The Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen Argument in Quantum Theory

First published Mon May 10, 2004; substantive revision Tue Oct 31, 2017

In the May 15, 1935 issue of Physical Review Albert Einstein co-authored a paper with his two postdoctoral research associates at the Institute for Advanced Study, Boris Podolsky and Nathan Rosen. The article was entitled “Can Quantum Mechanical Description of Physical Reality Be Considered Complete?” (Einstein et al. 1935). Generally referred to as “EPR”, this paper quickly became a centerpiece in debates over the interpretation of quantum theory, debates that continue today. Ranked by impact, EPR is among the top ten of all papers ever published in Physical Review journals. Due to its role in the development of quantum information theory, it is also near the top in their list of currently “hot“ papers. The paper features a striking case where two quantum systems interact in such a way as to link both their spatial coordinates in a certain direction and also their linear momenta (in the same direction), even when the systems are widely separated in space. As a result of this “entanglement”, determining either position or momentum for one system would fix (respectively) the position or the momentum of the other. EPR prove a general lemma connecting such strict correlations between spatially separated systems to the possession of definite values. On that basis they argue that one cannot maintain both an intuitive condition of local action and the completeness of the quantum description by means of the wave function. This entry describes the lemma and argument of that 1935 paper, considers several different versions and reactions, and explores the ongoing significance of the issues raised.

1. Can Quantum Mechanical Description of Physical Reality Be Considered Complete?

1.1 Setting and prehistory

By 1935 conceptual understanding of the quantum theory was dominated by Niels Bohr’s ideas concerning complementarity. Those ideas centered on observation and measurement in the quantum domain. According to Bohr’s views at that time, observing a quantum object involves an uncontrollable physical interaction with a measuring device that affects both systems. The picture here is of a tiny object banging into a big apparatus. The effect this produces on the measuring instrument is what issues in the measurement “result” which, because it is uncontrollable, can only be predicted statistically. The effect experienced by the quantum object limits what other quantities can be co-measured with precision. According to complementarity when we observe the position of an object, we affect its momentum uncontrollably. Thus we cannot determine both position and momentum precisely. A similar situation arises for the simultaneous determination of energy and time. Thus complementarity involves a doctrine of uncontrollable physical interaction that, according to Bohr, underwrites the Heisenberg uncertainty relations and is also the source of the statistical character of the quantum theory. (See the entries on the Copenhagen Interpretation and the Uncertainty Principle.)

Initially Einstein was enthusiastic about the quantum theory. By 1935, however, while recognizing the theory’s significant achievements, his enthusiasm had given way to disappointment. His reservations were twofold. Firstly, he felt the theory had abdicated the historical task of natural science to provide knowledge of significant aspects of nature that are independent of observers or their observations. Instead the fundamental understanding of the quantum wave function (alternatively, the “state function”, “state vector”, or “psi-function”) was that it only treated the outcomes of measurements (via probabilities given by the Born Rule). The theory was simply silent about what, if anything, was likely to be true in the absence of observation. That there could be laws, even probabilistic laws, for finding things if one looks, but no laws of any sort for how things are independently of whether one looks, marked quantum theory as irrealist. Secondly, the quantum theory was essentially statistical. The probabilities built into the state function were fundamental and, unlike the situation in classical statistical mechanics, they were not understood as arising from ignorance of fine details. In this sense the theory was indeterministic. Thus Einstein began to probe how strongly the quantum theory was tied to irrealism and indeterminism.

He wondered whether it was possible, at least in principle, to ascribe certain properties to a quantum system in the absence of measurement. Can we suppose, for instance, that the decay of an atom occurs at a definite moment in time even though such a definite decay time is not implied by the quantum state function? That is, Einstein began to ask whether the formalism provides a description of quantum systems that is complete. Can all physically relevant truths about systems be derived from quantum states? One can raise a similar question about a logical formalism: are all logical truths (or semantically valid formulas) derivable from the axioms. Completeness, in this sense, was a central focus for the Göttingen school of mathematical logic associated with David Hilbert. (See entry on Hilbert’s Program.) Werner Heisenberg, who had attended Hilbert’s lectures, picked up those concerns with questions about the completeness of his own, matrix approach to quantum mechanics. In response, Bohr (and others sympathetic to complementarity) made bold claims not just for the descriptive adequacy of the quantum theory but also for its “finality”, claims that enshrined the features of irrealism and indeterminism that worried Einstein. (See Beller 1999, Chapters 4 and 9, on the rhetoric of finality and Ryckman 2017, Chapter 4, for the connection to Hilbert.) Thus complementarity became Einstein’s target for investigation. In particular, Einstein had reservations about the uncontrollable physical effects invoked by Bohr in the context of measurement interactions, and about their role in fixing the interpretation of the wave function. EPR’s focus on completeness was intended to support those reservations in a particularly dramatic way.

Max Jammer (1974, pp. 166–181) locates the development of the EPR paper in Einstein’s reflections on a thought experiment he proposed during discussions at the 1930 Solvay conference. (For more on EPR and Solvay 1930 see Howard, 1990 and Ryckman, 2017, pp. 118–135.) The experiment imagines a box that contains a clock set to time precisely the release (in the box) of a photon with determinate energy. If this were feasible, it would appear to challenge the unrestricted validity of the Heisenberg uncertainty relation that sets a lower bound on the simultaneous uncertainty of energy and time. (See the entry on the Uncertainty Principle and also Bohr 1949, who describes the discussions at the 1930 conference.) The uncertainty relations, understood not just as a prohibition on what is co-measurable, but on what is simultaneously real, were a central component in the irrealist interpretation of the wave function. Jammer (1974, p. 173) describes how Einstein’s thinking about this experiment, and Bohr’s objections to it, evolved into a different photon-in-a-box experiment, one that allows an observer to determine either the momentum or the position of the photon indirectly, while remaining outside, sitting on the box. Jammer associates this with the distant determination of either momentum or position that, we shall see, is at the heart of the EPR paper. Carsten Held (1998) cites a related correspondence with Paul Ehrenfest from 1932 in which Einstein described an arrangement for the indirect measurement of a particle of mass m using correlations with a photon established through Compton scattering. Einstein’s reflections here foreshadow the argument of EPR, along with noting some of its difficulties.

Thus without an experiment on m it is possible to predict freely, at will, either the momentum or the position of m with, in principle, arbitrary precision. This is the reason why I feel compelled to ascribe objective reality to both. I grant, however, that it is not logically necessary. (Held 1998, p. 90)

Whatever their precursors, the ideas that found their way into EPR were discussed in a series of meetings between Einstein and his two assistants, Podolsky and Rosen. Podolsky was commissioned to compose the paper and he submitted it to Physical Review in March of 1935, where it was sent for publication the day after it arrived. Apparently Einstein never checked Podolsky’s draft before submission. He was not pleased with the result. Upon seeing the published version, Einstein complained that it obscured his central concerns.

For reasons of language this [paper] was written by Podolsky after several discussions. Still, it did not come out as well as I had originally wanted; rather, the essential thing was, so to speak, smothered by formalism [Gelehrsamkeit]. (Letter from Einstein to Erwin Schrödinger, June 19, 1935. In Fine 1996, p. 35.)

Unfortunately, without attending to Einstein’s reservations, EPR is often cited to evoke the authority of Einstein. Here we will distinguish the argument Podolsky laid out in the text from lines of argument that Einstein himself published in articles from 1935 on. We will also consider the argument presented in Bohr’s reply to EPR, which is possibly the best known version, although it differs from the others in important ways.

1.2 The argument in the text

The EPR text is concerned, in the first instance, with the logical connections between two assertions. One asserts that quantum mechanics is incomplete. The other asserts that incompatible quantities (those whose operators do not commute, like the x-coordinate of position and linear momentum in direction x) cannot have simultaneous “reality” (i.e., simultaneously real values). The authors assert the disjunction of these as a first premise (later to be justified): one or another of these must hold. It follows that if quantum mechanics were complete (so that the first assertion failed) then the second one would hold; i.e., incompatible quantities cannot have real values simultaneously. They take as a second premise (also to be justified) that if quantum mechanics were complete, then incompatible quantities (in particular coordinates of position and momentum) could indeed have simultaneous, real values. They conclude that quantum mechanics is incomplete. The conclusion certainly follows since otherwise (if the theory were complete) one would have a contradiction over simultaneous values. Nevertheless the argument is highly abstract and formulaic and even at this point in its development one can readily appreciate Einstein’s disappointment.

EPR now proceed to establish the two premises, beginning with a discussion of the idea of a complete theory. Here they offer only a necessary condition; namely, that for a complete theory “every element of the physical reality must have a counterpart in the physical theory.” The term “element“ may remind one of Mach, for whom this was a central, technical term connected to sensations. (See the entry on Ernst Mach.) The use in EPR of elements of reality is also technical but different. Although they do not define an “element of physical reality” explicitly (and, one might note, the language of elements is not part of Einstein’s usage elsewhere), that expression is used when referring to the values of physical quantities (positions, momenta, and so on) that are determined by an underlying “real physical state”. The picture is that quantum systems have real states that assign values to certain quantities. Sometimes EPR describe this by saying the quantities in question have “definite values”, sometimes “there exists an element of physical reality corresponding to the quantity”. Suppose we adapt the simpler terminology and call a quantity on a system definite if that quantity has a definite value; i.e., if the real state of the system assigns a value (an “element of reality”) to the quantity. The relation that associates real states with assignments of values to quantities is functional so that without a change in the real state there is no change among values assigned to quantities. In order to get at the issue of completeness, a primary question for EPR is to determine when a quantity has a definite value. For that purpose they offer a minimal sufficient condition (p. 777):

If, without in any way disturbing a system, we can predict with certainty (i.e., with probability equal to unity) the value of a physical quantity, then there exists an element of reality corresponding to that quantity.

This sufficient condition for an “element of reality” is often referred to as the EPR Criterion of Reality. By way of illustration EPR point to those quantities for which the quantum state of the system is an eigenstate. It follows from the Criterion that at least these quantities have a definite value; namely, the associated eigenvalue, since in an eigenstate the corresponding eigenvalue has probability one, which we can determine (predict with certainty) without disturbing the system. In fact, moving from eigenstate to eigenvalue to fix a definite value is the only use of the Criterion in EPR.

With these terms in place it is easy to show that if, say, the values of position and momentum for a quantum system were definite (were elements of reality) then the description provided by the wave function of the system would be incomplete, since no wave function contains counterparts for both elements. Technically, no state function—even an improper one, like a delta function—is a simultaneous eigenstate for both position and momentum; indeed, joint probabilities for position and momentum are not well-defined in any quantum state. Thus they establish the first premise: either quantum theory is incomplete or there can be no simultaneously real (“definite”) values for incompatible quantities. They now need to show that if quantum mechanics were complete, then incompatible quantities could have simultaneous real values, which is the second premise. This, however, is not easily established. Indeed what EPR proceed to do is odd. Instead of assuming completeness and on that basis deriving that incompatible quantities can have real values simultaneously, they simply set out to derive the latter assertion without any completeness assumption at all. This “derivation” turns out to be the heart of the paper and its most controversial part. It attempts to show that in certain circumstances a quantum system can have simultaneous values for incompatible quantities (once again, for position and momentum), where these are definite values; that is, they are assigned by the real state of the system, hence are “elements of reality”.

They proceed by sketching an iconic thought experiment whose variations continue to be important and widely discussed. The experiment concerns two quantum systems that are spatially distant from one another, perhaps quite far apart, but such that the total wave function for the pair links both the positions of the systems as well as their linear momenta. In the EPR example the total linear momentum is zero along the x-axis. Thus if the linear momentum of one of the systems (we can call it Albert’s) along the x-axis were found to be p, the x-momentum of the other system (call it Niels’) would be found to be −p. At the same time their positions along x are also strictly correlated so that determining the position of one system on the x-axis allows us to infer the position of the other system along x. The paper constructs an explicit wave function for the combined (Albert+Niels) system that embodies these links even when the systems are widely separated in space. Although commentators later raised questions about the legitimacy of this wave function, it does appear to guarantee the required correlations for spatially separated systems, at least for a moment (Jammer 1974, pp. 225–38; see also Halvorson 2000). In any case, one can model the same conceptual situation in other cases that are clearly well defined quantum mechanically (see Section 3.1).

At this point of the argument (p. 779) EPR make two critical assumptions, although they do not call special attention to them. (For the significance of these assumptions in Einstein’s thinking see Howard 1985 and also section 5 of the entry on Einstein.) The first assumption (separability) is that at the time when the systems are separated, maybe quite far apart, each has its own reality. In effect, they assume that each system maintains a separate identity characterized by a real physical state, even though each system is also strictly correlated with the other in respect both to momentum and position. They need this assumption to make sense of another. The second assumption is that of locality. Given that the systems are far apart, locality supposes that “no real change can take place” in one system as a direct consequence of a measurement made on the other system. They gloss this by saying “at the time of measurement the two systems no longer interact.” Note that locality does not require that nothing at all about one system can be disturbed directly by a distant measurement on the other system. Locality only rules out that a distant measurement may directly disturb or change what is counted as “real“ with respect to a system, a reality that separability guarantees. On the basis of these two assumptions they conclude that each system can have definite values (“elements of reality”) for both position and momentum simultaneously. There is no straightforward argument for this in the text. Instead they use these two assumptions to show how one could be led to assign position and momentum eigenstates to one system by making measurements on the other system, from which the simultaneous attribution of elements of reality is supposed to follow. Since this is the central and most controversial part of the paper, it pays to go slowly here in trying to reconstruct an argument on their behalf.

Here is one attempt. (Dickson 2004 analyzes some of the modal principles involved and suggests one line of argument, which he criticizes. Hooker 1972 is a comprehensive discussion that identifies several generically different ways to make the case.) Locality affirms that the real state of a system is not affected by distant measurements. Since the real state determines which quantities are definite (i.e., have assigned values), the set of definite quantities is also not affected by distant measurements. So if by measuring a distant partner we can determine that a certain quantity is definite, then that quantity must have been definite all along. As we have seen, the Criterion of Reality implies that a quantity is definite if the state of the system is an eigenstate for that quantity. In the case of the strict correlations of EPR, measuring one system triggers a reduction of the joint state that results in an eigenstate for the distant partner. Hence any quantity with that eigenstate is definite. For example, since measuring the momentum of Albert’s system results in a momentum eigenstate for Niels’, the momentum of Niels’ system is definite. Likewise for the position of Niels’ system. Given separability, the combination of locality and the Criterion establish a quite general lemma; namely, when quantities on separated systems have strictly correlated values, those quantities are definite. Thus the strict correlations between Niels’ system and Albert’s in the EPR situation guarantee that both position and momentum are definite; i. e., that each system has definite position and momentum simultaneously.

EPR point out that position and momentum cannot be measured simultaneously. So even if each can be shown to be definite in distinct contexts of measurement, can both be definite at the same time? The lemma answers “yes”. What drives the argument is locality, which functions logically to decontextualize the reality of Niels’ system from goings on at Albert’s. Accordingly, measurements made on Albert’s system are probative for features corresponding to the real state of Niels’ system but not determinative of them. Thus even without measuring Albert’s system, features corresponding to the real state of Niels’ system remain in place. Among those features are a definite position and a definite momentum for Niels’ system along some particular coordinate direction.

In the penultimate paragraph of EPR (p. 780) they address the problem of getting real values for incompatible quantities simultaneously.

Indeed one would not arrive at our conclusion if one insisted that two or more physical quantities can be regarded as simultaneous elements of reality only when they can be simultaneously measured or predicted. … This makes the reality [on the second system] depend upon the process of measurement carried out on the first system, which does not in any way disturb the second system. No reasonable definition of reality could be expected to permit this.

The unreasonableness to which EPR allude in making “the reality [on the second system] depend upon the process of measurement carried out on the first system, which does not in any way disturb the second system” is just the unreasonableness that would be involved in renouncing locality understood as above. For it is locality that enables one to overcome the incompatibility of position and momentum measurements of Albert’s system by requiring their joint consequences for Niels’ system to be incorporated in a single, stable reality there. If we recall Einstein’s acknowledgment to Ehrenfest that getting simultaneous position and momentum was “not logically necessary”, we can see how EPR respond by making it become necessary once locality is assumed.

Here, then, are the key features of EPR.

  • EPR is about the interpretation of state vectors (“wave functions”) and employs the standard state vector reduction formalism (von Neumann’s “projection postulate”).
  • The Criterion of Reality affirms that the eigenvalue corresponding to the eigenstate of a system is a value determined by the real physical state of that system. (This is the Criterion’s only use.)
  • (Separability) Spatially separated systems have real physical states.
  • (Locality) If systems are spatially separate, the measurement (or absence of measurement) of one system does not directly affect the reality that pertains to the others.
  • (EPR Lemma) If quantities on separated systems have strictly correlated values, those quantities are definite (i.e., have definite values). This follows from separability, locality and the Criterion. No actual measurements are required.
  • (Completeness) If the description of systems by state vectors were complete, then definite values of quantities (values determined by the real state of a system) could be inferred from a state vector for the system itself or from a state vector for a composite of which the system is a part.
  • In summary, separated systems as described by EPR have definite position and momentum values simultaneously. Since this cannot be inferred from any state vector, the quantum mechanical description of systems by means state vectors is incomplete.

The EPR experiment with interacting systems accomplishes a form of indirect measurement. The direct measurement of Albert’s system yields information about Niels’ system; it tells us what we would find if we were to measure there directly. But it does this at-a-distance, without any physical interaction taking place between the two systems. Thus the thought experiment at the heart of EPR undercuts the picture of measurement as necessarily involving a tiny object banging into a large measuring instrument. If we look back at Einstein’s reservations about complementarity, we can appreciate that by focusing on an indirect, non-disturbing kind of measurement the EPR argument targets Bohr’s program for explaining central conceptual features of the quantum theory. For that program relied on uncontrollable interaction with a measuring device as a necessary feature of any measurement in the quantum domain. Nevertheless the cumbersome machinery employed in the EPR paper makes it difficult to see what is central. It distracts from rather than focuses on the issues. That was Einstein’s complaint about Podolsky’s text in his June 19, 1935 letter to Schrödinger. Schrödinger responded on July 13 reporting reactions to EPR that vindicate Einstein’s concerns. With reference to EPR he wrote:

I am now having fun and taking your note to its source to provoke the most diverse, clever people: London, Teller, Born, Pauli, Szilard, Weyl. The best response so far is from Pauli who at least admits that the use of the word “state” [“Zustand”] for the psi-function is quite disreputable. What I have so far seen by way of published reactions is less witty. … It is as if one person said, “It is bitter cold in Chicago”; and another answered, “That is a fallacy, it is very hot in Florida.” (Fine 1996, p. 74)

1.3 Einstein’s versions of the argument

If the argument developed in EPR has its roots in the 1930 Solvay conference, Einstein’s own approach to issues at the heart of EPR has a history that goes back to the 1927 Solvay conference. (Bacciagaluppi and Valentini 2009, pp. 198–202, would even trace it back to 1909 and the localization of light quanta.) At that 1927 conference Einstein made a short presentation during the general discussion session where he focused on problems of interpretation associated with the collapse of the wave function. He imagines a situation where electrons pass through a small hole and are dispersed uniformly in the direction of a screen of photographic film shaped into a large hemisphere that surrounds the hole. On the supposition that quantum theory offers a complete account of individual processes then, in the case of localization, why does the whole wave front collapse to just one single flash point? It is as though at the moment of collapse an instantaneous signal were sent out from the point of collapse to all other possible collapse positions telling them not to flash. Thus Einstein maintains (Bacciagaluppi and Valentini 2009, p. 488),

the interpretation, according to which |ψ|² expresses the probability that this particle is found at a given point, assumes an entirely peculiar mechanism of action at a distance, which prevents the wave continuously distributed in space from producing an action in two places on the screen.

One could see this as a tension between local action and the description afforded by the wave function, since the wave function alone does not specify a unique position on the screen for detecting the particle. Einstein continues,

In my opinion, one can remove this objection only in the following way, that one does not describe the process solely by the Schrödinger wave, but that at the same time one localizes the particle during propagation.

In fact Einstein himself had tried this very route in May of 1927 where he proposed a way of “localizing the particle” by associating spatial trajectories and velocities with particle solutions to the Schrödinger equation. (See Belousek 1996 and Holland 2005; also Ryckman 2017.) Einstein abandoned the project and withdrew the draft from publication, however, after finding that certain intuitive independence conditions were in conflict with the product wave function used by quantum mechanics to treat the composition of independent systems. The problem here anticipates the more general issues raised by EPR over separability and composite systems. This proposal was Einstein’s one and only flirtation with the introduction of hidden variables into the quantum theory. In the following years he never embraced any proposal of that sort, although he hoped for progress in physics to yield a more complete theory, and one where the observer did not play a fundamental role. “We believe however that such a theory [“a complete description of the physical reality”] is possible” (p. 780). Commentators have often mistaken that remark as indicating Einstein’s predilection for hidden variables. To the contrary, after 1927 Einstein regarded the hidden variables project — the project of developing a more complete theory by starting with the existing quantum theory and adding things, like trajectories or real states — an improbable route to that goal. (See, for example, Einstein 1953a.) To improve on the quantum theory, he thought, would require starting afresh with quite different fundamental concepts. At Solvay he acknowledges Louis de Broglie’s pilot wave investigations as a possible direction to pursue for a more complete account of individual processes. But then he quickly turns to an alternative way of thinking, one that he continued to recommend as a better framework for progress, which is not to regard the quantum theory as describing individuals and their processes at all and, instead, to regard the theory as describing only ensembles of individuals. Einstein goes on to suggest difficulties for any scheme, like de Broglie’s and like quantum theory itself, that requires representations in multi-dimensional configuration space. These are difficulties that might move one further toward regarding quantum theory as not aspiring to a description of individual systems but as more amenable to an ensemble (or collective) point of view, and hence not a good starting point for building a better, more complete theory. His subsequent elaborations of EPR-like arguments are perhaps best regarded as no-go arguments, showing that the existing quantum theory does not lend itself to a sensible realist interpretation via hidden variables. If real states, taken as hidden variables, are added into the existing theory, which is then tailored to explain individual events, the result is either an incomplete theory or else a theory that does not respect locality. Hence, new concepts are needed. With respect to EPR, perhaps the most important feature of Einstein’s reflections at Solvay 1927 is his insight that a clash between completeness and locality already arises in considering a single variable (there, position) and does not require an incompatible pair, as in EPR.

Following the publication of EPR Einstein set about almost immediately to provide clear and focused versions of the argument. He began that process within few weeks of EPR, in the June 19 letter to Schrödinger, and continued it in an article published the following year (Einstein 1936). He returned to this particular form of an incompleteness argument in two later publications (Einstein 1948 and Schilpp 1949). Although these expositions differ in details they all employ composite systems as a way of implementing indirect measurements-at-a-distance. None of Einstein’s accounts contains the Criterion of Reality nor the tortured EPR argument over when values of a quantity can be regarded as “elements of reality”. The Criterion and these “elements” simply drop out. Nor does Einstein engage in calculations, like those of Podolsky, to fix the total wave function for the composite system explicitly. Unlike EPR, none of Einstein’s arguments makes use of simultaneous values for complementary quantities like position and momentum. He does not challenge the uncertainty relations. Indeed with respect to assigning eigenstates for a complementary pair he tells Schrödinger “ist mir wurst”—literally, it’s sausage to me; i.e., he couldn’t care less. (Fine 1996, p. 38). These writings probe an incompatibility between affirming locality and separability, on the one hand, and completeness in the description of individual systems by means of state functions, on the other. His argument is that we can have at most one of these but never both. He frequently refers to this dilemma as a “paradox”.

In the letter to Schrödinger of June 19, Einstein points to a simple argument for the dilemma which, like the argument from the 1927 Solvay Conference, involves only the measurement of a single variable. Consider an interaction between the Albert and Niels systems that establishes a strict correlation between their positions. (We need not worry about momentum, or any other quantity.) Consider the evolved wave function for the total (Albert+Niels) system when the two systems are far apart. Now assume a principle of locality-separability (Einstein calls it a Trennungsprinzip—separation principle): Whether a determinate physical situation holds for Niels’ system (e.g., that a quantity has a particular value) does not depend on what measurements (if any) are made locally on Albert’s system. If we measure the position of Albert’s system, the strict correlation of positions implies that Niels’ system has a certain position. By locality-separability it follows that Niels’ system must already have had that position just before the measurement on Albert’s system. At that time, however, Niels’ system alone does not have a state function. There is only a state function for the combined system and that total state function does not single out an existing position for Niels’ system (i.e., it is not a product one of whose factors is an eigenstate for the position of Niels’ system). Thus the description of Niels’ system afforded by the quantum state function is incomplete. A complete description would say (definitely yes) if a quantity of Niels’ system had a certain value. (Notice that this argument does not even depend on the reduction of the total state function for the combined system.) In this formulation of the argument it is clear that locality-separability conflicts with the eigenvalue-eigenstate link, which holds that a quantity of a system has a value if and only if the state of the system is an eigenstate (or a proper mixture of eigenstates) of that quantity with that value as eigenvalue. The “only if” part of the link would need to be weakened in order to interpret quantum state functions as complete descriptions. (See the entry on Modal Interpretations and see Gilton 2016 for a history of the eigenvalue-eigenstate link.)

This argument rests on the ordinary and intuitive notion of completeness as not omitting relevant truths. Thus, in the argument, the description given by the state function of a system is judged incomplete when it fails to attribute a position to the system in circumstances where the system indeed has a position. Although this simple argument concentrates on what Einstein saw as the essentials, stripping away most technical details and distractions, he frequently used another argument involving more than one quantity. (It is actually buried in the EPR paper, p. 779, and a version also occurs in the June 19, 1935 letter to Schrödinger. Harrigan and Spekkens, 2010 suggest reasons for preferring a many-variables argument.) This second argument focuses clearly on the interpretation of quantum state functions in terms of “real states” of a system, and not on any issues about simultaneous values (real or not) for complementary quantities. It goes like this.

Suppose, as in EPR, that the interaction between the two systems links position and also linear momentum, and that the systems are far apart. As before, we can measure either the position or the momentum of Albert’s system and, in either case, we can infer (respectively) a position or a momentum for Niels’ system. It follows from the reduction of the total state function that, depending on whether we measure the position or the momentum of Albert’s system, Niels’ system will be left (respectively) either in a position eigenstate or in a momentum eigenstate. Suppose too that separability holds, so that Niels’ system has some real physical state of affairs. If locality holds as well, then the measurement of Albert’s system does not disturb the assumed “reality” for Niels’ system. However, that reality appears to be represented by quite different state functions, depending on which measurement of Albert’s system one chooses to carry out. If we understand a “complete description” to rule out that one and the same physical state can be described by state functions with distinct physical implications, then we can conclude that the quantum mechanical description is incomplete. Here again we confront a dilemma between separability-locality and completeness. Many years later Einstein put it this way (Schilpp 1949, p. 682);

[T]he paradox forces us to relinquish one of the following two assertions:
(1) the description by means of the psi-function is complete
(2) the real states of spatially separate objects are independent of each other.

It appears that the central point of EPR was to argue that any interpretation of quantum state functions that attributes real physical states to systems faces these alternatives. It also appears that Einstein’s different arguments make use of different notions of completeness. In the first argument completeness is an ordinary notion that amounts to not leaving out any relevant details. In the second, completeness is a technical notion which has been dubbed “bijective completeness“ (Fine 1996 ): no more than one quantum state should correspond to a real state. These notions are connected. If completeness fails in the bijective sense, and more than one quantum state corresponds to some real state, we can argue that the ordinary notion of completeness also fails. For distinct quantum states will differ in the values they assign to certain quantities. (For example, the observable corresponding to the projector on a state takes value 1 in one case but not in the other.) Hence each will omit something that the other affirms, so completeness in the ordinary sense will fail. Put differently, ordinary completeness implies bijective completeness. (The converse is not true. Even if the correspondence of quantum states to real states were one-to-one, the description afforded by a quantum state might still leave out some physically relevant fact about its corresponding real state.) Thus a dilemma between locality and “completeness“ in Einstein’s versions of the argument still implicates ordinary completeness. For if locality holds, then his two-variable argument shows that bijective completeness fails, and then completeness in the ordinary sense fails as well.

As we have seen, in framing his own EPR-like arguments for the incompleteness of quantum theory, Einstein makes use of separability and locality, which are also tacitly assumed in the EPR paper. Using the language of “independent existence“ he presents these ideas clearly in an article that he sent to Max Born (Einstein 1948).

It is … characteristic of … physical objects that they are thought of as arranged in a space-time continuum. An essential aspect of this arrangement … is that they lay claim, at a certain time, to an existence independent of one another, provided these objects “are situated in different parts of space”. … The following idea characterizes the relative independence of objects (A and B) far apart in space: external influence on A has no direct influence on B. (Born, 1971, pp. 170–71)

In the course of his correspondence with Schrödinger, however, Einstein realized that assumptions about separability and locality were not necessary in order to get the incompleteness conclusion that he was after; i.e., to show that state functions may not provide a complete description of the real state of affairs with respect to a system. Separability supposes that there is a real state of affairs and locality supposes that one cannot influence it immediately by acting at a distance. What Einstein realized was that separability was already part of the ordinary conception of a macroscopic object. This suggested to him that if one looks at the local interaction of a macro-system with a micro-system one could avoid having to assume either separability or locality in order to conclude that the quantum description of the whole was incomplete with respect to its macroscopic part.

This line of thought evolves and dominates over problems with composite systems and locality in his last published reflections on incompleteness. Instead he focuses on problems with the stability of macro-descriptions in the transition to a classical level from the quantum.

the objective describability of individual macro-systems (description of the “real-state”) can not be renounced without the physical picture of the world, so to speak, decomposing into a fog. (Einstein 1953b, p. 40. See also Einstein 1953a.)

In the August 8, 1935 letter to Schrödinger Einstein says that he will illustrate the problem by means of a “crude macroscopic example”.

The system is a substance in chemically unstable equilibrium, perhaps a charge of gunpowder that, by means of intrinsic forces, can spontaneously combust, and where the average life span of the whole setup is a year. In principle this can quite easily be represented quantum-mechanically. In the beginning the psi-function characterizes a reasonably well-defined macroscopic state. But, according to your equation [i.e., the Schrödinger equation], after the course of a year this is no longer the case. Rather, the psi-function then describes a sort of blend of not-yet and already-exploded systems. Through no art of interpretation can this psi-function be turned into an adequate description of a real state of affairs; in reality there is no intermediary between exploded and not-exploded. (Fine 1996, p. 78)

The point is that after a year either the gunpowder will have exploded, or not. (This is the “real state” which in the EPR situation requires one to assume separability.) The state function, however, will have evolved into a complex superposition over these two alternatives. Provided we maintain the eigenvalue-eigenstate link, the quantum description by means of that state function will yield neither conclusion, and hence the quantum description is incomplete. For a contemporary response to this line of argument, one might look to the program of decoherence. (See Decoherence.) That program points to interactions with the environment which may quickly reduce the likelihood of any interference between the “exploded” and the “not-exploded” branches of the evolved psi-function. Then, breaking the eigenvalue-eigenstate link, decoherence adopts a perspective according to which the (almost) non-interfering branches of the psi-function allow that the gunpowder is indeed either exploded or not. Even so, decoherence fails to identify which alternative is actually realized, leaving the quantum description still incomplete. Such decoherence-based interpretations of the psi-function are certainly “artful”, and their adequacy is still under debate (see Schlosshauer 2007, especially Chapter 8).

The reader may recognize the similarity between Einstein’s exploding gunpowder example and Schrödinger’s cat (Schrödinger 1935a, p. 812). In the case of the cat an unstable atom is hooked up to a lethal device that, after an hour, is as likely to poison (and kill) the cat as not, depending on whether the atom decays. After an hour the cat is either alive or dead, but the quantum state of the whole atom-poison-cat system at this time is a superposition involving the two possibilities and, just as in the case of the gunpowder, is not a complete description of the situation (life or death) of the cat. The similarity between the gunpowder and the cat is hardly accidental since Schrödinger first produced the cat example in his reply of September 19, 1935 to Einstein’s August 8 gunpowder letter. There Schrödinger says that he has himself constructed “an example very similar to your exploding powder keg”, and proceeds to outline the cat (Fine 1996, pp. 82–83). Although the “cat paradox” is usually cited in connection with the problem of quantum measurement (see the relevant section of the entry on Philosophical Issues in Quantum Theory) and treated as a paradox separate from EPR, its origin is here as an argument for incompleteness that avoids the twin assumptions of separability and locality. Schrödinger’s development of “entanglement”, the term he introduced for the correlations that result when quantum systems interact, also began in this correspondence over EPR — along with a treatment of what he called quantum “steering” (Schrödinger 1935a, 1935b; see Quantum Entanglement and Information).

2. A popular form of the argument: Bohr’s response

The literature surrounding EPR contains yet another version of the argument, a popular version that—unlike any of Einstein’s—features the Criterion of Reality. Assume again an interaction between our two systems linking their positions and their linear momenta and suppose that the systems are far apart. If we measure the position of Albert’s system, we can infer that Niels’ system has a corresponding position. We can also predict it with certainty, given the result of the position measurement of Albert’s system. Hence, in this version, the Criterion of Reality is taken to imply that the position of Niels’ system constitutes an element of reality. Similarly, if we measure the momentum of Albert’s system, we can conclude that the momentum of Niels’ system is an element of reality. The argument now concludes that since we can choose freely to measure either position or momentum, it “follows” that both must be elements of reality simultaneously.

Of course no such conclusion follows from our freedom of choice. It is not sufficient to be able to choose at will which quantity to measure; for the conclusion to follow from the Criterion alone one would need to be able to measure both quantities at once. This is precisely the point that Einstein recognized in his 1932 letter to Ehrenfest and that EPR addresses by assuming locality and separability. What is striking about this version is that these principles, central to the original EPR argument and to the dilemma at the heart of Einstein’s versions, are obscured here. Instead this version features the Criterion and those “elements of reality”. Perhaps the difficulties presented by Podolsky’s text contribute to this reading. In any case, in the physics literature this version is commonly taken to represent EPR and usually attributed to Einstein. This reading certainly has a prominent source in terms of which one can understand its popularity among physicists; it is Niels Bohr himself.

By the time of the EPR paper many of the early interpretive battles over the quantum theory had been settled, at least to the satisfaction of working physicists. Bohr had emerged as the “philosopher” of the new theory and the community of quantum theorists, busy with the development and extension of the theory, were content to follow Bohr’s leadership when it came to explaining and defending its conceptual underpinnings (Beller 1999, Chapter 13). Thus in 1935 the burden fell to Bohr to explain what was wrong with the EPR “paradox”. The major article that he wrote in discharging this burden (Bohr 1935a) became the canon for how to respond to EPR. Unfortunately, Bohr’s summary of EPR in that article, which is the version just above, also became the canon for what EPR contained by way of argument.

Bohr’s response to EPR begins, as do many of his treatments of the conceptual issues raised by the quantum theory, with a discussion of limitations on the simultaneous determination of position and momentum. As usual, these are drawn from an analysis of the possibilities of measurement if one uses an apparatus consisting of a diaphragm connected to a rigid frame. Bohr emphasizes that the question is to what extent can we trace the interaction between the particle being measured and the measuring instrument. (See Beller 1999, Chapter 7 for a detailed analysis and discussion of the “two voices” contained in Bohr’s account. See too Bacciagaluppi 2015.) Following the summary of EPR, Bohr (1935a, p. 700) then focuses on the Criterion of Reality which, he says, “contains an ambiguity as regards the meaning of the expression ‘without in any way disturbing a system’.” Bohr agrees that in the indirect measurement of Niels’ system achieved when one makes a measurement of Albert’s system “there is no question of a mechanical disturbance” of Niels’ system. Still, Bohr claims that a measurement on Albert’s system does involve “an influence on the very conditions which define the possible types of predictions regarding the future behavior of [Niels’] system.” The meaning of this claim is not at all clear. Indeed, in revisiting EPR fifteen years later, Bohr would comment,

Rereading these passages, I am deeply aware of the inefficiency of expression which must have made it very difficult to appreciate the trend of the argumentation (Bohr 1949, p. 234).

Unfortunately, Bohr takes no notice there of Einstein’s later versions of the argument and merely repeats his earlier response to EPR. In that response, however inefficiently, Bohr appears to be directing attention to the fact that when we measure, for example, the position of Albert’s system conditions are in place for predicting the position of Niels’ system but not its momentum. The opposite would be true in measuring the momentum of Albert’s system. Thus his “possible types of predictions” concerning Niels’ system appear to correspond to which variable we measure on Albert’s system. Bohr proposes then to block the EPR Criterion by counting, say, the position measurement of Albert’s system as an “influence” on the distant system of Niels. If we assume it is an influence that disturbs Niels’ system, then the Criterion could not be used, as in Bohr’s version of the argument, in producing an element of reality for Niels’ system that challenges completeness.

There are two important things to notice about this response. The first is this. In conceding that Einstein’s indirect method for determining, say, the position of Niels’ system does not mechanically disturb that system, Bohr departs from his original program of complementarity, which was to base the uncertainty relations and the statistical character of quantum theory on uncontrollable physical interactions, interactions that were supposed to arise inevitably between a measuring instrument and the system being measured. Instead Bohr now distinguishes between a genuine physical interaction (his “mechanical disturbance”) and some other sort of “influence” on the conditions for specifying (or “defining”) sorts of predictions for the future behavior of a system. In emphasizing that there is no question of a robust interaction in the EPR situation, Bohr retreats from his earlier, physically grounded conception of complementarity.

The second important thing to notice is how Bohr’s response needs to be implemented in order to block the argument of EPR and Einstein’s later arguments that pose a dilemma between principles of locality and completeness. In these arguments the locality principle makes explicit reference to the reality of the unmeasured system: the reality pertaining to Niels’ system does not depend on what measurements (if any) are made locally on Albert’s system. Hence Bohr’s suggestion that those measurements influence conditions for specifying types of predictions would not affect the argument unless one includes those conditions as part of the reality of Niels’ system. This is exactly what Bohr goes on to say, “these conditions constitute an inherent element of the description of any phenomena to which the term ‘physical reality’ can be properly attached” (Bohr 1935a, p. 700). So Bohr’s picture is that these “influences”, operating directly across any spatial distances, result in different physically real states of Niels’ system depending on the type of measurement made on Albert’s. (Recall EPR warning against just this move.)

The quantum formalism for interacting systems describes how a measurement on Albert’s system reduces the composite state and distributes quantum states and associated probabilities to the component systems. Here Bohr redescribes that formal reduction using EPR’s language of influences and reality. He turns ordinary local measurements into “influences” that automatically change physical reality elsewhere, and at any distance whatsoever. This grounds the quantum formalism in a rather magical ontological framework, a move quite out of character for the usually pragmatic Bohr. In his correspondence over EPR, Schrödinger compared ideas like that to ritual magic.

This assumption arises from the standpoint of the savage, who believes that he can harm his enemy by piercing the enemy’s image with a needle. (Letter to Edward Teller, June 14, 1935, quoted in Bacciagaluppi 2015)

It is as though EPR’s talk of “reality” and its elements provoked Bohr to adopt the position of Moliere’s doctor who, pressed to explain why opium is a sedative, invents an inherent dormative virtue, “which causes the senses to become drowsy.” Usually Bohr sharply deflates any attempt like this to get behind the formalism, insisting that “the appropriate physical interpretation of the symbolic quantum-mechanical formalism amounts only to predictions, of determinate or statistical character” (Bohr 1949, p. 238).

Could this portrait of nonlocal influences automatically shaping a distant reality be a by-product of Bohr’s “inefficiency of expression”? Despite Bohr’s seeming tolerance for a breakdown of locality in his response here to EPR, in other places Bohr rejects nonlocality in the strongest terms. For example in discussing an electron double slit experiment, which is Bohr’s favorite model for illustrating the novel conceptual features of quantum theory, and writing only weeks before the publication of EPR, Bohr argues as follows.

If we only imagine the possibility that without disturbing the phenomena we determine through which hole the electron passes, we would truly find ourselves in irrational territory, for this would put us in a situation in which an electron, which might be said to pass through this hole, would be affected by the circumstance of whether this [other] hole was open or closed; but … it is completely incomprehensible that in its later course [the electron] should let itself be influenced by this hole down there being open or shut. (Bohr 1935b)

It is uncanny how closely Bohr’s language mirrors that of EPR. But here Bohr defends locality and regards the very contemplation of nonlocality as “irrational” and “completely incomprehensible”. Since “the circumstance of whether this [other] hole was open or closed” does affect the possible types of predictions regarding the electron’s future behavior, if we expand the concept of the electron’s “reality”, as he appears to suggest for EPR, by including such information, we do “disturb” the electron around one hole by opening or closing the other hole. That is, if we give to “disturb” and to “reality” the very same sense that Bohr appears to give them when responding to EPR, then we are led to an “incomprehensible” nonlocality, and into the territory of the irrational (like Schrödinger’s savage).

There is another way of trying to understand Bohr’s position. According to one common reading (see Copenhagen Interpretation), after EPR Bohr embraced a relational (or contextual) account of property attribution. On this account to speak of the position, say, of a system presupposes that one already has put in place an appropriate interaction involving an apparatus for measuring position (or at least an appropriate frame of reference for the measurement; Dickson 2004). Thus “the position” of the system refers to a relation between the system and the measuring device (or measurement frame). (See Relational Quantum Mechanics, where a similar idea is developed independently of measurements.) In the EPR context this would seem to imply that before one is set up to measure the position of Albert’s system, talk of the position of Niels’ system is out of place; whereas after one measures the position of Albert’s system, talk of the position of Niels’ system is appropriate and, indeed, we can then say truly that Niels’ system “has” a position. Similar considerations govern momentum measurements. It follows, then, that local manipulations carried out on Albert’s system, in a place we may assume to be far removed from Niels’ system, can directly affect what is meaningful to say about, as well as factually true of, Niels’ system. Similarly, in the double slit arrangement, it would follow that what can be said meaningfully and said truly about the position of the electron around the top hole would depend on the context of whether the bottom hole is open or shut. One might suggest that such relational actions-at-a-distance are harmless ones, perhaps merely “semantic”; like becoming the “best” at a task when your only competitor—who might be miles away—fails. Note, however, that in the case of ordinary relational predicates it is not inappropriate (or “meaningless”) to talk about the situation in the absence of complete information about the relata. So you might be the best at a task even if your competitor has not yet tried it, and you are definitely not an aunt (or uncle) until one of your siblings gives birth. But should we say that an electron is nowhere at all until we are set up to measure its position, or would it be inappropriate (meaningless?) even to ask?

If quantum predicates are relational, they are different from many ordinary relations in that the conditions for the relata are taken as criterial for the application of the term. In this regard one might contrast the relativity of simultaneity with the proposed relativity of position. In relativistic physics specifying a world-line fixes a frame of reference for attributions of simultaneity to events regardless of whether any temporal measurements are being made or contemplated. But in the quantum case, on this proposal, specifying a frame of reference for position (say, the laboratory frame) does not entitle one to attribute position to a system, unless that frame is associated with actually preparing or completing a measurement of position for that system. To be sure, analyzing predicates in terms of occurrent measurement or observation is familiar from neopositivist approaches to the language of science; for example, in Percy Bridgman’s operational analysis of physical terms, where the actual applications of test-response pairs constitute criteria for any meaningful use of a term (see Theory and Observation in Science ). Rudolph Carnap’s later introduction of reduction sentences (see the entry on the Vienna Circle) has a similar character. Still, this positivist reading entails just the sort of nonlocality that Bohr seemed to abhor.

In the light of all this it is difficult to know whether a coherent response can be attributed to Bohr reliably that would derail EPR. (In different ways, Dickson 2004 and Halvorson and Clifton 2004 make an attempt on Bohr’s behalf. These are examined in Whitaker 2004 and Fine 2007. See also the essays in Faye and Folse 2017.) Bohr may well have been aware of the difficulty in framing the appropriate concepts clearly when, a few years after EPR, he wrote,

The unaccustomed features of the situation with which we are confronted in quantum theory necessitate the greatest caution as regard all questions of terminology. Speaking, as it is often done of disturbing a phenomenon by observation, or even of creating physical attributes to objects by measuring processes is liable to be confusing, since all such sentences imply a departure from conventions of basic language which even though it can be practical for the sake of brevity, can never be unambiguous. (Bohr 1939, p. 320. Quoted in Section 3.2 of the entry on the Uncertainty Principle.)

3. Development of EPR

3.1 Spin and The Bohm version

For about fifteen years following its publication, the EPR paradox was discussed at the level of a thought experiment whenever the conceptual difficulties of quantum theory became an issue. In 1951 David Bohm, a protégé of Robert Oppenheimer and then an untenured Assistant Professor at Princeton University, published a textbook on the quantum theory in which he took a close look at EPR in order to develop a response in the spirit of Bohr. Bohm showed how one could mirror the conceptual situation in the EPR thought experiment by looking at the dissociation of a diatomic molecule whose total spin angular momentum is (and remains) zero; for instance, the dissociation of an excited hydrogen molecule into a pair of hydrogen atoms by means of a process that does not change an initially zero total angular momentum (Bohm 1951, Sections 22.15–22.18). In the Bohm experiment the atomic fragments separate after interaction, flying off in different directions freely to separate experimental wings. Subsequently, in each wing, measurements are made of spin components (which here take the place of position and momentum), whose measured values would be anti-correlated after dissociation. In the so-called singlet state of the atomic pair, the state after dissociation, if one atom’s spin is found to be positive with respect to the orientation of an axis perpendicular to its flight path, the other atom would be found to have a negative spin with respect to a perpendicular axis with the same orientation. Like the operators for position and momentum, spin operators for different non-orthogonal orientations do not commute. Moreover, in the experiment outlined by Bohm, the atomic fragments can move to wings far apart from one another and so become appropriate objects for assumptions that restrict the effects of purely local actions. Thus Bohm’s experiment mirrors the entangled correlations in EPR for spatially separated systems, allowing for similar arguments and conclusions involving locality, separability, and completeness. Indeed, a late note of Einstein’s, that may have been prompted by Bohm’s treatment, contains a very sketchy spin version of the EPR argument – once again pitting completeness against locality (“A coupling of distant things is excluded.” Sauer 2007, p. 882). Following Bohm (1951) a paper by Bohm and Aharonov (1957) went on to outline the machinery for a plausible experiment in which entangled spin correlations could be tested. It has become customary to refer to experimental arrangements involving determinations of spin components for spatially separated systems, and to a variety of similar set-ups (especially ones for measuring photon polarization), as “EPRB” experiments—“B” for Bohm. Because of technical difficulties in creating and monitoring the atomic fragments, however, there seem to have been no immediate attempts to perform a Bohm version of EPR.

3.2 Bell and beyond

That was to remain the situation for almost another fifteen years, until John Bell utilized the EPRB set-up to construct a stunning argument, at least as challenging as EPR, but to a different conclusion (Bell 1964). Bell considers correlations between measurement outcomes for systems in separate wings where the measurement axes of the systems differ by angles set locally. In his original paper, essentially using the lemma from EPR governing strict correlations, Bell shows that correlations measured in different runs of an EPRB experiment satisfy a system of constraints, known as the Bell inequalities. Later demonstrations by Bell and others, using related assumptions, extend this class of inequalities. In certain of these EPRB experiments, however, quantum theory predicts correlations that violate particular Bell inequalities by an experimentally significant amount. Thus Bell shows (see the entry on Bell’s Theorem) that the quantum statistics are inconsistent with the given assumptions. Prominent among these is an assumption of locality, similar to the locality assumptions tacitly assumed in EPR and (explicitly) in the one-variable and many-variable arguments of Einstein. One important difference is that for Einstein locality restricts factors that might influence the (assumed) real physical states of spatially separated systems (separability). For Bell, locality is focused instead on factors that might influence outcomes of measurements in experiments where both systems are measured. (See Fine 1996, Chapter 4.) These differences are not usually attended to and Bell’s theorem is often characterized simply as showing that quantum theory is nonlocal. Even so, since assumptions other then locality are needed in any derivation of the Bell inequalities (roughly, assumptions guaranteeing a classical representation of the quantum probabilities; see Fine 1982a, and Malley 2004), one should be cautious about singling out locality (in Bell’s sense, or Einstein’s) as necessarily in conflict with the quantum theory, or refuted by experiment.

Bell’s results have been explored and deepened by various theoretical investigations and they have stimulated a number of increasingly sophisticated and delicate EPRB-type experiments designed to test whether the Bell inequalities hold where quantum theory predicts they should fail. With a few anomalous exceptions, the experiments appear to confirm the quantum violations of the inequalities. (Brunner et al 2014 is a comprehensive technical review.) The confirmation is quantitatively impressive, although not fully conclusive. There are a number of significant requirements on the experiments whose failures (generally downplayed as “loopholes”) allow for models of the experimental data that embody locality (in Bell’s sense), so-called local realist models. One family of “loopholes” (sampling) arises from possible losses (inefficiency) between emission and detection and from the delicate coincidence timing required to compute correlations. All the early experiments to test the Bell inequalities were subject to this loophole, so all could be modeled locally and realistically. (The prism and synchronization models in Fine 1982b are early models of this sort. Larsson 2014 is a general review.) Another “loophole” (locality) concerns whether Niels’ system, in one wing, could learn about what measurements are set to be performed in Albert’s wing in time to adjust its behavior. Experiments insuring locality need to separate the wings and this can allow losses or timing glitches that open them to models exploiting sampling error. Perversely, experiments to address sampling may require the wings to be fairly close together, close enough generally, it turns out, to allow information sharing and hence local realist models. There are now a few experiments that claim to close both loopholes together. They too have problems. (See Bednorz 2017 for a critical discussion.)

There is also a third major complication or “loophole”. It arises from the need to ensure that causal factors affecting measurement outcomes are not correlated with the choices of measurement settings. Known as “measurement independence” or sometimes “free choice”, it turns out that even statistically small violations of this independence requirement allow for local realism (Putz and Gisin 2016). Since connections between outcomes and settings might occur anywhere in the causal past of the experiment, there is really no way to insure measurement independence completely. Suitably random choices of settings might avoid this loophole within the time frame of the experiment, or even extend that time some years into the past. An impressive, recent experiment pushes the time frame back about six hundred years by using the color of Milky Way starlight (blue or red photons) to choose the measurement settings. (Handsteiner et al 2017). Of course traveling between the Milky Way and the detectors in Vienna a lot of starlight is lost (over seventy per cent), which leaves the experiment wide open to the sampling loophole. Moreover, there is an obvious common cause for settings and outcomes (and all); namely, the big bang. With that in mind one might be inclined to dismiss free choice as not serious even for a “loophole”. It may seem like an ad hoc hypothesis that postulates a cosmic conspiracy on the part of Nature just to the save the Bell inequalities. Note, however, that ordinary inefficiency can also be modeled locally as a violation of free choice, because an individual measurement that produces no usable result can just as well be regarded as not currently available. Since inefficiency is not generally counted as a violation of local causality or a restriction on free will, nor as a conspiracy (well, not a cosmic one), measurement dependence should not be dismissed so quickly. Instead, one might see measurement dependent correlations as normal limitations in a system subject to dynamical constraints or boundary conditions, and thus use them as clues, along with other guideposts, in searching for a covering local theory. (See Weinstein 2009.)

Experimental tests of the Bell inequalities continue to be refined. Their analysis is delicate, employing sophisticated statistical models and simulations. (See Elkouss and Wehner 2016 and Graft 2016.) The significance of the tests remains a lively area for critical discussion. Meanwhile the techniques developed in the experiments, and related ideas for utilizing the entanglement associated with EPRB-type interactions, have become important in their own right. These techniques and ideas, stemming from EPRB and the Bell theorem, have applications now being advanced in the field of quantum information theory — which includes quantum cryptography, teleportation and computing (see Quantum Entanglement and Information).

To go back to the EPR dilemma between locality and completeness, it would appear from the Bell theorem that Einstein’s preference for locality at the expense of completeness may have fixed on the wrong horn. Even though the Bell theorem does not rule out locality conditions conclusively, it should certainly make one wary of assuming them. On the other hand, since Einstein’s exploding gunpowder argument (or Schrödinger’s cat), along with his later arguments over macro-systems, support incompleteness without assuming locality, one should be wary of adopting the other horn of the dilemma, affirming that the quantum state descriptions are complete and “therefore” that the theory is nonlocal. It may well turn out that both horns need to be rejected: that the state functions do not provide a complete description and that the theory is also nonlocal (although possibly still separable; see Winsberg and Fine 2003). There is at least one well-known approach to the quantum theory that makes a choice of this sort, the de Broglie-Bohm approach (Bohmian Mechanics). Of course it may also be possible to break the EPR argument for the dilemma plausibly by questioning some of its other assumptions (e.g., separability, the reduction postulate, the eigenvalue-eigenstate link, or measurement independence). That might free up the remaining option, to regard the theory as both local and complete. Perhaps some version of the Everett Interpretation would come to occupy this branch of the interpretive tree, or perhaps Relational Quantum Mechanics.


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