolute pronouncements, however, but conclusions of the “ruling prudence” that is the “pleasant sister of natural law”; that is, they rest upon an empirical, pragmatic assessment of spouses’ respective abilities and burdens (DJN VI.1.11,18). It is important to recall in this context the difference between modern and medieval natural law, and that Pufendorf does not conceive human nature in essentialist terms but rather generalizes (rightly or wrongly) from experience. That is, apart from his personal presuppositions, his is an empirical and not a metaphysical argument, and this makes it both circumstantial and corrigible. To dismiss it out of hand ironically risks reaffirming the very approach that he rejected (in general), and to overlook the flexibility and liberatory potential of his conception of natural law (Drakopolou 2013).

Besides, Pufendorf reassures, in marriages and states alike, sovereignty does not exclude the possibility of mutual affection, and spouses do not command each other in all respects but only those that serve the institution’s fundamental end. Thus, matters like the disposition of a wife’s dowry and other assets depend on the stipulations of the original marriage agreement (DJN VI.1.11), much like the preliminary constraints imposed upon limited civil sovereignty by a state’s fundamental laws. Pufendorf also extends his analysis into the controversial subject of polygamy – which he deemed rationally elusive and sometimes permissible (DJN VI.1.16–18; Vogel 1991) – and into the topic of divorce, where he qualifies Milton’s views on the subject (DJN VI.1.24; Palladini 2001). These and other discussions are historically and circumstantially embedded, which accounts for their considerable length and detail, especially when compared with shorter treatments in other early modern authors like Hobbes and Locke. Textual comparisons with these can be useful and enlightening (Sreedhar 2014), especially if historical and philosophical contexts are also kept in view (Doyé 2012, Hull 1996, Buchholz 1988, Rinkens 1971, Dufour 1972).

4.1.2 Family

One human institution generates and qualifies another as the parental role supervenes on that of marital partner. Here Pufendorf follows Hobbes in holding that mere generation cannot ground parental authority (just as place of birth alone cannot ground patriotism), and that this depends instead on a tacit pact based on utility (DJN VI.2.2). Children supposedly assent to their subjection in order to survive, and because otherwise the beneficial ends of parenthood, which include the rearing, socializing, and civic education of offspring, cannot be attained. Moreover, he concurs, though mothers have primary authority over children in the state of nature where parents are roughly equal, fathers typically acquire supremacy through marriage pacts, which may be dictated by civil laws (DJN VI.2.4–5). As in the spousal relationship and for similar reasons, parents cannot be equally authoritative or sovereign vis-a-vis their children, but one or the other must prevail. Though this is usually the male, Pufendorf excepts Amazons and contemporary queens in whom the civil sovereignty reposes for dynastic reasons, and whose husbands are not kings but mere “spouses of queens.” (DJN VI.2.5) Also, like marital authority, parental power is limited by the institution’s end and normally excludes the right of life and death, and the ability to void grown children’s marriages. (DJN VI.2.14) It ceases when children come of age and are emancipated, though (as in the case of emigration, DJN VIII.11.3–4) it may be extended beyond that point because of special circumstances, including other pacts. Children always owe their parents imperfect duties of equity and gratitude (DJN VI.2.11).

4.1.3 Household

Herilic or master-slave relationships are similar to but stricter than parental ties, and they have no natural expiration point. They too are based on express or tacit pacts, with no natural basis beside the qualifying suitability of some persons to rule and others to be ruled (DJN VI.3.1–2) – which, alone, is insufficient to justify them. Pufendorf conceives them as sovereignty- rather than as property-relationships (DJN VI.3.7), strictly speaking, and regards slaves not as things but as “perpetual mercenaries” (DJN VI.3.4) who always retain an “intrinsic liberty of the will” (DJN VI.3.10). Slavery (or servitude – the category is wider or more diverse than often acknowledged) does not extinguish the laws of humanity or erase all traces of humans’ original equality, even though it is possible for them to bargain away (permanently) their freedom to command themselves (DJN VI.3.9). Even the offspring of slaves may be retained in that status, especially when it has been entered through war, although humanity (vs. right) favors their liberation. States may regulate herilic relationships like marital and parental ties, for appropriate reasons, even though they often do not interfere. Slavery may be ended by manumission, banishment, a failure to specify the status of slaves in one’s will, and – notably – by putting a slave into chains (except for a crime, or as punishment). In the last case and any other unjustified deprivation of bodily freedom, a slave is released from his initial, pact-based obligation, which depends on reciprocity: “For there is no pact unless contractors trust each other, and faith cannot be violated where it does not exist.” That is, physical bonds replace or sublate moral ones, and in such a case a slave is free to go (i.e., run away) (DJN VI.3.6, 3.11). These reasons are similar to those why the civil bond between ruler and ruled may be broken.

4.2 The State

Pufendorf’s political philosophy or doctrine of the state, including the latter’s internal and external functions, is continuous and consistent with his ethics; in fact, they are not really distinct. Both rest on the same natural law foundation, namely the sociality law which regulates not only pre-civil relations, institutions, and societies but also the civil condition needed to secure them. As thoroughly social beings who are incapable of living alone, humans are subject to sociality’s requirements at all stages of their lives, both temporally and organizationally, and the establishment of political authority does not leave morality and its obligations behind but rather facilitates and extends their reach. The tempered realism of the political sphere is not a forced abandonment of moral norms but an articulation of the natural law’s demands amid the increasing complexities of collective human existence, including its inevitable constraints, exclusions, and compromises. In Pufendorf’s natural law theory, politics is a form of social ethics.

4.2.1 The Origin of the State

Speaking generally (since the formation of individual states varies greatly), the moral entity of ‘the state’ is self-imposed by humans at the command of natural law when their pre-civil marital, parental, and particularly herilic associations – as well as other pact-based institutions such as property – become dysfunctional because of multiplying conflicts that lead increasingly to the unjustified use of force and, thus, reciprocal injury and insecurity. It is a defensive and precautionary response to such emergent conditions, a kind of cooperative scheme (conspiratio) or mutual protection association created as needed against the growing threat posed by other human beings (DJN VII.2.1–2). Contra Aristotle, the state is not a natural or ideal stage of human development emerging spontaneously from humans’ desire to live together (DJN VII.1.2–3), but an adventitious, willed self-help device broadly enjoined by natural law in either or both a prudential (i.e., recommended by sound reason) or deontological (i.e., commanded by God) sense (DJN VII.3.2). It is not required to eliminate human need (indigentia) in the pre-cultural natural state, since cities and other forms of association usually suffice for that (DJN VII.1.3 and 6; Brett 2011). Rather it secures these social arrangements and their cultural gains in the context of increased human numbers, relative scarcity and competition, growing disagreements, and the ensuing insecurity that comes from the interaction of individually weak and imperfectly social beings.

State formation is explicitly driven by fear, and there is ample reference to human wickedness, self-concern, and a willingness to injure in Pufendorf’s sketch of the pre-civil condition (DJN VII.1–2). Still, his comments are qualified even here, in opposition to Hobbes, and they do not amount to an anthropological claim about the exclusive selfishness of all human beings – which is not needed for the argument (DJN VII.1.5, 7–8). In fact, the discussion of pre-civil conditions and institutions clearly tempers such pessimism. For while those arrangements rely on formal promises and pacts, they are also induced by and certainly compatible with mutual affection, a desire for friendship, and the enjoyment of conviviality (DJN VII.1.5, 2.4; VIII.4.3, 6.2; II.2.7, 3.16). To be sure, such means and motives become increasingly incapable of maintaining them, as the complex feelings regulating smaller, simpler, and more intimate human interactions evolve into a cruder and colder psychology of scale among composite moral persons or groups. That is, with the reduction of familiarity, predictability, and commonality of purpose comes a sort of primitivizing of motives in the direction of fear. Still, Pufendorf’s state is not built on a thick, essentialist, or teleological (philosophical or theological) anthropology – even of a negative sort – but on an empirical, historical, or realistic assessment of actual human affairs. This means both that the state’s minimalist function as a mutual protection agency may not be controlled or overridden by other, substantive (e.g., religious, ethical) ends, but also that, since fear does not necessarily eliminate other human motives but only suppresses or distorts or overrules them, the state as guarantor of mutual security may actually allow these to function (again) in their proper (subordinate) contexts.

4.2.2 Contractualism

Beside its sovereignty, what distinguishes Pufendorf’s state from other pact-based institutions is its size (DJN VII.2.2) – that is, its numbers must suffice for security in particular social and historical circumstances – and, more importantly, its manner of formation. Conceptually, it owes its origin to two agreements and an intervening decree (DJN VII.2.7–8). An initial contract of association occurs when members of a multitude, or the would-be citizens (in practice, family-fathers or patriarchs, who are the primary or direct citizens: DJN VII.2.20, 5.12), agree with one another to bond together for mutual security. This requires the accession of all (full or formal) members of the resultant group, who consent to it either absolutely or conditionally depending on whether they agree individually to bind themselves to any form of state selected by the majority, or only to a certain, preapproved form satisfactory to themselves. In either case, the band (coetus) thus constituted still lacks unity and has only “the rudiments and beginnings of a state” (DJN VII.2.7; Pufendorf 1994a, p. 212), although it suffices to prevent an immediate return to the state of nature if the second pact is temporarily suspended, as during an interregnum (DJN VII.7.6–7, VIII.11.1).

The second pact follows the selection (via the pragmatic expedient of majority vote; see Pasquino 2010, Schwartzberg 2008) of the specific form of state to be instituted (monarchy, aristocracy, or democracy), and through it each citizen of the future state subjects himself to the specific governing agent thereby established. It is needed to prevent the random defection and individual exceptionalism that threaten all pre-civil agreements (DJN VII.2.3, 10), including the first contract. At this stage or level, the individual contractors unite their wills through separate promises of obedience to a new moral persona equipped with distinctive (i.e., not simply transferred) rights and obligations, and capable of using their combined strength to discipline, compel, and thus govern effectively (DJN VII.2.5, 3.4, 8.5; cf. VI.1.12; Boucher 1998, Skinner 2002). Civil subjection is analogous to herilic subjection or slavery, though more focused in intent, more limited in scope, and – because of reciprocal promises between governors and governed – potentially sublatable in narrowly defined and (thinks Pufendorf) avoidable circumstances (DJN VII.3.1, 2.10; Seidler 1996). Moreover, in combining a title to command with the strength to sanction or compel, it also recalls the general structure and rationale of the moral obligation that enjoins humans to constitute it in the first place (cf. DJN VII.3.1, 2.13; I.6.9, 6.12; and Section 3.2 above).

4.2.3 Sovereignty

Like Bodin and Hobbes, Pufendorf identified sovereignty (imperium) as the “vivifying and sustaining soul” of the state. It is a new moral quality that emerges from the respective commitments of rulers and ruled, consisting of the former’s right to command and the latter’s duty to obey. (DJN VII.3.1–2: Pufendorf 1994a, pp. 217–18; VII.4.12; Holland 2012) Like other souls, as it were, sovereignty comes from God (as author of the natural law), though only indirectly in this case, or through the instrumentality of reasoning human beings. Thus, throughout Book VII of DJN Pufendorf rejects the arguments of J. F. Horn (Politicorum pars architectonica de civitate [1664]), the German Filmer. Natural law bestows sovereignty on no one form of government or on specific individuals or groups; instead, such decisions are made by human contractors in particular circumstances. It is always required, however, that sovereignty be supreme in the sense that there be no superior or equivalent powers within the state. Also, sovereignty cannot be divided, since that would fragment the unity of will that undergirds the state as an effective authority (DJN VII.4.11). Accordingly, all governing functions, including legislative, judicial, penal, economic, and war-related powers must ultimately reside in the same persona or agency. Otherwise (as in the Holy Roman Empire whose political diseases Pufendorf diagnosed in The Present State of Germany (Monz.) the state would have two or more heads and, by reproducing the conflicts of the pre-civil condition, would invite its own destruction.

4.2.4 Forms of State

States where sovereignty is unified – whatever be their form (monarchy, aristocracy, democracy) – are called regular, and those where it is divided irregular (DJN VII.5.2, 5.14–15). Irregularity always weakens a state, but each form also has its own difficulties and weaknesses. Pufendorf does not in principle prefer one regular form over another: God is the author of free states (democracies) and monarchies alike (DJN VII.5.5), and sovereignty or majesty belongs equally to all states and not just to monarchies (DJN VII.3.3). However, humans incline differently toward particular forms of state (DJN VII.5.11), and it is up to them to decide which ones to implement for themselves (DJN VII.3.2). In fact, the choice appears to be prudential in nature, since certain forms of state may require specific human dispositions to function effectively (DJN VII.6.5), and some forms may be more suited for particular settings. Thus, large territories with scattered populations are better ruled as monarchies, while smaller regions or city-states can be governed well as democracies (DJN VII.5.22). More generally, monarchy may be more efficient because of the simple logistics of human association (DJN VII.5.9). Beside such forms and conditions, each type of state is also prone to other faults or illnesses peculiar to itself, which Pufendorf distinguishes into “vices of men” and “vices of status” (DJN VII.5.10). The former obtain, for instance, when (in a monarchy) rulership goes to someone unqualified for that role, and the latter when (in a democracy) citizens are too self-assertive and unwilling to compromise. The fact remains that even though states are a remedy for human weakness and imperfection, as human constructs they always remain an imperfect one (DJN VII.5.22).

This problem cannot be avoided or lessened by mixing forms of state, a traditional expedient (Riklin 2006, Scattola 2009b, Zurbuchen 2009) that Pufendorf rejects because of the irregularities it produces. For mixing yields either an entity that is no state at all, because it is held together by a mere agreement (without subjection), or one that approximates a system of independent states, else something ‘monstrous’ in between (DJN VII.5.12–13). Pufendorf does allow, though, for a distinction between forms of state and forms of administration. Thus, a monarch may utilize executive mechanisms that are aristocratic or democratic in nature, and similarly for other forms of state (DJN VII.5.1, 5.13). The crucial defining factor in each instance is the unity and locus of ultimate authority, not how its commands are executed or policies implemented. Such arrangements differ from so-called systems of (sovereign) states, which themselves exhibit regular and irregular forms depending on the way their collective authority is exercised. By discussing them Pufendorf extends his analysis to the international sphere (DJN VII.5.17–21; see Seidler 2011).

4.2.5 Absolute and Limited Sovereignty

Contra Hobbes, Pufendorf allows that supreme sovereignty (summum imperium) may be either absolute or limited (DJN VII.6.7). The former obtains where a sovereign accepts his (her, or its) authority with no conditions attached, the latter where citizens’ submission depends on the sovereign’s initial acceptance of certain terms, such as an existing state’s fundamental laws. These can be violated by the eventual sovereign, making his actions injurious or illegitimate (DJN VII.8.2–4, 6.10), even though subjects are not typically – except in extremis – in a position to deny him obedience for this reason because it would undermine the important end of sovereignty altogether (DJN VII.8.5–6). Given human imperfections, Pufendorf clearly favors limited sovereignty; however, and for the same reasons, while he criticizes the abuse of absolute sovereignty he also criticizes irrational fear thereof (DJN VII.6.8–13). Again, there is no universal recommendation but all depends on what is needed in particular historical circumstances where such choices present themselves.

4.2.6 State and Church

The state or sovereign necessarily controls all sub-state collectives, including economic, political, and religious associations, especially if they compete with it for citizens’ allegiance (DJN VII.2.21–24). Though piety is a personal matter between the deity and individual believers, its official mediation by ecclesial entities or churches, which also direct and organize human actions, has a worldly impact that may interfere with the state’s functions (which are also divinely enjoined) – as Pufendorf argued by reference to the history of Catholicism and the papacy’s role in European affairs (Einl., ch. 12, 2013; also [1839, 1714, 1691b]). Therefore, sovereigns have the right (and obligation) to regulate religious organizations, to examine beliefs, and even to foster an official religion – though only to insure compatibility with political order (DJN VII.4.11, 9.4). In fact, like public schools (if they do not merely perpetuate scholastic subtleties), religion may also aid the process of civic formation – which is required because states are adventitious moral entities devised by humans for a particular purpose, and because (good) citizens are not born but made (DJN VII.1.3–4). However, since they are disparate institutions regulating different moral personae (citizens, believers), neither state nor church exists primarily to serve the other’s purposes. The state’s general authority regarding religion, and its sovereignty over all religious groups alike, also creates room for the toleration of religious minorities and thus restrains destabilizing confessional conflict (Seidler 2002, Zurbuchen 2013, Lehmann 2013, Palladini 1997b). Though Pufendorf had not yet arrived at Christian Thomasius’ notion of a deconfessionalized state (Hunter 2007), his historical awareness of religion’s impact on government, and its frequent contribution to political factionalism, made him wary of independent religious institutions and inclined to favor state oversight. In any case, since they issue from the same warranting deity, he held that ultimately true politics and true (religious) doctrine cannot conflict (DJN VII.4.8, 4.11).

4.2.7 Civil Law

Despite its natural law foundation, a state’s positive laws will only partially overlap with natural law. That is, since its purpose is not to make humans perfect but secure, only those natural laws without which peace among citizens would be impossible should also become civil laws (DJN VIII.1.1, III.4.6). In fact, by focusing on the requirements of human association rather than on personal formation, the sociality principle makes Pufendorf a legal minimalist more generally, so that even where the natural law is silent or indifferent “civil laws should not sanction more things than conduce to the good of the citizens [as such] and the state” (DJN VII.9.5; Pufendorf 1994a, p. 242). Besides, and within this narrow focal area, it also grants legislators considerable discretion or flexibility of application. Thus, even though civil laws should not explicitly contravene natural law, it is sometimes excusable if they redefine or “overlook” (dissimulare) certain practices – like theft, dueling, and tacitly accepted cuckoldry – for which “the condition of the times and the genius of a people” do not provide a current remedy (DJN VIII.1.3). Such practical adjustments are evident throughout Pufendorf’s detailed discussions of state laws in DJN VIII – regarding punishment, social status (esteem), property, and war – which are strongly prudentialist, consequentialist, and realist in character. They evince not a substantive moralism but the same flexible ‘reason-of-state’ approach that also guides his thinking about inter-state relations. Indeed, through their common grounding in the sociality principle, natural, civil, and international law are in continuity and in dialogue with one another – though in a complex and sometimes untidy way (DJN II.3.23). That is, though as a broad divine injunction natural law is presumed to be ultimately consistent, in practice (as specifically interpreted by particular humans) it often appears less so; for its demands must always be articulated in full view of not only human psychology but also the concrete settings in which human action occurs. (Thus, as in the case of immigration [section 3.5 above], Pufendorf could condemn the 1640s English revolution, while approving that in 1688. See Seidler 2001.)

4.2.8 Punishment

This requirement is also evident in Pufendorf’s long discussion of the sovereign’s right to punish (DJN VIII.3, Hüning 2009b). Punishment presupposes a superior, and so (in contrast to Locke) it cannot occur in either the pre-civil or the international state of nature (DJN VIII.3.1–2, 3.7). Of course, both individuals and states have a right to defend themselves or wage defensive (and, in limited circumstances, preemptive) war, but neither of these is to be construed as punishment strictly speaking. The latter is, instead, a means of social control available only to sovereigns for the specific purpose of restraint, deterrence, and reform (DJN VIII.3.9). In their hands, moreover, it is more future- than past-oriented, with the latter being important only for the sake of the former: that is, one should not pointlessly impose evil on someone, even if guilty, if the deed cannot be undone or the damage repaired, for he remains after all our conspecific or fellow human being (cognato) (DJN VIII.3.8). Those who have injured another certainly owe a duty of reparation, as well as assurances about future behavior, but they are under no obligation to submit to punishment (DJN VIII.3.4; see end of 4.1.3 above), which is imposed for purely consequentialist reasons. Joining Hobbes, Pufendorf dismisses revenge as a “vain and unreasonable” motive (DJN VIII.3.8) for punishment, and he also dismisses Selden’s “satisfaction, purgation, or expiation” (DJN VIII.3.12) as unnecessary or meaningless notions. Moreover, he holds that penalties are not “owed to” or “deserved by” criminals, who are unlikely to assert such a right (DJN VIII.3.5, 3.15). Instead,a sovereign’s resort to punishment should be guided by state interest (as, in the case of a parent, by the interests of the family: DJN VIII.3.10), which also determines the quantity and quality of punishment needed (DJN VIII.3.23–24). The latter should never be excessive but guided by the actual advantages to be gained (DJN VII.9.6–7). In some cases, punishment may even be foregone altogether if the interest of the state demands it (DJN VIII.3.14, 16). This is because punishment is an instance of neither distributive nor commutative (expletive) justice, but a type of administrative sanction recommended by “prudence … conjoined with the duty to rule others” (DJN VIII.3.5).

In sum, Pufendorf’s analysis of punishment as a whole reflects the positive and (re)constructive attitude of the law of nature, in both pre- and post-civil conditions, particularly its injunctions to forgive, to accept apologies and reparations, and basically so to act as always to further and facilitate sociality (“inasmuch as [we] can”), rather than to frustrate or make it impossible among human beings as we actually find them (DJN V.13.1; II.3.15, Pufendorf 1994a, p. 152). As such, it appears far removed from more absolutist or categorical views of justice, such as the well-known statement (of Kant in The Metaphysics of Morals [Die Metaphysik der Sitten, 1797]) that a civil society must, before dissolving itself, execute every convicted murderer remaining in its prisons – a contrast that reveals well the gulf separating Pufendorf’s natural law theory from essentialist or Platonizing views (such as Leibniz’s) that challenged, and the Critical philosophy that eventually replaced it (Hunter 2001, 2003a).

4.3 Natural Law and History

Pufendorf’s natural law thinking developed in close interaction with his views on other subjects such as history, religion, and international relations; that is, his roles as academic philosopher, court historian, and political apologist were only formally and not intellectually distinct (Seidler 2015). This is as evident in the seminal reflections of his early Collegium Anthologicum lectures (in KVS 1995e, pp. 2–86) as it is in his later works. Thus, the 1667 treatise on the Holy Roman Empire (Monz.) not only studied its concrete history and institutions but also examined the importance of sovereignty and state form, the tension between civil and ecclesiastical authority, and the challenge of foreign relations that emerged from these. Pufendorf’s so-called works on religion (Habitu; Feciale; Einl. [1691b, 1714, 1839]) engaged the same topics, as well as associated questions about religious unification and toleration, in the context of the early modern confessional state (Parkin and Stanton 2013; Döring 1998; Zurbuchen 1999, 1996, 1991; Hüning 2002b). Even Pufendorf’s concretely situated and apparently partisan defenses of the Swedish interest (Discussio, Occas.) – which were sometimes regarded as merely contingent or opportunistic productions – exhibit the challenge (for particular sovereigns and their historians) of applying the natural law’s general injunctions to specific historical circumstances. Most obviously, perhaps, his explicitly historical works – including the long accounts of Sweden (Gust. Ad., C. Gust.) and of Brandenburg (Fr. Wilh., Pufendorf 1784) that so distinguished him, but also his famous Introductions (Einl. 1682, 1686b) – give substance to and thus support his philosophical analysis of the state (Seidler 1996 and 1997, Piirimäe 2008, Dufour 1991c, Krawczuk 2014). To be sure, the focus here is mainly on the external relations and negotiations of particular states. But sovereigns must conduct these as judiciously and effectively as their states’ internal affairs, for it is useless to have internal peace if a state is externally weak (DJN VII.4.5). The two dimensions of statecraft are clearly linked throughout Pufendorf’s opus, which urges sovereigns (and those who create them) to consult both long- and short-term interests of states, distinguishing the real from the merely apparent ones (Einl., Preface, 2013), both to avoid the (re)emergence of an internal or external state of nature and, more generally, to satisfy the natural law’s injunction to further sociality among humans.

5. Influence

5.1 Literary Afterlife

Pufendorf’s (Latin) style is clear and careful, though also sophisticated and colorful. For he not only mastered the art of example but was also an aggressive, imaginative, and sometimes crass polemicist when attacked – especially when cornered, when the stakes were high, or when he deemed his opponents to be bellicose, lazy, or intellectually dishonest. This alone assured that he was eagerly and widely read. Many of his works – including Monz. (1667), DJN (1672), DO (1673), Einl. (1682) – were published repeatedly and translated into many European languages, both during his lifetime and throughout most of the following century (Othmer 1970, Luig 1972, Denzer 1972, Laurent 1982, Seidler 2013), when they became staples of university education. Of particular note in this extensive publication history were the influential French translations by Jean Barbeyrac, whose long notes to DJN and DO (including their Lockean leanings) were partially assumed into the standard English translations of these works (if not immediately then in later editions), specifically those by Basil Kennet (DJN 1729) and Andrew Tooke (DO 1735). In fact there was considerable interest in Pufendorf in England (starting with Tyrrell and Locke – see Tyrrell 1681, esp. pp. 236–59, and Thompson 1987), which also saw translations of various other works, including The Present State of Germany (Monz 1690, 1696), The History of Popedom (Einl. [1691]), the Introduction (Einl. 1695), Of the Nature and Qualification of Religion, in Reference to Civil Society (Habitu 1698), and The Divine Feudal Law (Feciale 1703). These and other translations are currently being reissued by Liberty Fund, Inc. as part of its Natural Law and Enlightenment Classics series, and are readily available in its Online Library of Liberty. (See Other Internet Resources below.) Pufendorf’s three main natural law works (including the early EJU) were also reprinted and retranslated in the early twentieth century as part of the Carnegie Endowment’s Classics of International Law series, and are still occasionally reissued in this form (EJU 1995a, 1995b [2009]; DJN 1995c, 1995d; DO 1995g, 1995h). However, there was never a collective edition of Pufendorf’s works in any language, before the ongoing Gesammelte Werke (GW) issued by the Akademie Verlag (Walter de Gruyter). This edition includes as Vol. 1 (BW 1996) the extant correspondence which, though limited in comparison to other early moderns like Leibniz, is nonetheless very useful, especially in conjunction with the polemical essays in Eris Scandica (ES 2002b), which add biographical and literary details. The shorter works collected by Döring (KVS 1995e) are not included in GW, which does or will, however, contain Feciale (2004), Habitu (2016), DAS (1675b), and Monz.(1667). Since the long national histories are now easily obtainable in facsimile form or as scans (see ZVDD and Gallica, in Other Internet Resources below), all of Pufendorf’s known writings will soon be readily available to scholars in some contemporary form.

5.2 18th-Century Presence

The discourse of natural law became the lingua franca of 18th-century moral, political, and social (including economic – Hont 1987, 2005; Skinner 1995) thought (Haakonssen 2012; see section 2.1 above, and “Natural Law 1625–1850: Database” in Other Internet Resources below). Pufendorf contributed much thereto by initiating the self-referential genre of the ‘history of natural law’, wherein he located himself in relation to Grotius, Hobbes and other predecessors (Sample of Controversies [Specimen controversiarum], 1678, Ch. 1: “On the Origin and Progress of the Discipline of Natural Law”; later included in Eris Scandica (ES 1686). His modest beginning was much enlarged by Barbeyrac in “An Historical and Critical Account of the Science of Morality …,” the Preface to his 1706 translation of Pufendorf’s DJN (2005 [1729]), and by Pufendorf’s German friend and disciple, Christian Thomasius, in his Nearly Complete History of Natural Law (Paulo plenior historia juris naturalis, 1719), as well as many others in the 18th century (Glafey 1965 [1739]; see Hochstrasser 2000, pp. 65–71). As in Pufendorf himself, a major theme of the genre was that of sociality (sociability, benevolence), which was variously interpreted, criticized, and defended in both secular and religious contexts (Chiodi 2009, Piirimäe and Schmidt 2015). The notion’s appeal in the British domain – where a way had been prepared by Richard Cumberland (1632–1718, Cumberland 2005), whom Pufendorf cited repeatedly in the 1684 edition of DJN – is demonstrated by Gershom Carmichael’s (1672–1729) influential student edition (1718) of Pufendorf’s De officio (Carmichael 2002), and by the inaugural lecture “On the Natural Sociality of Men” (1730) of his student and successor at Glasgow, Francis Hutcheson (1694–1746), whose thought was strongly influenced by natural law (Hutcheson 1993, 2006, 2007). So too were many other British moralists and social theorists, especially in the so-called Scottish Enlightenment, including George Turnbull (1698–1748), John Millar (1735–1801), Thomas Reid (1710–1796), and Adam Smith (1723–1790) (Haakonssen 1996, Moore and Silverthorne 1983, Moore 2006). Through them and others, including direct exposure to Pufendorf’s own, often reprinted works, natural law thought also became part of the intellectual inheritance of the American Revolution and constitutionalism (Welzel 1952, White 1978, Augat 1985, Heideking 1995, Haakonssen 1991, Logan 2013).

On the Continent, Pufendorf’s influence was felt during the 18th century through the so-called civil enlightenment of C. Thomasius and his school, and through the frequent republication and study of his own works. Their juridical approach to natural law persisted until the end of the century, especially in German law faculties (Lestition 1989, Klippel 2009, Schröder 2010), where it provided a counterweight to the metaphysical, perfectionist, and in a sense neoscholastic tradition of natural law associated with Leibniz and Christian Wolff (1679–1754) (Hunter 2007, 2003a, 2001; Lutterbeck 2002, Haakonssen 2006, Ikadatsu 2002, Ottmann 2006, Schmidt 2007, Schneider 2001). Pufendorf himself maintained a presence not only through his natural law works but also the historical writings, especially the many versions of his Introduction (Einl. 1682), which was continually revised and appropriated by others to suit the times, until nearly the end of the century (Seidler 2013). Indeed, it was largely through this work and those of its editors, commentators, and imitators, including Nikolaus Hieronymus Gundling (1671–1729) and Johann Peter Lud[e]wig (1668–1743), that Pufendorf entered the 18th-century discourse about the relation of law, politics, and history, and stayed relevant as an international theorist. His empirically grounded mix of history, philosophy, and law led also into cameralism (Brückner 1977), into the so-called Göttingen School (Hammerstein 1972 and 1986, Vierhaus 1987), and to the associated discipline of Statistik (statistics, from the Italian statista [statesman] and ragion di stato), with its focus on the concrete institutions and functions of states (Zande 2010, Valera 1986, Pasquino 1986). This included Gottfried Achenwall (1719–1772), on whom Kant lectured for many years during both his pre-Critical and Critical periods (Achenwall 1762, Hruschka 1986, Streidl 2000). Moreover, it underlay the century’s legal codification schemes, which attempted still to base positive on natural law in some sense (Hartung 1998, Ferronato 2005). In an equally broad sort of way, Pufendorf was also predecessor to Jean-Jacques Burlamaqui (1694–1748) and Emmerich de Vattel (1714–1767), whose respective works on natural and international law were notable examples of the genre, albeit ones also influenced by its Wolffian version. Moreover, Pufendorf and natural law were present in the Encyclopédie (Schröder 2001, Burns 1999), as well as in the prehistory of the French Revolution (Caradonna 2006, Edelstein 2014). Finally, Pufendorf’s theory of the state had a significant formative influence on specific thinkers like Rousseau, who criticized him and other “friends of despotism” for undermining human freedom while nonetheless borrowing heavily from his political conceptions (McAdam 1963, Derathé 1992, Wokler 1994, Silvestrini 2010, Douglass 2015).

5.3 Eclipse & Rediscovery

Kant’s Critical philosophy does not distinguish clearly between the rather different streams of natural law that it is usually thought to have surpassed (Hochstrasser 2000, Hartung 1998, Haakonssen 2006). Indeed, when Kant arrived on the scene the two had already been thoroughly commingled, and the discipline as a whole straddled an uncomfortable position between the rational and the empirical. Its situation now became increasingly precarious, as it was subjected to epistemological and metaphysical challenges that it had not been designed to meet, and whose purist, a priori assumptions it would reject (Hunter 2001, 2002, 2005). Like much else, Kant effectively folded natural law into the dialectical pre-history of his own system. In fact, he hardly mentions it at all, since it does not fit the formal schematic of his conception of the history of philosophy as a conflict between dogmatic rationalism and sceptical empiricism. In ethics, natural law is implicitly dismissed in the critique of technical and prudential imperatives, and in political philosophy it appears similarly wanting in the face of pure Right. To be sure, Kant’s own views in both areas – including the notion of categorical obligation, the historical-political mechanism of ’unsocial sociability’, and the trademark concept of ‘autonomy’ mediated by Rousseau’s General Will – owed significant debts to Pufendorf and the voluntarist tradition (Schneewind 1993, 2009, 2010; Kersting 2006). However, since his system gave that problematic a new (in)significance, it did not play an explicit role in his discussions. Kant’s sole mention of Pufendorf (in the company of Grotius and Vattel) is a vague and dismissive reference to the “wretched comforters” (leidige Tröster) who are criticized – in the essay on Perpetual Peace (Zum ewigen Frieden, 1795) – for their overly flexible, empirical, and situational treatment of the law of nations (ius gentium). Ironically, that approach (including sovereigns’ resort to prudence and the right of necessity) had previously been considered a strength, but Kant saw it as little more than a recipe for endless war. In its place, he substituted a universal, necessary, and absolute metaphysics of right – albeit in a transcendental vein – precisely of the sort that the ‘modern’ natural law theory of Hobbes and Pufendorf had originally sought to displace because of its pernicious social consequences.

The actual refutation or, rather, historical erasure of natural law was the work of post-Kantian historians like C. F. Stäudlin (1761–1826), J. G. Buhle (1763–1807), and W. G. Tennemann (1761–1819), whose versions of the history of moral philosophy ironically left Grotius, Pufendorf and Thomasius (Barbeyrac’s protagonists) with only minor roles to play. Even so, natural law remained a presence in the nineteenth century. Thus, Fichte (The Foundations of Natural Law [Grundlage des Naturrechts nach Prinzipien der Wissenschaftslehre, 1796–97]), Schelling (A New Deduction of Natural Law [Neue Deduction des Naturrechts, 1797]), and the young Hegel (The Scientific Ways of Treating Natural Law [Über die wissenschaftlichen Behandlungsarten des Naturrechts, 1802–3]) all published works on “natural law” (Naturrecht) – showing that the idiom remained serviceable (Klippel 1997, 2012). In the British domain, insofar as it was not also ‘idealized’, Bentham’s vague and dismissive attitude toward ‘natural rights’, and the comparatively circumscribed ‘ethics’ of Mill’s utilitarianism, found little connection with modern natural law, even through its own eighteenth-century inheritance which that approach had helped to shape. The rebirth of Thomism in the Catholic world toward the end of the century, and the permutation of natural into human rights before and after the First World War, made the disjunction and the amnesia complete.

This debate continues, albeit in different registers and with equivocal notions of ‘natural law’. For about half of the twentieth century (in philosophy, law, and international relations), natural law referred to a revived Scholasticism or Neo-Thomism. This was joined after mid-century by the ‘secular’ natural law of John Finnis (1940– ) and Robert P. George (1955– ), later by the naturalism (or neo-Aristotelianism) of Amartya Sen (1933– ) and Martha Nussbaum (1947– ), and most recently by a new kind of Protestant natural law with roots in sixteenth-century Reformed theology (Grabhill 2006, VanDrunen 2010, Witte Jr. 2008). All these approaches involve essentialist claims of sorts, even if empirically supported, and together with a Kantian metaphysics of the person that is variously present in versions of John Rawls (1921–2002) and Jürgen Habermas (1929– ) they provide ontological, procedural, or constructivist foundations for discourse about human rights and dignity, and support for international organizations and mechanisms that police them. Accordingly, the supposed ‘right to punish’ is in full force again, as are duties to assist, to rescue, and the like – understandably so. However, despite attempts to enlist Pufendorf in such causes by finding the prehistory of pivotal notions like rights, dignity, and equality in his texts (Saastamoinen 2010, Fiorillo 2013a, Müller 2011), his natural law is actually more akin to contrarian approaches like the neo-Hobbesianism of Carl Schmitt (1888–1985), the agonism of Chantal Mouffe (1943–) and James Tully (1946–), the realism of Raymond Geuss (1946– ), and even the pragmatic naturalism of Philip Kitcher (1947– ). These perspectives are not necessarily opposed to the practical aims of the views they oppose and criticize, it may be useful to note (also about Pufendorf), but merely insist upon fewer suppositions, less presumption, and more modest goals.


Unattributed translations in this entry are by the author.

Abbreviations for Pufendorf’s Works (bracketed dates indicate that a title is distinguished from a larger work containing it):

BW Correspondence (Briefwechsel): 1996, 1980
C. Gust. On the Deeds of Charles Gustav, King of Sweden (De rebus a Carolo Gustavo Sueciae rege gestis): 1697a, 1697b, 1696
DAS Select Academic Dissertations (Dissertationes academicae selectiores): 1698, 1679, 1678, 1677, 1675
Discussio Discussion of Certain Writers of Brandenburg (Discussio quorundam scriptorum Brandeburgicorum): [1995e], 1676, 1675a
DJN On the Law of Nature and of Nations (De jure naturae et gentium): 2014, 2005, 1998a, 1998b, 1995c, 1995d, 1994a (sels.), 1987, 1934a, 1934b, 1744, 1729, 1706, 1684, 1672
DO On the Duty of Man and Citizen According to Natural Law (De officio hominis et civis juxta legem naturalem: [2014], 2003, 1997, 1995g, 1995h, 1992, 1991, 1984, 1927a, 1927b, 1735, 1691a, 1673
Einl. An Introduction to the History of the Principal Kingdoms and States of Europe (Einleitung zu der Historie der vornehmsten Reiche und Staaten, so itziger Zeit in Europa sich befinden): 2013, 1976a, [1839, 1714, 1691b], 1686b, 1682
EJU Elements of Universal Jurisprudence (Elementa jurisprudentiae universalis): 2009, 1999, 1995a, 1995b, 1994a (sels.), 1994b, 1931a, 1931b, 1660
ES Eris Scandica und andere polemische Schriften über das Naturrecht: 2002b, 1744, 1686c
Feciale The Divine Feudal Law (Jus feciale divinum): 2004, 2002a, 1695a
Fr. Wilh. On the Deeds of Frederick Wilhelm the Great, Elector of Brandenburg (De rebus gestis Friderici Wilhelmi Magni, Electoris Brandenburgici): 1710a, 1695b
Gust. Ad. Twenty-six Books on Swedish Affairs … Gustav Adolph (Commentariorum de rebus Suecicis … Gustavi Adophi … libri XXVI): 1688, 1686a
GW Samuel Pufendorf: Gesammelte Werke, general editor, Wilhelm Schmidt–Biggemann (Berlin: Akademic Verlag / DeGruyter, 1996 – )
Habitu Of the Nature and Qualification of Religion in Reference to Civil Society (De habitu religionis ad vitam civilem): 2016, 2002c, 1972, 1687
KVS Kleine Vorträge und Schriften. Texte zur Geschichte, Pädagogik, Philosophie, Kirche und Völkerrecht: 1995e
Monz The Present State of Germany ([Severini de Monzambano Veronensis] De statu imperii Germanici ad Laelium fratrem, dominum Trezolani: 2007, 1995f, 1995i, 1994b, 1976b, 1910, 1877, 1870, 1710b, 1667
Occas. On the Alliances Between Sweden and France (De occasionibus foederum inter Sueciam et Galliam : [1995e], 1709, 1708, 1707, 1680
Statu On the Natural State of Men (De statu hominum naturali): 1990, 1675b

Primary Sources: Works by Pufendorf

The following is not a complete list of Pufendorf’s publications and their various editions and translations. Original editions appear only if mentioned in the text or bibliography, and if there have been no later versions. The latter are included based on their accessibility to contemporary readers and the existence of translations into European languages other than Latin.

2016 De habitu religionis ad vitam civilem, W. Schmidt-Biggemann (ed.), (Series: Samuel Pufendorf. Gesammelte Werke, W. Schmidt-Biggemann [ed.], Volume 6). Berlin, Gruyter.
2014 De jure naturae et gentium, F. Böhling (ed.), (Series: Samuel Pufendorf. Gesammelte Werke, W. Schmidt-Biggemann [ed.], Volume 4.3: Materialen und Kommentar). Berlin, Gruyter.
2014 The Pufendorf Lectures: Annotations from the Teaching of Samuel Pufendorf, 1672–1674, B. Lindberg (ed.). Stockholm, Kungl. Vitterhets historie och antikvitets akademien.
2013 An Introduction to the History of the Principal Kingdoms and States of Europe, J. Crull (trans.), M. J. Seidler (ed.), (Series: Natural Law and Enlightenment Classics, K. Haakonssen [ed.]), Indianapolis, Liberty Fund; new edition of London, Gilliflower, 1695.
2009 Two Books of the Elements of Universal Jurisprudence, W. A. Oldfather (trans.), T. Behme (ed.), (Series: Natural Law and Enlightenment Classics, K. Haakonssen [ed.]), Indianapolis, Liberty Fund; revised edition of Pufendorf 1931b.
2007 The Present State of Germany, E. Bohun (trans.), M. J. Seidler (ed.), (Series: Natural Law and Enlightenment Classics, K. Haakonssen [ed.]), Indianapolis, Liberty Fund; new edition of London, Chiswell, 1696.
2005 Of the Law of Nature and Nations: Eight Books, B. Kennett (trans.), … Fourth Edition, … To Which Is Now Prefixed Mr. Barbeyrac’s Prefatory Discourse, … Done into English by Mr. [George] Carew, Buffalo, NY, Hein; see Pufendorf 1729.
2004 Jus feciale divinum, D. Döring (ed.), (Series: Samuel Pufendorf: Gesammelte Werke, W. Schmidt-Biggemann [ed.], Volume 4), Berlin, Akademie Verlag.
2003 The Whole Duty of Man, According to the Law of Nature, B. Tooke (trans.), I. Hunter and D. Saunders (eds.), (Series: Natural Law and Enlightenment Classics, K. Haakonssen [ed.]), Indianapolis, Liberty Fund; see Pufendorf 1735.
2002a The Divine Feudal Law: or, Covenants with Mankind, Represented, T. Dorrington (trans.), S. Zurbuchen (ed.), (Series: Natural Law and Enlightenment Classics, K. Haakonssen [ed.]), Indianapolis, Liberty Fund; new edition of London, Wyat, 1703.
2002b Eris Scandica und andere polemische Schriften über das Naturrecht, F. Palladini (ed.), (Series: Samuel Pufendorf: Gesammelte Werke, W. Schmidt-Biggemann[ed.], Volume 5), Berlin, Akademie.
2002c Of the Nature and Qualification of Religion in Reference to Civil Society, J. Crull (trans.), S. Zurbuchen (ed.), (Series: Natural Law and Enlightenment Classics, K. Haakonssen [ed.]), Indianapolis, Liberty Fund; new edition of London, Roper & Bosville, 1698; translation of Pufendorf 1687.
1999 Elementa jurisprudentiae universalis, T. Behme (ed.), (Series: Samuel Pufendorf: Gesammelte Werke., W. Schmidt-Biggemann [ed.], Volume 3), Berlin, Akademie.
1998a De jure naturae et gentium, 2 vols., F. Böhling (ed.), (Series: Samuel Pufendorf: Gesammelte Werke, W. Schmidt-Biggemann [ed.], Volumes 4.1–2: Text). Berlin, Akademie.
1998b Herrn Samuels Freyherrn von Pufendorf Acht Bücher vom Natur- und Völcker-Rechte, mit Weitberühmten Jcti Johann Nicolai Hertii, Johann Barbeyrac und Anderer Hoch-Gelehrten Männer Ausserlesenen Anmerckungen Erläutert und in die Teutsche Sprache Übersetzt, 2 vols., Hildesheim, Olms; reprint of Frankfurt am Main, Knoch, 1711.
1997 De Officio, G. Hartung (ed.), (Series: Samuel Pufendorf: Gesammelte Werke , W. Schmidt-Biggemann [ed.], Volume 2), Berlin, Akademie; see Pufendorf 1691a.
1996 Briefwechsel, D. Döring (ed.), (Series: Samuel Pufendorf: Gesammelte Werke, W. Schmidt-Biggemann [ed.], Volume 1). Berlin, Akademie.
1995a Elementorum jurisprudentiae universalis libri duo, 2 vols., Volume 1: Text, Buffalo, NY, Hein; reprint of Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1931a.
1995b Elementorum jurisprudentiae universalis libri duo, 2 vols., Volume 2: Translation, W. A. Oldfather (trans.), NY, Hein; reprint of Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1931b.
1995c De jure naturae et gentium libri octo, 2 vols., Volume 1: Text, New York, Hein; reprint of Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1934a.
1995d De jure naturae et gentium libri octo, 2 vols., Volume 2: Translation, C. H. Oldfather and W. A. Oldfather (trans.), Buffalo, NY, Hein; reprint of Oxford, Clarendon Press, 1934b.
1995e Kleine Vorträge und Schriften. Texte zur Geschichte, Pädagogik, Philosophie, Kirche und Völkerrecht, D. Döring (ed.), Frankfurt am Main, Klostermann.
1995f Monzambano, eines Veronesers ungescheuter offenherizger Discurs, oder Gründlicher Bericht von der wahren Beschafenheit und Zustand des Teutschen Reichs. Geschrieben an seinen Bruder Laelium von Monzambano. Herrn zu Trezolan. … ins teutsche überssetzt durch ein ungenantes Glied der hochlöblichen Fruchtbringenden Gesellschaft; in Staatslehre der frühen Neuzeit, N. Hammerstein (ed.) (Series: Bibliothek der Geschichte und Politik). Frankfurt am Main, Deutscher Klassiker Verlag), pp. 568–931 (parallel text).
1995g De officio hominis et civis juxta legem naturalem libri duo, 2 vols., Volume 1: Text, Buffalo, NJ, Hein; reprint of New York, Oxford U. Pr., 1927a.
1995h De officio hominis et civis juxta legem naturalem libri duo, 2 vols., Volume 2: Translation, F. G. Moore (trans.), Buffalo, NJ, Hein; reprint of New York, Oxford U. Pr., 1927b.
1995i Severini de Monzambano Veronensis, De statu Imperii Germanici, ad Laelium fratrem, Dominum Trezolani, liber unus, in Staatslehre der frühen Neuzeit, N. Hammerstein (ed.) (Series: Bibliothek der Geschichte und Politik). Frankfurt am Main, Deutscher Klassiker Verlag, pp. 568–931 (parallel text).
1994a The Political Writings of Samuel Pufendorf., M. J. Seidler (trans.), C. L. Carr (ed.), New York, Oxford U. Pr.
1994b Die Verfassung des Deutschen Reiches (parallel text), H. Denzer (ed. and trans.), (Series: Bibliothek des Deutschen Staatswesens, H. Maier and M. Stolleis [eds.], Volume 4), Frankfurt/M, Insel; see Pufendorf 1976b.
1992 Les devoirs de l’homme et du citoyen tels qu’ils lui sont préscrits par la loi naturelle, J. Barbeyrac (trans.), Hildesheim, Olms; reprint of Amsterdam, Coup & Kuyper, 1734–35.
1991 On the Duty of Man and Citizen According to Natural Law, M. Silverthorne (trans.), J. Tully (ed.), New York, Cambridge U. Pr.
1990 Samuel Pufendorf’s ‘On the Natural State of Men’. The 1678 Latin Edition and English Translation, M. Seidler (ed. and trans.), Lewiston, ME, Mellen.
1987 Le droit de la nature et des gens, J. Barbeyrac (trans.), 4th ed., 2 vols., Caen, Centre de Philosophie Politique et Juridique de l’Université de Caen; reprint of Basel, Thourneisen, 1732.
1984 Les devoirs de l’homme et du citoyen, J. Barbeyrac (trans.), 6th ed., 2 vols., Caen: Centre de Philosophie Politique et Juridique de l’Université de Caen; reprint of London, Nourse, 1741.
1980 Briefe Samuel Pufendorfs an Christian Thomasius. Pufendorf-Briefe an Falaiseau, Friese, und Weigel, E. Gigas and K. Varrentrapp (eds.), (Series: Scriptor Reprints, Sammlung 18. Jahrhundert, J. Garber [ed.]), Meisenheim am Glan, Hain; reprint of Leipzig, Oldenbourg, 1897, and Historische Zeitschrift N.F. 34 (1893).
1976a The Compleat History of Sweden, C. Brockwell (trans.), Norwood, PA, Norwood Editions; translation of Pufendorf 1686b.
1976b Die Verfassung des Deutschen Reiches von Samuel von Pufendorf, H. Denzer (trans.), Stuttgart, Reclam; translation of Pufendorf 1667; see Pufendorf 1994b.
1972 De habitu religionis christianae ad vitam civilem, Stuttgart- Bad Canstatt, Frommann; reprint of Bremen, Schwerdtfeger, 1687.
1934a De jure naturae et gentium libri octo, 2 vols., Volume 1: Text, (Series: The Classics of International Law, ed. J. B. Scott [ed.], No. 17), Oxford, Clarendon Press; photographic reproduction of Amsterdam, Hoogenhuysen, 1688.
1934b De jure naturae et gentium libri octo, 2 vols., Volume 2: Translation, C. H. Oldfather and W. A. Oldfather (trans.), (Series: The Classics of International Law, J. B. Scott [ed.], No. 17), Oxford, Clarendon Press.
1931a Elementorum jurisprudentiae universalis libri duo, 2 vols., Volume 1: Text, with an Introduction by Hans Wehberg, (Series: The Classics of International Law, J. B. Scott [ed.], No. 15), Oxford, Clarendon Press; photographic reproduction of Cantabrigiae, Hayes, 1672.
1931b Elementorum jurisprudentiae universalis libri duo, 2 vols., vol. 2: Translation, W. A. Oldfather (trans.), (Series: The Classics of International Law, J. B. Scott [ed.], No. 15), Oxford, Clarendon Press; see Pufendorf 2009.
1927a De officio hominis et civis juxta legem naturalem libri duo, 2 vols., Volume 1: Text, (Series: The Classics of International Law, J. B. Scott [ed.], No. 10), New York, Oxford U. Pr.; reprint of Cantabrigiae, Hayes, 1682.
1927b De officio hominis et civis juxta legem naturalem libri duo, 2 vols., Volume 2: Translation, F. G. Moore (trans.), (Series: The Classics of International Law, ed. J. B. Scott [ed.], No. 10), New York, Oxford U. Pr.
1910 Severinus de Monzambano (Samuel von Pufendorf) De statu Imperii Germanici, F. Salomon (ed.), Weimar, Hermann Böhlaus Nachfolger.
1877 Die Verfassung des deutschen Reiches von Samuel von Pufendorf, H. Dove (trans.), Leipzig, Philipp Reclam.
1870 Über die Verfassung des deutschen Reiches, H. Breßlau (trans.), Berlin, Heimann.
1839 Samuel von Pufendorff: Über das Pabstthum, C. H. Weise (ed.), Quedlinburg & Leipzig, Basse; revised edition of Pufendorf 1714.
1784 De rebus gestis Friderici Tertii, Electoris Brandenburgici, post primi Borussiae Regis commentariorum libri tres, complectentes annos 1688–1690. Fragmentum posthumum ex autographo auctoris editum, E. F. de Hertzberg (ed.), Berlin, Decker.
1744 De jure naturæ et gentium libri octo: cum integris commentariis virorum clarissimorum Jo. N. Hertii atque J. Barbeyraci. Accedit Eris Scandica, G. Mascovius (ed.), Frankfurt am Main & Leipzig, Knoch.
1735 The Whole Duty of Man according to the Law of Nature, A. Tooke (trans.), 5th ed., London, Gosling; newly edited as Pufendorf 2003.
1729 Of the Law of Nature and Nations, B. Kennett (trans.), 4th ed., to which are added all the large notes of Mr. Barbeyrac, … [and] Mr. Barbeyrac’s prefatory discourse, containing an historical and critical account of the science of morality … done into English by Mr. Carew, London, Walthoe; translation of Pufendorf 1706; see Pufendorf 2005.
1719 [Esaias Pufendorf?], Memoirs of Sweden, Containing a Particular Account of the Great Change which Happened in the Government of that Kingdom, in the Reign of King Charles XI…. / Written by a Foreign Minister Residing in Sweden at That Time, translated from the French, London, Innys.
1714 Des Freyherrn von Pufendorff politische Betrachtung der geistlichen Monarchie des Stuhls zu Rom, mit Anmerckungen. Zum Gebrauch der Thomasischen Auditorii, Halle, Renger; see Pufendorf 1839.
1710a Friederich Wilhelms des Grossen Chur-Fürstens zu Brandenburg Leben und Thaten, E. Uhse (trans.), Berlin & Franckfurt, Schrey und Meyer; translation of Pufendorf 1695b.
1710b Samuels Freyhrn. von Puffendorff kurtzer doch gründlicher Bericht von dem Zustande des H. R. Reichs Teutscher Nation: vormahls in Lateinischer Sprache unter dem Titel Severin von Monzambano herausgegeben, Anietzo aber ins Teutsche übersezet … Ingleichen mit … Anmerckungen … nicht weniger mit gantz neuen Remarquen und nützlichen Registern vesehen. Deme noch beygefüget (1.) Die Historie von dem wunderlichen Lärmen und Tumult welcher in der gelehrten Welt dieses Buches wegen entstanden. (2.) Des Hrn. Autoris Untersuchung von der Beschaffenheit eines irregulieren Staats [= De republica irregulari]. (3.) Vita, Fama, et Fata Literaria Pufendorfiana, oder denckwürdige Lebens-Memoire des weltberuffenen Herrn Autoris, Petronius Harteviggus Adlemansthal [i.e., Peter Dahlmann] (ed. and trans.), Leipzig, Weidmann.
1709 Dissertation de Mr. de Puffendorf sur les alliances entre la France et la Suede …, traduit du Latin, La Haye, Johnson; see Pufendorf 1680.
1708 Dissertatio de foederibus inter Sueciam et Galliam in qua passim ostenditur, quam male illa a Gallis observata sint …, The Hague, Johnson; see Pufendorf 1680.
1707 A Discourse by M. Samuel Puffendorf upon the Alliances Between Sweden and France … Written in the Year 1680 …, Mr. Ozell (trans.), London, Buckley et al.; see Pufendorf 1680.
1706 Le droit de la nature et des gens… avec des notes du traducteur … et une preface …, J. Barbeyrac (trans.), Amsterdam, Kuyper, 1706; see Pufendorf 1987.
1697a Herrn Samuel Freyherrns von Pufendorf Sieben Bücher von den Thaten Carl Gustavs Königs in Schweden, S. R. (trans.), Nürnberg, Riegel; translation of Pufendorf 1696.
1697b Histoire du regne de Charles Gustave, roi de Suede … Traduite en François sur le Latin de S. de Pufendorf, G. Thomasius (ed.), Nuremberg, Riegel; translation of Pufendorf 1696.
1696 De rebus a Carolo Gustavo Sueciae rege gestis commentariorum libri septem. Elegantissimis tabulis aeneis exornati, cum triplice indice, G. Thomasius (ed.), Nuremberg, Riegel; see Pufendorf 1697a and 1697b.
1695a Jus feciale divinum sive de consensu et dissensu Protestantium exercitatio posthuma, Lübeck, A.S.R.
1695b De rebus gestis Friderici Wilhelmi Magni, Electoris Brandenburgici commentariorum libri novendecim, Berlin, J. Schrey & H. J. Meyer; see Pufendorf 1710a.
1691a Herrn Samuel von Pufendorff Einleitung zur Sitten- und Statslehre …, I. Weber (trans.), Leipzig, Gleditsch; reprinted in Pufendorf 1997.
1691b The History of Popedom: Containing the Rise, Progress and Decay Thereof, J. Chamberylayne (trans.), London, Hindmarsh; see Pufendorf 1714, 1839.
1688 Herrn Samuel von Pufendorf Sechs und Zwantzig Bücher der Schwedisch- und Deutschen Kriegs-Geschichte von König Gustav Adolfs Feldzüge in Deutschland an biß zur Abdanckung der Königin Christina, J. J. Möller (trans.), Franckfurt am Mayn & Leipzig, Gleditsch; translation of Pufendorf 1686a.
1687 De habitu religionis Christianae ad vitam civilem, Liber Singularis. Accedunt Animadversiones ad aliqua loca è Politica Adriani Houtuyn JCti Batavi, Bremen, Schwerdfeger; reprinted Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt, Frommann-Holzboog, 1972.
1686a Commentariorum de rebus Suecicis libri XXVI ab expeditione Gustavi Adolfi Regis in Germaniam ad abdicationem usque Christinae, Ultrajecti, Ribbius.
1686b Continuirte Einleitung zu der Historie der vornehmsten Reiche und Staaten von Europa, worinnen des Königreichs Schweden Geschichte und dessen mit auswertigen Cronen geführte Kriege insonderheit beschrieben werden, Frankfurt, Knoch; see Pufendorf 1976a.
1686c Eris Scandica: qua adversus libros De jure naturali et gentium objecta diluuntur, Frankfurt am Main, Knoch; see Pufendorf 2002b.
1684 De jure naturæ et gentium libri octo, 2nd ed., Frankfurt am Main, Knoch.
1682 Einleitung zu der Historie der vornehmsten Reiche und Staaten, so itziger Zeit in Europa sich befinden, Frankfurt, Knoch; see Pufendorf 2013.
1680 De occasionibus foederum inter Sueciam et Galliam et quam parum illa ex parte Galliae observata sint; in Pufendorf 1995e: pp. 360–85; see Pufendorf 1707, 1708, and 1709.
1676 Beleuchtigung und Wiederlegung einiger Brandenburgischen Schrifften … Anno 1675 in lateinischer Sprache zu Papier und Druck gegeben, und nunmehr mittels praemittirter Vorrede ins teutsche versetzt; translation of 1675a.
1675a Discussio quorundam scriptorum Brandeburgicorum, in Pufendorf 1995e: pp. 281–327.
1675b Dissertationes academicae selectiores, Lund, V. Haberegger.
1673 De officio hominis et civis juxta legem naturalem libri duo, Lund, Junghans.
1672 De jure naturæ et gentium libri octo, Lund, Junghans.
1667 Severini de Monzambano Veronensis De statu imperii Germanici ad Laelium fratrem, dominum Trezolani, liber unus, Geneva [The Hague], Petrus Columesius [Adrian Vlacq].
1660 Elementorum jurisprudentiæ universalis libri II, The Hague, A. Vlacq.

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