Notes to The Role of Decoherence in Quantum Mechanics

1. The first version of this entry was based on a talk given at the Exploratory Workshop on Quantum Mechanics on the Large Scale, The Peter Wall Institute for Advanced Studies, The University of British Columbia, 17–27 April 2003, on whose website are linked electronic versions of that and several of the other talks (see the Other Internet Resources).

2. Unfortunately, the distinction between ‘true’ collapse (as it appears in collapse approaches to quantum mechanics) and ‘apparent’ collapse (as it appears in no-collapse approaches to quantum mechanics) is often overlooked, muddling conceptual discussions. Further on this point, see e.g. Pearle (1997) and Zeh (2003a, pp. 28–29).

3. Since the probabilities that are said to interfere in fact refer to a separate experiment, Heisenberg in the uncertainty paper notes that he does not like the phrase ‘interference of probabilities’.

4. Realistically, each single scattering will not produce enough entanglement, in the sense that the components going through the two slits will couple to non-orthogonal states of the environment, thus experiencing only a partial suppression of interference. However, repeated scatterings will lead to coupling with orthogonal states and suppress interference very effectively (see the discussion of decoherence rates in the next subsection).

5. These values are calculated based on the classic model by Joos and Zeh (1985). Length and time scales for more massive objects are further reduced. For a not too technical partial summary of Joos and Zeh’s results, see also Bacciagaluppi (2000).

6. For further details of the decoherent histories approach, see also the overview articles by Halliwell (1995, 2010) and by Hartle (2010).

7. In the Heisenberg picture, it is operators that evolve unitarily rather than states, i.e. instead of considering time-independent operators \(A\) and time-dependent states \(\varrho(t)=U_{ts} \varrho(s) U^{*}_{ts}\) as in the Schrödinger picture (where \(U_{ts}\) represents the unitary evolution operator from time \(s\) to time \(t\), and its adjoint \(U^{*}_{ts}\) the inverse evolution), one considers time-dependent operators \(\mathrm{A}(t)=U^{*}_{ts} \mathrm{A}(s) U_{ts}\) and time-independent states \(\varrho\). The two pictures are generally equivalent (even though the Heisenberg picture is more convenient in quantum field theory), but see the qualification in Section 3.4.2.

8. This condition can be independently motivated. For instance, weak decoherence for subsystems does not imply weak decoherence for the total system, even if the total state is a product (simply because the product of the real parts of two complex numbers is not the real part of their product). For this and further arguments, see Diósi (1994, in the Other Internet Resources).

9. Similar results involving imperfectly correlated records can be derived in the case of mixed states (Halliwell 1999).

10. If so, the idea does not seem quite new. A related discussion of causality was given in detail by Grete Hermann (1935), probably the most important philosophical commentator of the emerging Copenhagen school, specifically in the context of (Weizsäcker’s analysis of) the Heisenberg microscope. Also Wheeler’s (1978) famous ‘delayed choice’ experiments are presented by him as affecting the past in this way.

11. For a review of more detailed arguments see e.g. Zurek (2003, pp. 28–30). In particular they can be obtained from the Wigner function formalism, see e.g. Zurek (1991) and in more detail Zurek and Paz (1994, who then apply these results to derive chaotic trajectories in quantum mechanics); see also below, Section 4.1 and Rosaler (2016).

12. For a very accessible discussion of \(\alpha\)-particle tracks roughly along these lines, see Barbour (1999, Chap. 20).

13. Von Neumann’s theorem was later generalised by several authors, the most general version being that of Bassi and Ghirardi (2000): see the discussion in Section 3 of the entry on collapse theories (and references therein). Alternative impossibility results focus on the impossibility of obtaining the right transformation behaviour for the state of the measured system (Bacciagaluppi 2014a).

14. As a numerical example, take a macroscopic particle of radius 1cm (mass 10g) interacting with air under normal conditions. After an hour the overall spread of its state is of the order of 1m. (This estimate uses equations [3.107] and [3.73] in Joos and Zeh (1985).)

15. The modern version of Everett’s servomechanisms are Jim Hartle’s IGUSes (Hartle 2005).

16. The positive re-evaluation of Everett’s original 1957 PhD thesis (traditionally considered obscure) is the product of the historical scholarship that has been flourishing since the 50-year anniversary of Everett’s thesis; see Everett (2012).

17. E.g. Zurek’s (1998) ‘existential interpretation’ aims to bring together certain aspects of Bohr and of Everett.

18. For further details of the state of the art on the Everett interpretation(s), see the recent collection by Saunders et al. (2010), which contains the papers from the two international conferences that celebrated the 50 years of Everett’s original paper, and Wallace’s (2012a) definitive monograph.

19. Everett has traditionally also been thought to suffer from a problem about the meaning of probabilities. This is arguably unfair to Everett, who provides a very explicit discussion along the lines of a ‘typicality’ approach, as well as a proof of the Born rule that is mathematically very close to the recent proof by Deutsch and Wallace. For a discussion of Everett’s approach, see the longer version (with references) of my review of Everett (2012) in the Other Internet Resources, Bacciagaluppi (2013). For the definitive presentation of the Deutsch–Wallace approach, see Wallace (2012a, Chapter 5).

20. Such a solution to the preferred basis problem might be thought to be only partial, in the sense that there are many inequivalent ways of selecting sets of decoherent histories (see e.g. Dowker and Kent 1995, 1996). On the other hand, this does not make ‘our’ set of histories any less decoherent.

21. Cf. for instance how Everett phrases his solution to the EPR paradox (Everett 2012, pp. 157–158).

22. Even in this case, however, decoherence is of crucial importance, since the dynamical evolution of the minds will have a physical correlate only if the corresponding physical components are decohered (Felline and Bacciagaluppi 2013). (Thanks to Martin Jones for discussion of this point.)

23. It is tempting to see the difference between (Saunders–Wallace) decoherence-based many-worlds and (Zeh) decoherence-based many-minds as merely conventional, since they arguably both share an ontology of global wave functions and local (perhaps emergent) minds, and only differ in the emphasis they place on different objectively present structures in the same decohering wave function. Note also that if one assumes that mentality can be associated only with certain decohering structures of great complexity, this might have the advantage of further reducing the remaining ambiguity about the preferred ‘basis’ (see Matthew Donald’s website on ‘A Many-Minds Interpretation of Quantum Theory’ in the Other Internet Resources). Finally, regarding the distinction between global and local aspects of decoherence, it should be noted that, since spacelike separated systems can be entangled, even though suppression of interference through interaction with the environment is a local mechanism it indirectly affects also distant systems. If Alice’s system interacts with its local environment, that will guarantee that certain components of Bob’s system will in practice never be able to interfere, even should Alice and Bob’s systems be brought together. (In many-worlds language, we are licensed to talk about worlds splitting along spacelike hypersurfaces, even though splitting in the sense of active suppression of interference propagates along forward lightcones. Cf. Bacciagaluppi (2002) and Wallace (2012a); see also the entry on action at a distance in quantum mechanics. Thanks to Wayne Myrvold for discussion of this point.)

24. By the same token one can dismiss proposed variants of de Broglie–Bohm theory that are not based on the position representation, e.g. Epstein’s (1953) momentum-based theory, which would utterly fail to exhibit the correct ‘collapse’ behaviour and classical regime, precisely because decoherence interactions are not momentum-based.

25. Appleby discusses Bohmian trajectories in a model of decoherence and obtains approximately classical trajectories, but under a special assumption. (I would suggest to reinterpret Appleby’s assumption as an assumption about the effective wavefunction of the heat bath with which the system interacts. That is, one should try to justify it from a pilot-wave treatment of the bath.)

26. Sanz and Borondo (2009) simulate trajectories for the two-slit experiment. One model is based on the reduced density matrix of the system (and thus based on simple de-phasing), and still maintains the no-crossing feature that troubles Holland (1996). The other model, despite also being simplified, recovers the classical crossing of trajectories. Sanz and co-workers (personal communication, November 2011) have also carried out simulations including explicit modelling of the environment, and in situations more complex than the two-slit experiment. These simulations seem to confirm that classical-like trajectories can indeed be recovered in pilot-wave theory using decoherence.

27. Allori investigates in the first place the ‘short-wavelength’ limit of de Broglie–Bohm theory (suggested by the analogy with the geometric limit in wave optics). The role of decoherence in her analysis is crucial but limited to maintaining the classical behaviour obtained under the appropriate short-wavelength conditions, because the behaviour would otherwise break down after a certain time.

28. If this is not true in general, then provided the results of observations are recorded in the configuration-space variables, pilot-wave field theories could still recover at least the appearance of classical trajectories (as in the ‘minimalist’ model by Struyve and Westman (2007)). Decoherence would arguably still play a role at this level in structuring these appearances (similarly to the role it plays e.g. in many-minds theories, cf. Section 3.1 ).

29. The collapse consists in multiplying the wave function \(\psi(r)\) by a Gaussian of fixed width \(a\), call it \(a_x (r)\), with a probability density for the centre \(x\) of the Gaussian given by \(\int |a_x (r)\psi(r)|^2 dr\). In other words, if we denote by \(A_x\) the operator corresponding to multiplication by the Gaussian \(a_x (r)\), the state \(\ket{\psi}\) goes over to one of the continuously many possible states \(A_x\ket{\psi}\) (up to renormalisation), with probability density \(\langle\psi|A_x^*A_x|\psi\rangle\). In technical language, this is a measurement associated with a POVM (positive-operator valued measure). In the original model, \(a=10^{-5}\)cm, and collapse occurs with a probability per second \(1/\tau\), with \(\tau =10^{16}\)s.

30. This modification was introduced because, due to the production of energy associated with the collapse, the original model would have had consequences for the predicted lifetime of the proton that were already ruled out by existing experiments (Pearle and Squires 1994). Later models also often use the formalism of continuous spontaneous localisation (CSL), phrased in terms of stochastic differential equations (Pearle 1989, also sketched in the entry on collapse theories), but for present purposes we shall stick to the more elementary GRW theory.

31. My thanks to Bill Unruh for raising this issue.

32. A review of the experimental status of spontaneous collapse theories is given e.g. by Bassi and Ulbricht (2014).

33. Cf. the exchange between Heisenberg and Dirac at the 1927 Solvay conference, where Dirac expressed the view that experiments involve ‘an irrevocable choice of nature’, but Heisenberg pointed out that one can always perform subsequent interference experiments, so that ‘the observer himself makes a choice’ (Bacciagaluppi and Valentini 2009, Section 6.3 and pp. 446–450). With that Heisenberg perhaps meant to imply some role for idealism in quantum mechanics (roughly along the lines of Fichte?), or perhaps he meant that it is we who choose the ultimate experimental arrangement, thereby determining when as a matter of fact there will be no interference. (Did Heisenberg in fact believe that observables have values when there is decoherence!?)

34. In this connection, it is interesting to note that in the original formulation by Griffiths (1984) there appears no quantum state in the decoherence functional. The role of the quantum state is so to speak taken over by the initial projection in the history, so that the theory can indeed be seen as a theory of transition probabilities between projections, independent of the notion of a quantum state. (See also Bacciagaluppi 2020, Section 3.9.)

35. This is the question of whether one can derive from within quantum mechanics the conditions necessary to discover and practise quantum mechanics itself, and thus, in Shimony’s (1989) words, close the epistemological circle.

36. Everett’s supervisor Wheeler refused to approve Everett’s thesis while it did not get Bohr’s blessing, and forced Everett to rewrite it completely. See Osnaghi, Freitas and Freire (2009), and also the relevant materials in Everett (2012).

37. The main technical hurdle (the inequivalence between the Schrödinger equation and the Madelung equations pointed out by Wallstrom (1994)) has arguably finally been resolved by Derakhshani (2017).

38. Maaneli Derakhshani and myself are planning a paper spelling out the resolution of the problem of two-time correlations.

39. To clarify the distinction, think of the ground state of the hydrogen atom as a state of definite energy. As such, it is not a probabilistic concept, and being in the ground state can arguably be thought of as an ontic feature of a hydrogen atom. A subjectivist interpretation of quantum probabilities holds that the probabilities that we assign to measurement results on the basis of this state are degrees of belief. A QBist instead believes that there is no ontic feature of the hydrogen atom corresponding to is ground state, and that the meaning of the state is exhausted by its use as expressing the degrees of belief of an agent. The first author to argue that subjectivism may be applied also to quantum probabilities was Berkovitz in the late 1980s (see Berkovitz 2012). See also Bacciagaluppi (2014b, 2020), who argues that subjectivism can be applied to quantum probabilities also in the Everett, pilot-wave, and spontaneous collapse approaches.

40. As long as decoherence yields only effective superselection rules, as mentioned above in Section 1.1, one does not leave the framework of standard non-relativistic quantum mechanics. Strict superselection rules require the framework of so-called algebraic quantum mechanics, and their interpretational status still needs to be assessed more systematically. (My thanks to Hans Primas for discussion of this point.)

41. An analogy from standard quantum mechanics may be helpful here. Take a harmonic oscillator in equilibrium with its environment. An equilibrium state is by definition a stationary state under the dynamics, i.e. it is itself time-independent. However, one can decompose the equilibrium state of the oscillator as a mixture of localised components each carrying out one of the oscillator’s possible (time-dependent!) classical motions. Such a decomposition can be found e.g. in Donald (1998, Section 2).

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