Thomas Hobbes (1588–1679), whose current reputation rests largely on his political philosophy, was a thinker with wide-ranging interests. In philosophy, he defended a range of materialist, nominalist, and empiricist views against Cartesian and Aristotelian alternatives. In physics, his work was influential on Leibniz, and led him into disputes with Boyle and the experimentalists of the early Royal Society. In history, he translated Thucydides’ History of the Peloponnesian War into English, and later wrote his own history of the Long Parliament. In mathematics he was less successful, and is best remembered for his repeated unsuccessful attempts to square the circle. But despite that, Hobbes was a serious and prominent participant in the intellectual life of his time.
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Thomas Hobbes was born on 5 April 1588. His home town was Malmesbury, which is in Wiltshire, England, about 30 miles east of Bristol. Very little is known about Hobbes’s mother. His father, also called Thomas Hobbes, was a somewhat disreputable local clergyman. Hobbes’s seventeenth-century biographer John Aubrey tells the story of how “The old vicar Hobs was a good fellow and had been at cards Saturday all night, and at church in his sleep he cries out ‘Trafells is troumps’” [i.e., clubs are trumps] (Aubrey 1696, 1.387). The older Thomas Hobbes eventually (in 1604) left Malmesbury, when a dispute with another clergyman, Richard Jeane, escalated to the point of a fight in a churchyard. In Aubrey’s words: “Hobs stroke him and was forcd to fly for it” (Aubrey 1696, 1.387).
By that point the future philosopher Hobbes had himself left Malmesbury (in 1602 or 1603), in order to study at Magdalen Hall, Oxford. His studies there were supported by his uncle, Francis Hobbes, who was a glover. After graduating from Oxford in February 1608, Hobbes went to work for the Cavendish family, initially as a tutor to William Cavendish (1590–1628), who later became the second earl of Devonshire. Hobbes would work for the same family most of the rest of his life. His work for the Cavendish family is part of what allowed Hobbes to think and write as he did: it gave him access to books, and connections to other philosophers and scientists.
Hobbes’s first notable philosophical works are from around 1640. Before then he had, significantly, published in 1629 a translation of Thucydides’ History of the Peloponnesian War into English. Hobbes had also interacted with various prominent intellectual figures. On a trip around Europe in the mid-1630s, Hobbes met Marin Mersenne in Paris. Aubrey claims that “When he [Hobbes] was at Florence … he contracted a friendship with the famous Galileo Galilei” (Aubrey 1696, 1.366), although curiously Hobbes’s autobiographical writings do not mention this, though they do mention meeting Mersenne. Earlier on, around 1620, Hobbes worked for some time as a secretary to Francis Bacon.
Hobbes first made a notable impact with philosophical writings in the early 1640s. These included his Elements of Law and De Cive. The Elements of Law, which Hobbes circulated in 1640, is the first work in which Hobbes follows his typical systematic pattern of starting with the workings of the mind and language, and developing the discussion towards political matters. De Cive (1642) was Hobbes’s first published book of political philosophy. This work focuses more narrowly on the political: its three main sections are titled “Liberty”, “Empire” and “Religion”. However, De Cive was conceived as part of a larger work, the Elements of Philosophy. That work eventually had three parts: De Corpore (1655), De Homine (1658), and De Cive itself. De Corpore, which is discussed below, covers issues of logic, language, method, metaphysics, mathematics, and physics. De Homine, meanwhile, focuses on matters of physiology and optics.
At this time Hobbes also had a series of interactions with Descartes. In 1640 Hobbes sent to Mersenne a set of comments on Descartes’s Discourse and Optics. Descartes saw some of this, and sent a letter to Mersenne in response, to which Hobbes also responded. Then in 1641 Hobbes’s objections were among those published along with Descartes’s Meditations. In these exchanges and elsewhere, the attitudes of Hobbes and Descartes to one another involved a curious mixture of respect and dismissal. On the one occasion they are said to have met, in 1648, they did not get along well (Martinich 1999, 171). In earlier letters, Descartes suggested that Hobbes was more accomplished in moral philosophy than elsewhere, but also that he had wicked views there (Descartes 1643, 3.230–1). Descartes also worried that Hobbes was “aiming to make his reputation at my expense, and by devious means” (Descartes 1641b, 100). Aubrey reports that the two “mutually respected one another”, but also that Hobbes thought that Descartes would have been better off sticking to geometry (Aubrey 1696, 1.367).
Hobbes spent the next decade in exile in Paris, leaving England late in 1640, and not returning until 1651. His exile was related to the civil wars of the time. Hobbes was associated with the royalist side, and might also have had reason to fear punishment because of his defence of absolute sovereignty in his political philosophy. During his time in France, Hobbes continued to associate with Mersenne and his circle, including Pierre Gassendi, who seems to have been a particular friend of Hobbes’s. Late in his time in France, Hobbes wrote Leviathan, which was published in 1651. Its structure is somewhat similar to that of the Elements of Law, though it also contains lengthy discussions of matters of scriptural interpretation, and it is probably the most overtly polemical of Hobbes’s major works.
After his return to England in 1651, Hobbes continued to publish philosophical works for several years. De Corpore was published in 1655, and provides Hobbes’s main statements on several topics, such as method and the workings of language. De Homine was published in 1658, completing the plan of the Elements of Philosophy. In later years Hobbes defended his work in a series of extended debates. These included debates with John Wallis and Seth Ward that centred on Hobbes’s alleged squaring of the circle (Jesseph 1999), debates with John Bramhall about liberty and necessity (Jackson 2007), and debates with Robert Boyle about the experimental physics of the Royal Society (Shapin & Schaffer 1989). He also published a Latin edition of Leviathan in 1668, in which there were some significant changes and additions relating to controversial topics, such as his treatments of the Trinity and the nature of God. But Hobbes’s attention was not on philosophy alone. Indeed, in the 1670s he published translations of the Odyssey and Iliad. And in the late 1660s he wrote a history of the civil wars, Behemoth; or, The Long Parliament, which was published posthumously (Hobbes 1668a).
Hobbes died on 4 December 1679 at Hardwick Hall, one of the homes of the Cavendish family, with whom he was still associated after seventy years.
At an abstract level, The Elements of Law, the Elements of Philosophy, and Leviathan all share a structure. Hobbes begins with questions about mind and language, and works towards questions in political philosophy. How exactly the parts of the system are connected has long been debated. But Hobbes thinks at least that we will better understand how individuals interact in groups if we understand how individuals work. Thus the first part of The Elements of Law is titled “Human Nature” and the second “De Corpore Politico” (i.e., “About the Body Politic”). Hobbes did not insist it was necessary to work through all the issues about individuals before tackling the issues about groups, as he acknowledged when he published the third part of the Elements of Philosophy (De Cive) first. But he did think it helpful. Thus even in Leviathan, with its focus on political and religious matters, Hobbes starts with a story about the workings of the mind. The first six chapters work through issues about the senses, imagination, language, reason, knowledge, and the passions.
Hobbes is a sort of empiricist, in that he thinks all of our ideas are derived, directly or indirectly, from sensation. In addition he tells a causal story about perception, which is largely the story of a causal chain of motions. The object causes (immediately or mediately) pressure on the sense organ, which causes motion inside us, all the way to the “brain and heart”. There this motion causes “a resistance, or counter-pressure, or endeavour of the heart to deliver itself; which endeavour, because outward, seemeth to be some matter without. And this seeming, or fancy, is that which men call sense” (Hobbes 1651, 1.4). Quite why this endeavour from inside to out should make the sensation seem to come from outside is unclear, for things coming from outside should be moving the other way. At any rate, the sensation is strongly grounded in, perhaps even identical with, the internal motions. But what, we might ask, is the quality? What is, say, red? In this chapter Hobbes seems happy to say that red in the object is just motions in it, and that red in us is motions in us, which give rise to or are a certain sensation. And he seems happy to avoid the issue of whether red itself belongs to the sensation or the object. In the Elements of Law, however, he’d been clear about the view that colours inhere in the perceivers, not the objects (Hobbes 1640, 1.2).
Imagination is Hobbes’s next topic. His basic thought is that our sensations remain after the act of sensing, but in a weaker way: “after the object is removed, or the eye shut, we still retain an image of the thing seen, though more obscure than when we see it” (Hobbes 1651, 2.2). This is a story about how we form ideas. More generally, imagination has a crucial role in Hobbes’s picture of the workings of the mind. One sort of imagination is what we would now call imagination, “as when from the sight of a man at one time, and of a horse at another, we conceive in our mind a Centaur” (Hobbes 1651, 2.4). That is, we can take the ideas, the faded sensations, from different experiences and combine them together. But Hobbes also connects imagination, and “the faculty of imagining” (Hobbes 1651, 2.10) closely to memory and to understanding. Imagination and memory, Hobbes says, are the same thing, with two names that point to different aspects of the phenomenon of decaying sense. If we want to point to the idea or image itself, we use ‘imagination’, but if we want to point to the decay, we use ‘memory’ (Hobbes 1651, 2.3).
Moreover, Hobbes thinks that understanding is a sort of imagination. That is, the faculty of imagining is responsible for understanding, as well as for compounding images and for memory. Understanding is, Hobbes says, “[t]he imagination that is raised in man (or any other creature endued with the faculty of imagining) by words or other voluntary signs” (Hobbes 1651, 2.10). Understanding is not restricted to humans. So, for example, “a dog by custom will understand the call … of its master” (Hobbes 1651, 2.10). But humans have a sort of understanding that other creatures lack. A dog, for instance, can understand the will of its owner, say that its owner wants it to sit down. In general, the understanding that non-human animals can have is the understanding of will. But humans can also understand the “conceptions and thoughts” (Hobbes 1651, 2.10) of others from their uses of language.
Understanding is for Hobbes the work of the faculty of imagination, and crucially involves language. An account of the workings of language is thus crucial for his having an account of the workings of the mind. For Hobbes, the mind contains sense, imagination, and the workings of language, and no further rational faculty, such as the Cartesian immaterial mind that can grasp natures by clear and distinct perception. His story about sensation, the formation of ideas, and the workings of imagination is supposed to explain how some of our thought works. But only with the further story about language and understanding in place does he have a full alternative to Descartes’s story about our cognitive faculties. For Descartes, sense and imagination are, as in Hobbes’s story, closely connected to the workings of the brain, but higher cognitive functions are performed by the immaterial mind. Hobbes denies the existence of that immaterial mind, and needs other accounts of those functions. This – combined no doubt with some independent interest in the topic – leads to Hobbes devoting a fair amount of attention to issues in the philosophy of language.
Hobbes’s account of language is crucial for his account of the mind, and has important connections to his views in political philosophy (Pettit 2008). Reading Hobbes’s various accounts of language, it quickly becomes clear that the notion of signification is central. It is apparently the central semantic relationship in Hobbes’s story, playing the sort of role that’s played in more recent accounts by meaning or sense or reference (Abizadeh 2015; Pécharman 2004). But what is signification? One important question here is whether and how Hobbes distinguishes signification (and the thing signified) from naming (and the thing named).
When Hobbes introduces his story about names in the The Elements of Law he tells us that “A NAME or APPELLATION therefore is the voice of a man, arbitrarily imposed, for a mark to bring to his mind some conception concerning the thing on which it is imposed. Things named are either the objects themselves, as man; or the conception itself that we have of man, as shape or motion; or some privation, which is when we conceive that there is something which we conceive, not in him” (Hobbes 1640, 5.2–3). That is, Hobbes first introduces names as having a private use for individuals, to help them to bring particular ideas to mind. (Hobbes uses ‘name’ in a very broad sense. In that chapter alone, he gives ‘Socrates’, ‘Homer’, ‘man’, ‘just’, ‘valiant’, ‘strong’, ‘comely’, and ‘faith’ as example of names.) Notice here that though the point of using names is to recall ideas, the thing named is not necessarily an idea. It may well be an external object such as, in Hobbes’s example, a man. Later in that chapter, Hobbes starts to talk explicitly about signifying rather than naming. Thus in talking about ambiguity Hobbes says that “the word faith sometimes signifieth the same with belief; sometimes it signifieth particularly that belief which maketh a Christian; and sometimes it signifieth the keeping of a promise” (Hobbes 1640, 5.7). However, it is not at all clear that he really means to introduce signifying as a relation distinct from naming here. Indeed, he seems rather to be giving the same relation two different names.
In Leviathan and De Corpore something more complex goes on (Duncan 2011). The equivalent chapters in Leviathan and De Corpore start in the same way, with discussions of the role of names as marks to aid the memory (Hobbes 1651, 4.3; Hobbes 1655, 2.1). However, both then go straight on to introduce another role for names, as signs to the hearer of the speaker’s thoughts (Hobbes 1651, 4.3; Hobbes 1655, 2.2–5). And ‘signify’ appears to be the verb corresponding to what signs do. Though there are hints of this account in Leviathan, it is set out in most detail in De Corpore. There Hobbes says that names alone are not signs: “they are not signs except insofar as they are arranged in speech and are its parts” (Hobbes 1655, 2.3). So when we talk about signification, it’s the act of signifying, of communicating one’s thoughts by using words that are a sign of them, that is basic. In other terminology, while words name things, it’s utterances that have signification.
Someone might think that, and nevertheless have a derivative notion of what a word signifies. Hobbes takes some steps in this direction. In particular, we can understand two words having the same signification as their being interchangeable without changing the signification of the utterance (Hungerland and Vick 1981, 68). Thus Hobbes uses ‘signify’ when talking about a translation relation, as when he says in Leviathan that “the Greeks call it fancy, which signifies appearance” (Hobbes 1651, 2.2). And some interpreters go further, and take Hobbes to believe that words signify ideas, which are the ideas they call to mind when used in utterances.
Hobbes is a nominalist: he believes that the only universal things are names (Hobbes 1640, 5.6–7; Hobbes 1651, 4.6–8; Hobbes 1655, 2.9). The word ‘tree’ is, Hobbes thinks, a universal or common name that names each of the trees. There is one name, and there are many trees. But there is not, Hobbes argues, some further thing that is the universal tree. Nor is there some universal idea that is somehow of each or all of the trees. Rather, ‘tree’ names each of the trees, each of the individuals to which the term applies (not, note, the collection of them).
What Hobbes calls common names, those words which apply to multiple things, are applied because of similarities between those things, not because of any relation to a universal thing or idea. There are, in the minds of speakers, ideas related to those names, but they are not abstract or general ideas, but individual images of individual things. I could use ‘tree’ now, associating it with a tall pine tree, and tomorrow use ‘tree’ but have before my mind a short beech tree. What matters, Hobbes says, is that “we remember that vocal sounds of this kind sometimes evoked one thing in the mind, sometimes something else” (Hobbes 1655, 2.9).
Hobbes’s nominalism was recognized by his contemporaries, but was also criticized as going too far. Leibniz put the point as follows.
Hobbes seems to me to be a super-nominalist. For not content like the nominalists, to reduce universals to names, he says that the truth of things itself consists in names and what is more, that it depends on the human will, because truth allegedly depends on the definitions of terms, and definitions depend on the human will. This is the opinion of a man recognized as among the most profound of our century, and as I said, nothing can be more nominalistic than it. Yet it cannot stand. In arithmetic, and in other disciplines as well, truths remain the same even if notations are changed, and it does not matter whether a decimal or a duodecimal number system is used (Leibniz 1670, 128).
Similar worries, that Hobbes’s views could not account for the fact that the same truths can be expressed in different languages, were expressed by Descartes in his reply to Hobbes’s objections to the Meditations (Descartes 1641a, 2.126) and by Henry More in his Immortality of the Soul (More 1659, 133–4). Hobbes would apparently say, given his story about signification, that “This bag is red” has the same signification as “Diese Tasche is rot”. However, he does endorse various claims about aspects of language and truth being conventional and arbitrary. Some such claims are widely agreed upon: whether we write from left to right or right to left, for instance, and what particular marks we choose to represent words on paper. But Hobbes also endorses other, more controversial, claims of this sort. Most controversially perhaps, Hobbes thinks that there is a conventionality and arbitrariness in the way in which we divide the world up in to kinds. Though the application of ‘red’ to some objects and not others is based on similarities between those objects, the similarities do not demand that we group exactly those objects together under a name. That is, the groupings and kinds, though based in similarities, are not determined by those similarities alone, but also and primarily by our decisions, which involve awareness of the similarities, but also an arbitrary element. This introduces an extra arbitrary element into the truth of ‘This bag is red’, for even if all the underlying similarities had been the same, we might have, say, drawn the line between red and orange in a different place. However, it’s not at all clear that such arbitrariness gives rise to the problematic consequences that Descartes and Leibniz think it does (Bolton 1977).
Hobbes describes reasoning as computation, and offers sketches of the computation that he thinks is going on when we reason. This idea might appear to have significant connections to later views, both to some views of Leibniz’s and to more recent approaches that adopt a computational theory of mind. This section looks at Hobbes’s presentation of the idea, and then briefly at these two possible connections.
In De Corpore Hobbes first describes the view that reasoning is computation early in chapter one. “By reasoning”, he says “I understand computation. And to compute is to collect the sum of many things added together at the same time, or to know the remainder when one thing has been taken from another. To reason therefore is the same as to add or to subtract” (Hobbes 1655, 1.2). In the section that follows, Hobbes gives some initial examples of addition in reasoning, which are examples of adding ideas together to form more complex ones. Thus “from the conceptions of a quadrilateral figure, an equilateral figure, and a rectangular figure the conception of a square is composed” (Hobbes 1655, 1.3). That’s but a small part of our mental activity though. Hobbes also describes propositions and syllogisms as sorts of addition:
a syllogism is nothing other than a collection of a sum which is made from two propositions (through a common term which is called a middle term) conjoined to one another; and thus a syllogism is an addition of three names, just as a proposition is of two (Hobbes 1655, 4.6).
A proposition is in a sense formed by adding the name of the predicate to the name of the subject, so by adding ‘snow’ and ‘white’ we get ‘snow is white’. (We add ‘is’ as well, but as Hobbes argues, it’s not necessary, for we could indicate the same thing by word order rather than having an extra word as the copula.) In thinking about syllogisms, think about the example “Every man is an animal; every animal is a body; therefore every man is a body” (Hobbes 1655, 4.4). In some sense we add the propositions, or at least bits of them: we add the subject of the first proposition to the predicate of the second, aided in this by the middle term.
This is an intruiging suggestion, but seems not to be very far developed. This addition has to follow some rules, especially in the syllogistic case. As Hobbes says, “Every man is an animal; some animal is a quadruped; therefore, some man is a quadruped” is “defective” (Hobbes 1655, 4.4). But its conclusion too involves the addition of parts of the premises. Presumably syllogistic addition, like arithmetic addition, must have its rules. And of course, Hobbes was aware of the properties of various good and bad arguments. But it’s not clear what he added to that discussion by bringing in the language of addition. Nor, indeed, is it clear what he really added to his discussion of the workings of the mind by his occasional use of such language.
Nevertheless, the notion that reasoning is computation has been referred back to more than once. Leibniz explicitly endorsed and developed it in one early work: “Thomas Hobbes, everywhere a profound examiner of principles, rightly stated that everything done by our mind is a computation, by which is to be understood either the addition of a sum or the subtraction of a difference … So just as there are two primary signs of algebra and analytics, + and −, in the same way there are as it were two copulas, ‘is’ and ‘is not’” (Leibniz 1666, 3). And the idea appears to have continued to hold some appeal for him. Thus for example Leibniz’s numerical characteristic (Leibniz 1679) attempts in another way to use the language of addition and subtraction to explain aspects of reasoning.
Much more recently, some philosophers discussing the computational theory of mind have also seen connections to Hobbes’s idea. The central idea of a modern computational theory of mind is that the mind is a sort of computer. More precisely and technically, “the immediately implementing mechanisms for intentional laws are computational … [Computations] viewed in intension, are mappings from symbols under syntactic description to symbols under syntactic description” (Fodor 1994, 8). And very roughly, we might see Hobbes as saying the same thing. There are various mental processes (compounding ideas, forming propositions, reasoning syllogistically) that we can describe without knowing that reasoning is computation. But the underlying process that’s making this all work is computation, namely, addition and subtraction. The connections seem to amount to no more than that though, so it’s at least rather over-dramatic to say that Hobbes was “prophetically launching Artificial Intelligence” (Haugeland 1985, 23).
By the time of Leviathan and De Corpore, Hobbes was convinced that human beings (including their minds) were entirely material. Later on he came to think that even God was a sort of material being (Gorham 2013, Springborg 2012). This section focuses on Hobbes’s materialism about human beings. This was not a popular or widely-held position at the time. Hobbes, however, was a materialist. Why was he a materialist?
We might suspect that Hobbes’s story about the workings of mind and language (e.g., in the early chapters of Leviathan) is supposed to be an implicit argument for materialism. ‘Look’, we might take Hobbes to be saying, ‘I can explain all the workings of the mind using only material resources. What need is there to postulate an immaterial mind when this perfectly good, and more minimal, explanation is available?’ Hobbes perhaps suggests this when he notes that his nominalism means we do not need to suppose there’s any faculty other than imagination in order to understand how universal thought works (Hobbes 1655, 2.9). However, for the most part we do not find Hobbes explicitly stating that argument. Instead he presents a series of arguments against various opponents’ beliefs in immaterial beings (including immaterial human minds).
Most prominent in Leviathan is an argument that talk about incorporeal things is “insignificant speech”.
All other names are but insignificant sounds; and those of two sorts. One when they are new, and yet their meaning not explained by definition; whereof there have been abundance coined by schoolmen, and puzzled philosophers.
Another, when men make a name of two names, whose significations are contradictory and inconsistent; as this name, an incorporeal body, or (which is all one) an incorporeal substance, and a great number more. For whensoever any affirmation is false, the two names of which it is composed, put together and made one, signify nothing at all (Hobbes 1655, 4.20–1).
Thus Hobbes apparently thinks that talk about incorporeal substances (such as Cartesian unextended thinking things) is just nonsense. But why does he think that? Hobbes’s comment about false affirmations suggests he thinks that ‘incorporeal substance’ is insignificant because ‘a substance is incorporeal’ is false. But that seems to derive the insignificance from the truth of materialism, which is hardly going to convince Hobbes’s opponents. Hobbes does offer a supporting argument, when he claims that ‘incorporeal substance’ and ‘incorporeal body’ are “all one”. But that premise too will be denied by his opponents, who think that there can be substances that are not bodies, and that ‘substance’ and ‘body’ are far from interchangeable terms.
Hobbes offers a further argument against his opponents’ belief in immaterial things in De Corpore, in a passage in which he talks at length about the “gross errors” of philosophers.
But the abuse consists in this, that when some men see that the increases and decreases of quantity, heat, and other accidents can be considered, that is, submitted to reasons, as we say, without consideration of bodies or their subjects (which is called “abstraction” or “existence apart from them”), they talk about accidents as if they could be separated from every body. The gross errors of certain metaphysicians take their origin from this; for from the fact that it is possible to consider thinking without considering body, they infer that there is no need for a thinking body; and from the fact that it is possible to consider quantity without considering body, they also think that quantity can exist without body and body without quantity, so that a quantitative body is made only after quantity has been added to a body. These meaningless vocal sounds, “abstract substances,” “separated essence,” and other similar ones, spring from the same fountain (Hobbes 1655, 3.4).
The key mistake, Hobbes thinks, lies in moving from the observations that we can talk about ‘A’ and ‘B’, and can think about A without thinking about B, to the conclusion that A can exist without B existing. Hobbes attacks various views associated with the Scholastic Aristotelian tradition as resting on that mistake. One aim of this critical passage is to support materialism by showing a problem with the belief that there can be thought without a body. Hobbes elsewhere claims that Aristotle thinks that “the human soul, separated from man, subsists by itself”, so presumably has Aristotle and Aristotelians in mind as targets (Hobbes 1668b, 46.17).
When Hobbes talks about Aristotelian views, one might ask whether his target is Aristotle himself, or some later Aristotelians. When Hobbes talks about Aristotelian metaphysics in particular, his main approach seems to be to take a certain core view to have been Aristotle’s, then to criticize both that view and the further uses that were made of it. Hobbes’s attitude to Aristotelianism comes across forcefully in a discussion in Behemoth that begins by describing Peter Lombard and John Duns Scotus as writing like “two of the most egregious blockheads in the world” (Hobbes 1668a, 41–2). That exchange has several elements: the condemnation of the philosophical view as nonsensical; the claim that some philosophers aim to confuse; and the claim that views are promoted in order to control the public and take their money. However, though Hobbes rejected many of the views of the Scholastic Aristotelian tradition, his work nevertheless had several connections to it, as is illustrated by Leijenhorst 2002.
The view that there can be thought without a body is also Descartes’s view. Indeed, Hobbes may be thinking of Descartes’s argument for that view in the Sixth Meditation. A key claim in Descartes’s argument is that “the fact that I can clearly and distinctly understand one thing apart from another is enough to make me certain that the two things are distinct” (Descartes 1641a, 2.54). Descartes argues, via that claim, from his ability to clearly and distinctly conceive of mind apart from body and vice versa, to the conclusion that mind and body are really distinct (i.e., are two substances, not one). Abstracting away from the details, we have an argument from the conceivability of mind without body to the conclusion that the mind is not physical. And such an argument is one of Hobbes’s targets in the “gross errors” passage.
However Descartes, by endorsing that argument, does not endorse the claim that ‘if I can conceive of A’s existing without B’s existing, then A can exist without B existing’. He endorses at most the weaker claim that ‘if I can clearly and distinctly conceive of A’s existing without B existing, then A can exist without B existing’. There’s a special sort of conceivability involved here, clear and distinct conceivability, which licenses the move in this case but not in general. Hobbes’s argument seems blind to this distinction.
Overall then, something of a puzzle remains. Hobbes clearly was a materialist about the natural world, but the explicit arguments he offers for the view seem rather weak. Perhaps he just had a good deal of confidence in the ability of the rapidly developing science of the his time to proceed towards a full material explanation of the mind. Just as his contemporary William Harvey, of whom he thought very highly, had made such progress in explaining biological matters, so too (Hobbes might have thought) might we expect further scientists to succeed in explaining mental matters.
At any rate, Hobbes was very much interested in scientific explanation of the world: both its practice (which he saw himself as engaged in) and also its theory. Chapter 9 of Leviathan tells us something about the differences between scientific and historical knowledge, and the divisions between sciences. Chapter 6 of De Corpore gives a much fuller treatment of issues in the philosophy of science, issues of what Hobbes calls method. Method tells us how to investigate things in order to achieve scientia, the best sort of knowledge.
Those writing about Hobbes’s method have tended to tell one or other of two stories about the sort of method he proposes and its historical roots. One story emphasizes the connections between Hobbes’s method and Aristotelian approaches. This has often been developed into a story about the particular influence on Hobbes of the works of Giacomo Zabarella, a sixteenth-century Aristotelian who studied and taught at the University of Padua, which influence is then often said to have been somehow mediated by Galileo. The alternative story emphasizes the connections between Hobbes’s general views about method and the traditions of thinking about method in geometry. Here the notions of analysis and synthesis are key. Oddly enough, both of these stories can be connected to anecdotes that Aubrey tells about Hobbes: on the one hand, the report that Hobbes because friendly with Galileo while traveling in Italy, and on the other, the tale of how Hobbes became fascinated with geometry at the age of forty after looking at copy of Euclid’s Elements, not believing a proposition, and tracing back the demonstration of it and the propositions on which it depended.
This section tells a version of the first story. (For a helpful recent critical discussion of such an approach, see Hattab 2014.) Still, one should note that Hobbes sometimes uses the language of mathematical method, of analysis and synthesis, in describing his general method (Hobbes 1655, 6.1). Several commentators have seen this, together with his clear admiration for the successes of geometry, as evidence of a more general use of mathematical notions in his account of method (Talaska 1988). And it might indeed be the case that both stories about Hobbes’s method (the Zabarellan and the mathematical) have some truth to them.
Those writing about Hobbes often describe Zabarella’s method as having two parts, resolution and composition. Resolution moves from the thing to be explained, which is an effect, to its causes, and then composition brings you back from causes to effects. At a suitably general level that is correct, but it misses much detail. Most importantly, Zabarella’s method — as seen for instance in his work De Regressu – is better described as having three parts. A crucial though somewhat mysterious third step stands between the move from effect to cause and that from effect to cause. The complete sequence, the arguments from effect to cause and back again, Zabarella calls regressus. This sequence improves our knowledge, taking us from confused to clear knowledge of something. But how do we do this? The first step is to move from having confused knowledge of the effect to having confused knowledge of the cause. Roughly, you need to figure out what caused the thing you’re trying to explain. The second step moves from confused to clear knowledge of the cause. This step works, Zabarella thinks, by a sort of intellectual examination of the cause. The aim is not just to know what thing is the cause, but to understand that thing. The final step then moves from the clear knowledge of the cause to clear knowledge of the effect. That is, your new full understanding of the cause gives you better understanding of the thing caused by it.
Chapter six of De Corpore is Hobbes’s main work on method. There Hobbes lays out a model of the proper form of a scientific explanation. A proper explanation tells you three things: what the cause is, the nature of the cause, and how the cause gives rise to the effect. Thus Hobbes accepts the Aristotelian idea that to have the best sort of knowledge, scientific knowledge, is to know something through its causes. Similarities to Aristotelian theories such as Zabarella’s show up even in section one of chapter six. Here Hobbes defines philosophy as knowledge acquired by correct reasoning. It is both knowledge of effects that you get through conception of their causes and knowledge of causes that you get through conception of their visible effects. Already we see signs of the Aristotelian picture in which you come to know the cause by knowing the visible effect and to know the effect by knowing the cause.
Moreover, there is perhaps in Hobbes’s method something like the middle step of regressus. For Hobbes, to know an effect through its causes is to know what the causes are and how they work: “We are said to know scientifically some effect when we know what its causes are, in what subject they are, in what subject they introduce the effect, and how they do it” (Hobbes 1655, 6.1). The requirement to know how the cause works, not just what it is, is analogous to the Zabarellan requirement to have distinct knowledge of a cause. Knowledge that the cause exists comes from the first step of regressus. Complete regressus, i.e., complete explanation, requires that you make a fuller investigation of the cause. For Hobbes, analogously, to get to scientia of the effect you need to understand, not just what the causes are, but how they work.
Comparison of Hobbes’s view to Zabarella’s and other more fully Aristotelian ones is complicated by Hobbes’s thinking that all causes are efficient causes and that motion is the cause of all change in the natural world. In a more fully Aristotelian picture, explanations are causal, but causes can be of several sorts. Hobbes’s picture is more restrictive: to find the causes is to find the efficient causes. Moreover, he thinks the efficient causes are all motions, so the search for causes becomes the search for motions and mechanisms.
For all that there do seem to be similarities between Hobbes’s method and older Aristotelian approaches, one might well wonder how Hobbes could have come to know about Zabarella’s views in particular. One story is that Hobbes learned about this method from Galileo, but that claim is problematic. Galileo did know about Zabarella’s ideas and other similar ones (Wallace 1984). However, the texts of Galileo in which signs of Zabarellan ideas are evident are early ones, but Hobbes knew Galileo’s thought through his later published works. But even if the Zabarella-Galileo-Hobbes story is hard to support, there are other ways in which Hobbes might have learned of Zabarella’s work. Harvey, whose work Hobbes greatly admired, and who studied at the medical school in Padua, might also have been an intermediary (Watkins 1973, 41–2). And it’s far from ridiculous to contemplate Hobbes reading the work of the popular logician Zabarella.
Hobbes’s views about religion have been disputed at great length, and a wide range of positions have been attributed to him, from atheism to orthodox Christianity. This section focuses on two central questions: whether Hobbes believes in the existence of God, and whether he thinks there can be knowledge from revelation. Some important aspects of Hobbes’s approach to religion are left aside. These include religion’s role in politics (Lloyd 1992), and the question of whether God plays some fundamental role in Hobbes’s ethical system (see Warrender 1957 and Martinich 1992, but also Nagel 1959 and Darwall 1994).
Hobbes at one point rules a good deal of religious discussion out of philosophy, because its topics are not susceptible to the full detailed causal explanation that is required for scientia, the best sort of knowledge. “Thus philosophy excludes from itself theology, as I call the doctrine about the nature and attributes of the eternal, ungenerable, and incomprehensible God, and in whom no composition and no division can be established and no generation can be understood” (Hobbes 1655, 1.8). Also excluded are discussion of angels, of revelation, and of the proper worship of God. But despite these not being, strictly speaking, philosophy, Hobbes does in fact have a good deal to say about them, most notably in Leviathan. Things outside philosophy (in its strict sense) may not be amenable to thorough causal explanation in terms of the motions of bodies, but they may well still be within the limits of rational discussion.
Many people have called Hobbes an atheist, both during his lifetime and more recently. However, the word ‘atheist’ did not mean the same thing in the seventeenth century as it means now. Thus when Mintz (1962), in a study of Hobbes’s critics that often mentions atheism, summarizes the reasons those critics gave for calling Hobbes an atheist, he lists the views
that the universe is body, that God is part of the world and therefore body, that the Pentateuch and many other books of Scripture are redactions or compilations from earlier sources, that the members of the Trinity are Moses, Jesus, and the Apostles, that few if any miracles can be credited after the Testamental period, that no persons deserve the name of ‘martyr’ expect those who witnessed the ascension of Christ, that witchcraft is a myth and heaven a delusion, that religion is in fact so muddled with superstition as to be in many vital places indistinguishable from it, [and] that the Church, both in its government and its doctrine, must submit to the dictates of Leviathan, the supreme civil authority (Mintz 1962, 45).
Thus, many of Hobbes’s critics in the seventeenth century, including those who vehemently attacked his religious views, still thought he believed in the existence of God. They thought, however, that he was a rather dubious sort of Christian. Other critics, however, have thought that Hobbes in fact denied the existence of God. This might seem a curious allegation, for Hobbes often talks about God as existing. Certainly, to read Hobbes in this way requires one to take some of his statements at something other than face value.
In the Elements of Law Hobbes offers a cosmological argument for the existence of God (Hobbes 1640, 11.2). However, he argues, the only thing we can know about God is that he, “first cause of all causes”, exists. Our knowledge is limited in this way because our thoughts about God are limited: “we can have no conception or image of the Deity”. So when we seem to attribute features to God, we cannot literally be describing God (Hobbes 1640, 11.3). We’re either expressing our inability, as when we call God incomprehensible, or we’re expressing our reverence, as when we call God omniscient and just. The same indeed is going on when we call God a spirit: this is not “a name of anything we conceive”, but again a “signification of our reverence” (Hobbes 1640, 11.3).
Those three views — support for a cosmological argument, the belief that God is inconceivable by us, and the interpretation of apparent descriptions of God as not really descriptions — appear to recur in Leviathan (Hobbes 1651, 11.25, 12.6–9). However, in later work, such as the appendix to the 1668 Latin edition of Leviathan, Hobbes proposes a different view. The older Hobbes thought that we could know God to have at least one feature, namely extension. In his Answer to Bishop Bramhall, Hobbes describes God as a “corporeal spirit” (Hobbes 1662, 4.306). By this he means at least that God is extended. Indeed, Hobbes seems to think of God as a sort of extended thing that’s mixed through the rest of the world, not being in every individual place in the world, but able to affect all the things in the world (Hobbes 1662, 4.306–13, especially 4.309–10).
Whatever one thinks of the orthodoxy of Hobbes’s earlier views — and one might take the holder of those views just to be a very serious believer in the rather orthodox view that God is incomprehensible — this later view that God is corporeal is strange indeed. However, Hobbes does seem in his Answer to Bishop Bramhall and the Appendix to the Latin edition of Leviathan to believe this strange view sincerely. Indeed, he goes to some pains to defend this as an acceptable version of Christianity. Whether or not one believes that, this is still on the surface an odd theism rather than atheism.
Even if Hobbes is some sort of theist, he’s a theist who is sceptical about many widely held religious views. This is notable to some extent in his critical reading of biblical texts, which was not at all a standard approach at the time. Indeed, Hobbes and Spinoza often get a good deal of credit for developing this approach. It’s notable too in his treatment of matters related to revelation.
In chapter 2 of Leviathan Hobbes comes to these topics at a slightly surprising point. In the course of discussing the workings of imagination, he talks naturally enough about dreams. Emphasizing the occasional difficulty of distinguishing dreams from waking life, he turns to talk of visions. Dreams had in stressful circumstances, when one sleeps briefly, are sometimes taken as visions, Hobbes says. He uses this to explain a supposed vision had by Marcus Brutus, and also widespread belief in ghosts, goblins, and the like. Later he uses it to account for visions of God (Hobbes 1651, 32.6). And Hobbes explicitly uses this to undermine the plausibility of claims to know things because told by God:
To say he [God] hath spoken to him in a dream is no more than to say that he dreamed God spake to him, which is not of force to win belief from any man that knows dreams are for the most part natural and may proceed from former thoughts … To say he hath seen a vision, or heard a voice, is to say that he hath dreamed between sleeping and waking; for in such a manner a man doth many times naturally take his dream for a vision, as not having well observed his own slumbering (Hobbes 1651, 32.6)
This does not rule out the possibility that God might indeed communicate directly with an individual by means of a vision. But it does rule out other people sensibly believing reports of such occurrences, for the events reported are easily (and usually if not necessarily always correctly) given a natural explanation as dreams, which themselves have natural causes.
Hobbes takes a similarly sceptical attitude to reports of miracles. Chapter 37 of Leviathan is a discussion of this topic, centred on Hobbes’s definition of a miracle as “a work of God (besides his operation by the way of nature, ordained in the creation), done for the making manifest to his elect the mission of an extraordinary minister for their salvation” (Hobbes 1651, 37.7). Though there is some dispute about exactly what Hobbes is doing there, there clearly is a good deal of talk about “false” or “pretended” miracles, with an emphasis on the possibility of trickery, and a warning about believing too hastily in reports of miracles. The conclusion is weaker than that of Hume’s more famous argument about the evidence for belief in miracles, but a similar sceptical attitude is present.
The case has often been made, however, that Hobbes was not just somewhat sceptical about some religious claims, but actually denied the existence of God. The idea is that, though Hobbes says that God exists, those statements are just cover for his atheism. Moreover, these interpreters claim, there are various pieces of evidence that point to this hidden underlying view. Opinions differ on what the crucial evidence of the hidden atheism is. Jesseph (2002), for instance, argues that Hobbes’s claims about a material God do not add up. Curley (1992) argues that Hobbes’s discussions of prophecy and miracles, taken together, contain a suggestive problem.
There is (what I would take to be) a fairly obvious problem of circularity here: in the chapter on miracles we are to judge the authenticity of a miracle by the authenticity of the doctrine it is used to support, but in the chapter on prophecy we had to judge the prophet’s claim to be God’s spokesman by his performance of miracles. If Hobbes is aware of this circularity, he does not call attention to it. Perhaps he just did not notice it. Perhaps, as Strauss might have suggested, he leaves it to the reader to discover this for himself. (Curley 1992, §5).
There are some tricky general methodological questions here, about when we can reasonably say that an author is trying to communicate a view other than the one apparently stated. Note, however, that for someone allegedly covering up his atheism to avoid controversy, Hobbes took the curious approach of saying many other intensely controversial things. He was opposed to free will and to immaterial souls, opposed to Presbyterianism and to Roman Catholicism, and managed to have anti-royalists thinking he was a royalist, but at least one prominent royalist (Clarendon) thinking he supported Cromwell. This was not a recipe for a quiet life. One might see Hobbes as thinking that these things could be said with controversy, but God’s existence only denied with genuine danger. But one needs, at least, a fairly complex story about Hobbes’s attitudes in order to sustain the view that he was sneakily suggesting that God didn’t exist.
Hobbes was a widely read and controversial author. In many cases, the discussion of his philosophy was about his political philosophy (Goldie 1994, Malcolm 2002). However, Hobbes’s non-political views were also discussed. The Cambridge Platonist Ralph Cudworth, for example, devoted considerable energy to arguing against Hobbesian atheism and materialism. Cudworth’s Cambridge colleague Henry More was also a critic of Hobbes. Margaret Cavendish, meanwhile, reacted to Hobbes’s work and developed her own non-Hobbesian materialism.
One important connection is that between Hobbes’s work and Leibniz’s. Of all the canonical philosophers in the period from Descartes to Kant, Leibniz is probably the one who paid most attention to Hobbes’s work, and had the most to say about different aspects of it. Leibniz found Hobbes’s work worthy of serious engagement, but ultimately also thought it mistaken in many ways. On the other hand, later empiricist philosophers, in particular Locke and Hume, develop several Hobbesian themes. Indeed, one might well speak of Hobbes, not Locke, as the first of the British empiricists.
The best known parts of Leibniz’s interaction with Hobbes are from early in Leibniz’s philosophical career, before 1686, the year in which Leibniz wrote his ‘Discourse on Metaphysics’ (Bernstein 1980; Jesseph 1998; Moll 1996, 103–36; Wilson 1997). His criticism of Hobbes’s nominalism, and his early adoption of the view that reasoning is computation, were both discussed above. Leibniz also paid a good deal of attention to Hobbes’s views about motion, in particular those about conatus or endeavour, which have application both to physics and to mathematics. And Leibniz twice in the 1670s wrote letters to Hobbes, though it is unclear if Hobbes ever received them, and there is no evidence of any replies. Leibniz continued, moreover, to engage with Hobbes’s work throughout his philosophical career, even if that engagement was never quite as intense as it was in a brief early period. There is, for instance, a discussion of Hobbes’s views in the 1709 Theodicy.
Looking beyond Leibniz, we can see some close connections between the work of Hobbes and the work of Locke and Hume, both of whom were well aware of Hobbes’s views. Locke’s connections to Hobbes, though perhaps not obvious, are there (Rogers 1988). Think of Locke’s empiricism (i.e., anti-nativism), his attention to language and its workings and related errors, his granting at least the possibility of materialism being true, and his scepticism about revelation. Hume, meanwhile, begins his Treatise with his view about ideas being less intense copies of our sensations, a view with a close resemblance to Hobbes’s view about decaying sense. Russell (1985; 2008) argues convincingly that Hume modelled the structure of the Treatise on that of Hobbes’s Elements of Law. And Hume, like Hobbes, combines apparent acceptance of a basic cosmological argument with scepticism about many religious claims. Indeed there are enough connections that it’s plausible to speak of “the empiricism of Hobbes…, Locke…, and Hume” (Nidditch 1975, viii), rather than of the more conventional trio of Locke, Berkeley, and Hume.
Though the vast majority of work on Hobbes looks at his political philosophy, there are general books on Hobbes that look at his non-political philosophy, such as Sorell 1986 and Martinich 2005. The best modern biography is Martinich 1999.
References to The Elements of Law, Leviathan, and De Corpore are by chapter and paragraph number. This should enable readers to find references in editions other than the ones used here (even though most editions of Leviathan do not print paragraph numbers). All other references are given by volume and page number. Most works are referred to using their author’s name and their date of first publication. A few others — Hobbes’s Elements of Law and Behemoth, Aubrey’s Brief Lives, and some works of Leibniz — are referred to using their dates of composition, because they were published several years after they were written.
- Aubrey, J., 1696, Brief Lives, in A. Clark (ed.), ‘Brief Lives’, Chiefly of Contemporaries, set down by John Aubrey, between the years 1669 & 1696, Oxford: Clarendon, 1898.
- Descartes, R., 1641a, Meditations on First Philosophy, in J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, and D. Murdoch (ed.), The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984, vol. 2.
- Descartes, R., 1641b, Letter to Marin Mersenne for Hobbes, in N. Malcolm (ed.), The Correspondence of Thomas Hobbes, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998, 94–101
- Descartes, R., 1643, Letter to Father ****, in J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, and D. Murdoch (ed.), The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1984, 3.230–1
- Hobbes, T., 1640, The Elements of Law, in J.C.A. Gaskin (ed.) The Elements of Law, Natural and Politic, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990.
- Hobbes, T., 1651, Leviathan, in E. Curley (ed.), Leviathan, with selected variants from the Latin edition of 1668, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994.
- Hobbes, T., 1655, De Corpore, chapters 1–6, in A.P. Martinich (trans.), Part I of De Corpore, New York: Abaris Books, 1981.
- Hobbes, T., 1662, An Answer to Bishop Bramhall’s Book, called “The Catching of the Leviathan”, in W. Molesworth (ed.), The English Works of Thomas Hobbes, London: John Bohn, 1839–40, 4.279–384.
- Hobbes, T., 1668a, Behemoth; or, The Long Parliament, in F. Tönnies (ed.), Behemoth; or, The Long Parliament, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1990
- Hobbes, T., 1668b, Leviathan (Latin edition), in E. Curley (ed.), Leviathan, with selected variants from the Latin edition of 1668, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1994.
- Leibniz, G.W., 1666, “Of the Art of Combination”, in G.H.R. Parkinson (ed.), Leibniz: Logical Papers, Oxford: Clarendon, 1966, 1–11.
- Leibniz, G.W., 1670, “Preface to an Edition of Nizolius”, in L.E. Loemker (ed.), Philosophical Papers and Letters, second edition, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1969, 121–30.
- Leibniz, G.W., 1679, “Samples of the Numerical Characteristic”, in R. Ariew and D. Garber (ed.), Philosophical Essays, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989, 10–8.
- More, H., 1659, The Immortality of the Soul, London.
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- Curley, E., 1992, “‘I durst not write so boldly’ or, How to Read Hobbes’s Theological-Political Treatise”, in D. Bostrenghi (ed.), Hobbes e Spinoza, scienza e politica, Naples: Bibliopolis, 497–593 [Preprint available from the author].
- Curley, E., 1995, “Hobbes versus Descartes”, in Roger Ariew and Marjorie Grene (ed.), Descartes and his Contemporaries, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 97–109.
- Darwall, S., 1994, review of Lloyd 1992 and Martinich 1992, Philosophical Review, 103: 748–752.
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- Fodor, J.A., 1994, The Elm and the Expert, Cambridge: MIT Press.
- Goldie, M., 1994, “The Reception of Hobbes”, in J.H. Burns and M. Goldie (ed.), The Cambridge History of Political Thought 1450–1700, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 589–615.
- Gorham, G., 2013, “The Theological Foundations of Hobbesian Physics: A Defense of Corporeal God,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 21: 240–61.
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- Haugeland, J., 1985, Artificial Intelligence: The Very Idea, Cambridge: MIT Press.
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- Jesseph, D., 1999, Squaring the Circle, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
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- Malcolm, N., 2002, “Hobbes and the European Republic of Letters”, in N. Malcolm, Aspects of Hobbes, Oxford: Clarendon, 457–545.
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- Pettit, P., 2008, Made with Words: Hobbes on Language, Mind, and Politics, Princeton: Princeton University Press
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