# Quantum Mechanics

*First published Wed Nov 29, 2000; substantive revision Thu Sep 10, 2020*

Quantum mechanics is, at least at first glance and at least in part, a
mathematical machine for predicting the behaviors of microscopic
particles — or, at least, of the measuring instruments we use to
explore those behaviors — and in that capacity, it is spectacularly
successful: in terms of power and precision, head and shoulders above
any theory we have ever had. Mathematically, the theory is well
understood; we know what its parts are, how they are put together, and
why, in the mechanical sense (i.e., in a sense that can be answered by
describing the internal grinding of gear against gear), the whole thing
performs the way it does, how the information that gets fed in at one
end is converted into what comes out the other. The question of what
kind of a world it describes, however, is controversial; there is very
little agreement, among physicists and among philosophers, about what
the world *is like* according to quantum mechanics. Minimally
interpreted, the theory describes a set of facts about the way the
microscopic world impinges on the macroscopic one, how it affects our
measuring instruments, described in everyday language or the language
of classical mechanics. Disagreement centers on the question of what a
microscopic world, which affects our apparatuses in the prescribed
manner, is, or even could be, like *intrinsically*; or how those
apparatuses could themselves be built out of microscopic parts of the
sort the theory
describes.^{[1]}

That is what an interpretation of the theory would provide: a proper
account of what the world is like according to quantum mechanics,
intrinsically and from the bottom up. The problems with giving an
interpretation (not just a comforting, homey sort of interpretation,
i.e., not just an interpretation according to which the world isn’t too
different from the familiar world of common sense, but any
interpretation at all) are dealt with in other sections of this
encyclopedia. Here, we are concerned only with the mathematical heart
of the theory, the theory in its capacity as a mathematical machine,
and — whatever is true of the rest of it — *this* part of the
theory makes exquisitely good sense.

- 1. Terminology
- 2. Mathematics
- 3. Quantum Mechanics
- 4. Structures on Hilbert Space
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Terminology

Physical systems are divided into **types** according to
their unchanging (or ‘state-independent’) properties, and
the **state** of a system at a time consists of a complete
specification of those of its properties that change with time (its
‘state-dependent’ properties). To give a complete
description of a system, then, we need to say what type of system it is
and what its state is at each moment in its history.

A **physical quantity** is a mutually exclusive and
jointly exhaustive family of physical properties (for those who know
this way of talking, it is a family of properties with the structure of
the cells in a partition). Knowing what kinds of values a quantity
takes can tell us a great deal about the relations among the properties
of which it is composed. The values of a bivalent quantity, for
instance, form a set with two members; the values of a real-valued
quantity form a set with the structure of the real numbers. This is a
special case of something we will see again and again, *viz.*,
that knowing what kind of mathematical objects represent the elements
in some set (here, the values of a physical quantity; later, the states
that a system can assume, or the quantities pertaining to it) tells us
a very great deal (indeed, arguably, all there is to know) about the
relations among them.

In quantum mechanical contexts, the term
‘**observable**’ is used interchangeably with
‘physical quantity’, and should be treated as a technical
term with the same meaning. It is no accident that the early developers
of the theory chose the term, but the choice was made for reasons that
are not, nowadays, generally accepted. The **state-space**
of a system is the space formed by the set of its possible
states,^{[2]}
i.e., the physically possible ways of
combining the values of quantities that characterize it internally. In
classical theories, a set of quantities which forms a supervenience
basis for the rest is typically designated as ‘basic’ or
‘fundamental’, and, since any mathematically possible way
of combining their values is a physical possibility, the state-space
can be obtained by simply taking these as
coordinates.^{[3]}
So, for instance, the state-space of a classical mechanical system
composed of \(n\) particles, obtained by specifying the values of
\(6n\) real-valued quantities — three components of position, and
three of momentum for each particle in the system — is a
\(6n\)-dimensional coordinate space. Each possible state of such
a system corresponds to a point in the space, and each point in the
space corresponds to a possible state of such a system. The situation
is a little different in quantum mechanics, where there are
mathematically describable ways of combining the values of the
quantities that don’t represent physically possible states. As we will
see, the state-spaces of quantum mechanics are special kinds of vector
spaces, known as Hilbert spaces, and they have more internal structure
than their classical counterparts.

A **structure** is a set of elements on which certain
operations and relations are defined, a **mathematical
structure** is just a structure in which the elements are
mathematical objects (numbers, sets, vectors) and the operations
mathematical ones, and a **model** is a mathematical
structure used to represent some physically significant structure in
the world.

The heart and soul of quantum mechanics is contained in the Hilbert
spaces that represent the state-spaces of quantum mechanical systems.
The internal relations among states and quantities, and everything this
entails about the ways quantum mechanical systems behave, are all woven
into the structure of these spaces, embodied in the relations among the
mathematical objects which represent
them.^{[4]}
This means that
understanding what a system is like according to quantum mechanics is
inseparable from familiarity with the internal structure of those
spaces. Know your way around Hilbert space, and become familiar with
the dynamical laws that describe the paths that vectors travel through
it, and you know everything there is to know, in the terms provided by
the theory, about the systems that it describes.

By ‘know your way around’ Hilbert space, I mean something more than possess a description or a map of it; anybody who has a quantum mechanics textbook on their shelf has that. I mean know your way around it in the way you know your way around the city in which you live. This is a practical kind of knowledge that comes in degrees and it is best acquired by learning to solve problems of the form: How do I get from A to B? Can I get there without passing through C? And what is the shortest route? Graduate students in physics spend long years gaining familiarity with the nooks and crannies of Hilbert space, locating familiar landmarks, treading its beaten paths, learning where secret passages and dead ends lie, and developing a sense of the overall lay of the land. They learn how to navigate Hilbert space in the way a cab driver learns to navigate his city.

How much of this kind of knowledge is needed to approach the philosophical problems associated with the theory? In the beginning, not very much: just the most general facts about the geometry of the landscape (which is, in any case, unlike that of most cities, beautifully organized), and the paths that (the vectors representing the states of) systems travel through them. That is what will be introduced here: first a bit of easy math, and then, in a nutshell, the theory.

## 2. Mathematics

### 2.1 Vectors and vector spaces

A **vector** \(A\), written ‘\(\ket{A}\)’, is a
mathematical object characterized by a length, \(|A|\), and a direction. A
normalized vector is a vector of length 1; i.e., \(|A| = 1\). Vectors can
be added together, multiplied by constants (including complex
numbers), and multiplied together. Vector addition maps any pair of
vectors onto another vector, specifically, the one you get by moving
the second vector so that its tail coincides with the tip of the
first, without altering the length or direction of either, and then
joining the tail of the first to the tip of the second. This addition
rule is known as the parallelogram law. So, for example, adding
vectors \(\ket{A}\) and \(\ket{B}\) yields vector \(\ket{C} (= \ket{A} + \ket{B})\) as
in Figure 1:

Figure 1. Vector Addition

Multiplying a vector \(\ket{A}\) by \(n\), where \(n\) is a constant, gives a vector which is the same direction as \(\ket{A}\) but whose length is \(n\) times \(\ket{A}\)’s length.

In a real vector space, the (inner or dot) product of a pair of vectors \(\ket{A}\) and \(\ket{B}\), written ‘\(\braket{A}{B}\)’ is a scalar equal to the product of their lengths (or ‘norms’) times the cosine of the angle, \(\theta\), between them:

\[ \braket{A}{B} = |A| |B| \cos \theta \]Let \(\ket{A_1}\) and \(\ket{A_2}\) be vectors of length 1 (“unit vectors”) such that \(\braket{A_1}{A_2} = 0\). (So the angle between these two unit vectors must be 90 degrees.) Then we can represent any two-dimensional vector \(\ket{B}\) in terms of our unit vectors as follows:

\[ \ket{B} = b_1 \ket{A_1} + b_2 \ket{A_2} \]For example, here is a graph which shows how \(\ket{B}\) can be represented as the sum of the two unit vectors \(\ket{A_1}\) and \(\ket{A_2}\):

Figure 2. Representing \(\ket{B}\) by Vector Addition of Unit Vectors

Now the definition of the inner product \(\braket{A}{B}\) has to be modified to apply to complex spaces. Let \(c^*\) be the complex conjugate of \(c\). (When \(c\) is a complex number of the form \(a \pm bi\), then the complex conjugate \(c^*\) of \(c\) is defined as follows:

\[ [a+bi]^* = a-bi \\ [a-bi]^* = a+bi \]So, for all complex numbers \(c\), \([c^*]^* = c\), but \(c^* = c\) just in case \(c\) is real.) Now definition of the inner product of \(\ket{A}\) and \(\ket{B}\) for complex spaces can be given in terms of the conjugates of complex coefficients as follows. Where \(\ket{A_1}\) and \(\ket{A_2}\) are the unit vectors described earlier, \(\ket{A} = a_1 \ket{A_1} + a_2 \ket{A_2}\) and \(\ket{B} = b_1 \ket{A_1} + b_2 \ket{A_2}\), then

\[ \braket{A}{B} = (a_1^*)(b_1) + (a_2^*)(b_2) \]The most general and abstract notion of an inner product, of which we’ve now defined two special cases, is as follows. \(\braket{A}{B}\) is an inner product on a vector space \(V\) just in case

- \(\braket{A}{A} = |A|^2\), and \(\braket{A}{A}=0\) if and only if \(A=0\)
- \(\braket{B}{A} = \braket{A}{B}^*\)
- \(\braket{B}{A+C}=\braket{B}{A} + \braket{B}{C}\).

It follows from this that

- the length of \(\ket{A}\) is the square root of inner product of \(\ket{A}\) with itself, i.e., \[ |A| = \sqrt{\braket{A}{A}} \]

and

- \(\ket{A}\) and \(\ket{B}\) are mutually perpendicular, or
**orthogonal**, if, and only if, \(\braket{A}{B}\).

A **vector space** is a set of vectors closed under
addition, and multiplication by constants, **an inner product
space** is a vector space on which the operation of vector
multiplication has been defined, and the **dimension** of
such a space is the maximum number of nonzero, mutually orthogonal
vectors it contains.

Any collection of \(N\) mutually orthogonal vectors of length 1 in an
\(N\)-dimensional vector space constitutes an **orthonormal
basis** for that space. Let \(\ket{A_1}, \ldots, \ket{A_N}\) be such a collection of unit vectors. Then every
vector in the space can be expressed as a sum of the form:

where \(b_i = \braket{B}{A_i}\). The \(b_i\)’s here are
known as \(B\)’s **expansion coefficients** in the \(A\)-basis.^{[5]}

Notice that:

- for all vectors \(A\), \(B\), and \(C\) in a given space, \[ \braket{A}{B+C} = \braket{A}{B} + \braket{A}{C} \]
- for any vectors \(M\) and \(Q\), expressed in terms of the \(A\)-basis,
\[
\ket{M} + \ket{Q} = \sum_{i=1}^N (m_i + q_i) \ket{A_i},
\]
and

\[ \braket{M}{Q} = \sum_{i=1}^N m_i^* q_i \]

There is another way of writing vectors, namely by writing their expansion coefficients (relative to a given basis) in a column, like so:

\[ \ket{Q} = \begin{bmatrix} q_1 \\ q_2 \end{bmatrix} \]where \(q_i = \braket{Q}{A_i}\) and the \(A_i\) are the chosen basis vectors.

When we are dealing with vector spaces of infinite dimension, since we can’t write the whole column of expansion coefficients needed to pick out a vector since it would have to be infinitely long, so instead we write down the function (called the ‘wave function’ for \(Q\), usually represented \(\psi(i))\) which has those coefficients as values. We write down, that is, the function:

\[ \psi(i) = q_i = \braket{Q}{A_i} \]Given any vector in, and any basis for, a vector space, we can obtain the wave-function of the vector in that basis; and given a wave-function for a vector, in a particular basis, we can construct the vector whose wave-function it is. Since it turns out that most of the important operations on vectors correspond to simple algebraic operations on their wave-functions, this is the usual way to represent state-vectors.

When a pair of physical systems interact, they form a composite system, and, in quantum mechanics as in classical mechanics, there is a rule for constructing the state-space of a composite system from those of its components, a rule that tells us how to obtain, from the state-spaces, \(H_A\) and \(H_B\) for \(A\) and \(B\), respectively, the state-space — called the ‘tensor product’ of \(H_A\) and \(H_B\), and written \(H_A \otimes H_B\) — of the pair. There are two important things about the rule; first, so long as \(H_A\) and \(H_B\) are Hilbert spaces, \(H_A \otimes H_B\) will be as well, and second, there are some facts about the way \(H_A \otimes H_B\) relates to \(H_A\) and \(H_B\), that have surprising consequences for the relations between the complex system and its parts. In particular, it turns out that the state of a composite system is not uniquely defined by those of its components. What this means, or at least what it appears to mean, is that there are, according to quantum mechanics, facts about composite systems (and not just facts about their spatial configuration) that don’t supervene on facts about their components; it means that there are facts about systems as wholes that don’t supervene on facts about their parts and the way those parts are arranged in space. The significance of this feature of the theory cannot be overplayed; it is, in one way or another, implicated in most of its most difficult problems.

In a little more detail: if \(\{v_{i}^A\}\) is an orthonormal basis
for \(H_A\) and \(\{u_{j}^B\}\) is an orthonormal basis for \(H_B\), then the
set of pairs \((v_{i}^A, u_{j}^B)\) is taken to form an
orthonormal basis for the tensor product space \(H_A \otimes H_B\). The
notation \(v_i^A \otimes u_j^B\) is used
for the pair \((v_{i}^A,u_{j}^B)\), and inner product on \(H_A \otimes H_B\)
is defined as:^{[6]}

It is a result of this construction that although every vector in \(H_A \otimes H_B\) is a linear sum of vectors expressible in the form \(v^A \otimes u^B\), not every vector in the space is itself expressible in that form, and it turns out that

- any composite state defines uniquely the states of its components.
- if the states of \(A\) and \(B\) are pure (i.e., representable by vectors \(v^A\) and \(u^B\), respectively), then the state of \((A+B)\) is pure and represented by \(v^A \otimes u^B\), and
- if the state of \((A+B)\) is pure and expressible in the form \(v^A \otimes u^B\), then the states of \(A\) and \(B\) are pure, but
- if the states of \(A\) and \(B\) are not pure, i.e., if they are mixed states (these are defined below), they do not uniquely define the state of \((A+B)\); in particular, it may be a pure state not expressible in the form \(v^A \otimes u^B\).

### 2.2 Operators

An **operator** \(O\) is a mapping of a vector space onto
itself; it takes any vector \(\ket{B}\) in a space onto another
vector \(\ket{B'}\) also in
the space; \(O \ket{B} = \ket{B'}\). **Linear operators** are operators
that have the following properties:

- \(O(\ket{A} + \ket{B}) = O \ket{A} + O \ket{B}\), and
- \(O(c \ket{A}) = c(O \ket{A})\).

Just as any vector in an \(N\)-dimensional space can be represented by a column of \(N\) numbers, relative to a choice of basis for the space, any linear operator on the space can be represented in a column notation by \(N^2\) numbers:

\[O = \begin{bmatrix} O_{11} & O_{12} \\ O_{21} & O_{22} \end{bmatrix}\]where \(O_{ij} = \braket{A_i}{O \mid A_j}\) and the \(A_N\) are the basis vectors of the space. The effect of the linear operator \(O\) on the vector \(B\) is, then, given by

\[\begin{align} O \ket{B} &= \begin{bmatrix} O_{11} & O_{12} \\ O_{21} & O_{22} \end{bmatrix} \times \begin{bmatrix} b_1 \\ b_2 \end{bmatrix} \\ &= \begin{bmatrix} (O_{11}b_1 + O_{12}b_2) \\ (O_{21}b_1 + O_{22}b_2) \end{bmatrix} \\ &= (O_{11}b_1 + O_{12}b_2)|A_1\rangle + (O_{21}b_1 + O_{22}b_2|A_2\rangle \\ &=|B'\rangle \end{align}\]
Two more definitions before we can say what Hilbert spaces are, and
then we can turn to quantum mechanics. \(\ket{B}\) is an
**eigenvector** of \(O\) with
eigenvalue \(a\) if, and only if, \(O \ket{B} = a \ket{B}\).
Different operators can have different eigenvectors, but the
eigenvector/operator relation depends only on the operator and vectors
in question, and not on the particular basis in which they are
expressed; the eigenvector/operator relation is, that is to say,
invariant under change of basis. A **Hermitean operator**
is an operator which has the property that there is an orthonormal
basis consisting of its eigenvectors and those eigenvalues are all
real.

A **Hilbert space**, finally, is a vector space on
which an inner product is defined, and which is complete, i.e., which
is such that any Cauchy sequence of vectors in the space converges to a
vector in the space. All finite-dimensional inner product spaces are
complete, and I will restrict myself to these. The infinite case
involves some complications that are not fruitfully entered into at
this stage.

## 3. Quantum Mechanics

Four basic principles of quantum mechanics are:

- (3.1)
**Physical States.**Every physical system is associated with a Hilbert Space, every unit vector in the space corresponds to a possible pure state of the system, and every possible pure state, to some vector in the space.^{[7]}- (3.2)
**Physical Quantities.**Hermitian operators in the Hilbert space associated with a system represent physical quantities, and their eigenvalues represent the possible results of measurements of those quantities.There is an operator, called the Hamiltonian, that plays a special role in quantum theory because the dynamics of a system can be conveniently formulated by tracking its evolution. The Hamiltonian – written \(H\), or \(\hat{H}\) – stands for the total energy of the system. Its eigenvalues are the possible results that might be obtained in measurements of total energy. It is given by summing over the kinetic and potential energies of the system’s components.

- (3.3)
**Composition.**The Hilbert space associated with a complex system is the tensor product of those associated with the simple systems (in the standard, non-relativistic, theory: the individual particles) of which it is composed.- (3.4)
**Dynamics.**- a.
*Contexts of type 1*: Given the state of a system at \(t\) and the forces and constraints to which it is subject, there is an equation, ‘**Schrödinger’s equation**’, that gives the state at any other time \(U \ket{v_t} \rightarrow \ket{v_{t'}}\).^{[8]}The important properties of \(U\) for our purposes are that it is**deterministic**, which is to say that it takes the state of a system at one time into a unique state at any other, it is**unitary**, which means that it is an automorphism of the Hilbert space on which it acts (i.e., a mapping of that space onto itself that preserves the linear space structure and inner product), and it is**linear**, which is to say that if it takes a state \(\ket{A}\) onto the state \(\ket{A'}\), and it takes the state \(\ket{B}\) onto the state \(\ket{B'}\), then it takes any state of the form \(\alpha \ket{A} + \beta \ket{B}\) onto the state \(\alpha \ket{A'} + \beta \ket{B'}\).- b.

\[ \Pr(b_i) = |\braket{A}{B=b_i}|^2 \]*Contexts of type 2*(“Measurement Contexts”):^{[9]}Carrying out a “measurement” of an observable \(B\) on a system in a state \(\ket{A}\) has the effect of collapsing the system into a \(B\)-eigenstate corresponding to the eigenvalue observed. This is known as the**Collapse Postulate**. Which*particular*\(B\)-eigenstate it collapses into is a matter of probability, and the probabilities are given by a rule known as**Born’s Rule**:

There are two important points to note about these two kinds of contexts:

- The distinction between contexts of type 1 and 2 remains to be made out in quantum mechanical terms; nobody has managed to say in a completely satisfactory way, in the terms provided by the theory, which contexts are measurement contexts, and
- Even if the distinction is made out, it is an open interpretive
question whether there
*are*contexts of type 2; i.e., it is an open interpretive question whether there are any contexts in which systems are governed by a dynamical rule*other*than Schrödinger’s equation.

## 4. Structures on Hilbert Space

I remarked above that in the same way that all the information we have
about the relations between locations in a city is embodied in the
spatial relations between the points on a map which represent them, all
of the information that we have about the internal relations among (and
between) states and quantities in quantum mechanics is embodied in the
mathematical relations among the vectors and operators which represent
them.^{[10]}
From a mathematical point of view, what
really distinguishes quantum mechanics from its classical predecessors
is that states and quantities have a richer structure; they form
families with a more interesting network of relations among their
members.

All of the physically consequential features of the behaviors of quantum mechanical systems are consequences of mathematical properties of those relations, and the most important of them are easily summarized:

- (P1)
Any way of adding vectors in a Hilbert space or multiplying them by scalars will yield a vector that is also in the space. In the case that the vector is normalized, it will, from (3.1), represent a possible state of the system, and in the event that it is the sum of a pair of eigenvectors of an observable \(B\) with distinct eigenvalues, it will not itself be an eigenvector of \(B\), but will be associated, from (3.4b), with a set of probabilities for showing one or another result in \(B\)-measurements.

- (P2)
For any Hermitian operator on a Hilbert space, there are others, on the same space, with which it doesn’t share a full set of eigenvectors; indeed, it is easy to show that there are other such operators with which it has

*no*eigenvectors in common.

If we make a couple of additional interpretive assumptions, we can say more. Assume, for instance, that

- (4.1)
Every Hermitian operator on the Hilbert space associated with a system represents a distinct observable, and (hence) every normalized vector, a distinct state, and

- (4.2)
A system has a value for observable \(A\) if, and only if, the vector representing its state is an eigenstate of the \(A\)-operator. The value it has, in such a case, is just the eigenvalue associated with that eigenstate.

^{[11]}

It follows from (P2), by (3.1), that no quantum mechanical state is an
eigenstate of all observables (and indeed that there are observables
which have *no* eigenstates in common), and so, by (3.2), that
no quantum mechanical system ever has simultaneous values for all of
the quantities pertaining to it (and indeed that there are pairs of
quantities to which *no* state assigns simultaneous values).

There are Hermitian operators on the tensor product \(H_1 \otimes H_2\) of a pair of Hilbert spaces \(H_1\) and \(H_2\) ... In the event that \(H_1\) and \(H_2\) are the state spaces of systems \(S1\) and \(S2\), \(H_1 \otimes H_2\) is the state-space of the complex system \((S1+S2)\). It follows from this by (4.1) that there are observables pertaining to \((S1+S2)\) whose values are not determined by the values of observables pertaining to the two individually.

These are all straightforward consequences of taking vectors and operators in Hilbert space to represent, respectively, states and observables, and applying Born’s Rule (and later (4.1) and (4.2)), to give empirical meaning to state assignments. That much is perfectly well understood; the real difficulty in understanding quantum mechanics lies in coming to grips with their implications — physical, metaphysical, and epistemological.

Anyone trying to come to an understanding about what quantum mechanics
says about the world has to grapple with one remaining fact. This
problem is not an issue with Hilbert spaces, but of the dynamics
– the rules that describe the trajectories that systems follow
through the space. From a physical point of view, it is far more
worrisome than anything discussed to this point. It not only presents
difficulties to someone trying to provide an *interpretation*
of the theory, but also seems to point to a logical inconsistency in
the theory’s foundations.

Suppose that we have a system \(S\) and a device \(S^*\) which measures an
observable \(A\) on \(S\) with values \(\{a_1,
a_2, a_3, ...\}\). Then there is some
state of \(S^*\) (the ‘ground state’), and some observable \(B\)
with values \(\{b_1, b_2,
b_3, ...\}\) pertaining to \(S^*\) (its ‘pointer
observable’, so called because it is whatever plays the role of
the pointer on a dial on the front of a schematic measuring instrument
in registering the result of the experiment), which are such that, if
\(S^*\) is started in its ground state and interacts in an appropriate way
with \(S\), and if the value of \(A\) immediately before the interaction is
\(a_1\), then \(B\)’s value immediately thereafter is
\(b_1\). If, however, \(A\)’s value immediately before the
interaction is \(a_2\), then \(B\)’s value afterwards is
\(b_2\); if the value of \(A\) immediately before the
interaction is \(a_3\), then \(B\)’s value immediately after
is \(b_3\), and so on. That is just what it
*means* to say that \(S^*\) measures \(A\). So, if we represent the
joint, partial state of \(S\) and \(S^*\) (just the part of it which specifies
the value of [\(A\) on \(S\) & \(B\) on \(S^*\)], the observable whose values
correspond to joint assignments of values to the measured observable on
\(S\) and the pointer observable on \(S^*\)) by the vector
\(\ket{A=a_i}_s \ket{B=b_i}_{s^*}\), and let “\(\rightarrow\)”
stand in for the dynamical description of the interaction between
the two, to say that \(S^*\) is a measuring instrument for \(A\) is to say
that the dynamical laws entail that,

and so on.^{[12]}

Intuitively, \(S^*\) is a measuring instrument for an observable \(A\) just in
case there is some observable feature of \(S^*\) (it doesn’t matter what,
just something whose values can be ascertained by looking at the
device), which is correlated with the \(A\)-values of systems fed into it
in such a way that we can read those values off of \(S^*\)’s observable
state after the interaction. In philosophical parlance, \(S^*\) is a
measuring instrument for \(A\) just in case there is some observable
feature of \(S^*\) which *tracks* or *indicates* the \(A\)-values
of systems with which it interacts in an appropriate way.

Now, it follows from (3.1), above, that there are states of \(S\) (too many to count) which are not eigenstates of \(A\), and if we consider what Schrödinger’s equation tells us about the joint evolution of \(S\) and \(S^*\) when \(S\) is started out in one of these, we find that the state of the pair after interaction is a superposition of eigenstates of [\(A\) on \(S\) & \(B\) on \(S^*\)]. It doesn’t matter what observable on \(S\) is being measured, and it doesn’t matter what particular superposition \(S\) starts out in; when it is fed into a measuring instrument for that observable, if the interaction is correctly described by Schrödinger’s equation, it follows just from the linearity of the \(U\) in that equation, the operator that effects the transformation from the earlier to the later state of the pair, that the joint state of \(S\) and the apparatus after the interaction is a superposition of eigenstates of this observable on the joint system.

Suppose, for example, that we start \(S^*\) in its ground state, and \(S\) in the state

\[ \frac{1}{\sqrt{2}} \ket{A = a_1}_s + \frac{1}{\sqrt{2}} \ket{A=a_2}_s \]It is a consequence of the rules for obtaining the state-space of the composite system that the combined state of the pair is

\[ \frac{1}{\sqrt{2}} \ket{A=a_1}_s \ket{B=\text{ground state}}_{s^*} + \frac{1}{\sqrt{2}} \ket{A = a_2}_s \ket{B = \text{ground state}}_{s^*} \]and it follows from the fact that \(S^*\) is a measuring instrument for \(A\),
and the linearity of \(U\) that their combined state *after*
interaction, is

This, however, is inconsistent with the dynamical rule for contexts of
type 2, for the dynamical rule for contexts of type 2 (and if there are
any such contexts, *this* is one) entails that the state of the
pair after interaction is *either*

or

\[ \ket{A=a_2}_s \ket{B=b_2}_{s^*} \]Indeed, it entails that there is a precise probability of \(\frac{1}{2}\) that it will end up in the former, and a probability of \(\frac{1}{2}\) that it will end up in the latter.

We can try to restore logical consistency by giving up the dynamical
rule for contexts of type 2 (or, what amounts to the same thing, by
denying that there *are* any such contexts), but then we have
the problem of consistency with experience. For it was no mere blunder
that that rule was included in the theory; we *know* what a
system looks like when it is in an eigenstate of a given observable,
and we know *from looking* that the measuring apparatus after
measurement is in an eigenstate of the pointer observable. And so we
*know* from the outset that if a theory tells us something else
about the post-measurement states of measuring apparatuses, whatever
that something else is, it is wrong.

That, in a nutshell, is the Measurement Problem in quantum mechanics; any interpretation of the theory, any detailed story about what the world is like according to quantum mechanics, and in particular those bits of the world in which measurements are going on, has to grapple with it.

### Loose Ends

**Mixed states**are weighted sums of pure states, and they can be used to represent the states of ensembles whose components are in different pure states, or states of individual systems about which we have only partial knowledge. In the first case, the weight attached to a given pure state reflects the size of the component of the ensemble which is in that state (and hence the objective probability that an arbitrary member of the ensemble is); in the second case, they reflect the epistemic probability that the system in question to which the state is assigned is in that state.

If we don’t want to lose the distinction between pure and mixed
states, we need a way of representing the weighted sum of a set of pure
states (equivalently, of the probability functions associated with
them) that is different from adding the (suitably weighted) vectors
that represent them, and that means that we need either an alternative
way of representing mixed states, or a uniform way of representing both
pure and mixed states that preserves the distinction between them.
There is a kind of operator in Hilbert spaces, called a **density
operator**, that serves well in the latter capacity, and it
turns out not to be hard to restate everything that has been said about
state vectors in terms of density operators. So, even though it is
common to speak as though pure states are represented by vectors, the
official rule is that states – pure and mixed, alike – are
represented in quantum mechanics by density operators.

Although mixed states *can*, as I said, be used to represent
our ignorance of the states of systems that are actually in one or
another pure state, and although this has seemed to many to be an
adequate way of interpreting mixtures in classical contexts, there are
serious obstacles to applying it generally to quantum mechanical
mixtures. These are left for detailed discussion in the other entries
on quantum mechanics in the Encyclopedia.

Everything that has been said about observables, strictly speaking,
applies only to the case in which the values of the observable form a
discrete set; the mathematical niceties that are needed to generalize
it to the case of **continuous observables** are
complicated, and raise problems of a more technical nature. These, too,
are best left for detailed discussion.

This should be all the initial preparation one needs to
*approach* the philosophical discussion of quantum mechanics,
but it is only a first step. The more one learns about the
relationships among and between vectors and operators in Hilbert space,
about how the spaces of simple systems relate to those of complex ones,
and about the equation which describes how state-vectors move through
the space, the better will be one’s appreciation of both the nature and
the difficulty of the problems associated with the theory. The funny
backwards thing about quantum mechanics, the thing that makes it
endlessly absorbing to a philosopher, is that the more one learns, the
harder the problems get.

## Bibliography

### Books Useful For Beginners

Here are some recent books that will be especially useful to beginners.

- Travis Norsen, T., 2017,
*Foundations of Quantum Mechanics: An Exploration of the Physical Meaning of Quantum Theory*, Cham: Springer.This is a textbook for students who want to learn quantum mechanics, but learn it in a way that emphasizes physical clarity. The book covers topics of a standard introduction to quantum physics, but focuses attention on questions of ontology often glossed over in standard texts. The physics student who wants to learn quantum mechanics either as preparation for studying foundations or simply in a way that looks for clear answers to questions like ‘What are the basic objects in the quantum world?’, ‘What kinds of configurations can they assume?’, ‘How do they move and interact with one another?’ can do no better than starting here.

- Susskind, L. and Friedman, A., 2014,
*Quantum Mechanics: The Theoretical Minimum (2nd edition)*, New York: Basic Books.At 384 pages, this book isn’t as pithy as the title would suggest. It provides very clear presentation of the principles of quantum mechanics for the physics student without any previous background. This is how one would learn quantum mechanics in a standard university course.

### Quantum Mechanics Textbooks

There are a great many textbooks available for studying quantum mechanics. Here are a few especially important ones with some notes to guide choices among them. It is good to work with two or three texts when learning QM. No text is perfect and differences in approach can illuminate the subject from different angles.

- Ballentine, L., 1998,
*Quantum Mechanics: A Modern Approach*, Singapore: World Scientific Publishing Company.This book is not recommended for beginners, and not recommended as a textbook. It is recommended once one has some technical background to deepen understanding of the fundamental concepts of quantum mechanics.

- Basdevant, J.L., and J. Dalibard, 2005,
*Quantum Mechanics*, Berlin: Springer.This is a brief, but elegant introduction. There aren’t a great many problems, but detailed solutions are provided for those that are included. The book comes with a CD-ROM that is very helpful for visualization.

- Dirac, P.A.M., 1930 [1958],
*The Principles of Quantum Mechanics*, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1930; 4th edition, revised, 1958.This is a classic, beautiful book that remains one of the clearest presentations of quantum mechanics. Everything is presented with extreme simplicity using Dirac’s formulation with non-commutative algebra. Even a beginner will be able to follow the presentation. The book emphasizes logical structure, in Dirac’s words: “problems were tackled top-down, by working on the great principles, with the details left to look after themselves.”

- Cohen-Tannoudji, C., 2006,
*Quantum Mechanics*, New York: Wiley-Interscience.This is a comprehensive, encyclopedic text. It’s not the best to learn from, but is a good reference book.

- Gasiorowicz, S., 1995,
*Quantum Physics*(3rd edition), New York: Wiley.This is a decent text, relatively well-written.

- Griffiths, D., 1995 [2018],
*Introduction to Quantum Mechanics*(2nd edition), Upper Saddle River, NJ: Prentice Hall; 3rd edition, 2018.This is a standard undergraduate text for a first course in QM, and I would recommend it as a starting point for beginners. It is concise and very easy to read. There is an emphasis on conceptual development. Unfortunately, there are no worked examples in the book, and the answers to the problems are available only to instructors. It is easy to find and has recently been updated.

- Liboff, R., 1998,
*Introductory Quantum Mechanics*(4th edition), San Francisco: Addison-Wesley.This is a nicely designed book, relatively well-written. It is a good starting point for beginners, but not at comprehensive as Shankar.

- Merzbacher, E., 1997,
*Quantum Mechanics*(3rd edition), New York: Wiley.This is a standard graduate text in the US, not recommended for beginners, but quite good at an advanced level.

- Sakurai, J.J., 1993 [2021],
*Modern Quantum Mechanics*(revised edition), Reading, MA: Addison Wesley; third edition, with coauthor Jim Napolitano, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2021.This is generally used as a graduate text. It is well-written and there is emphasis on experimental phenomena and important questions like Bell’s Inequality. The material is introduced at a higher level than Griffiths and Shankar, with lots of mathematics. There is a wealth of problems, but unfortunately few solutions are provided, making it most useful in a classroom setting or in conjunction with a book that contains worked examples and derivations.

- Schwinger, J., 2003,
*Quantum Mechanics*(corrected edition), Berlin: Springer.This book is extremely mathematical in emphasis. There is less emphasis on conceptual development, and it is best used after one has acquired a conceptual understanding of QM and wants to see the mathematical development. The approach is very revealing. It is a difficult text, in part because some of the formalism is abstract and unconventional, but it is well worth the effort to comprehend. The problems throughout are excellent, but again unfortunately, solutions are not included in the text.

- Shankar, R., 1994,
*Principles of Quantum Mechanics*(2nd edition), Berlin: Springer.This book is highly recommended as a starting point. It starts from ground zero, developing the mathematical tools needed to understand quantum mechanics. It is well written, and friendlier than Griffiths for students who are learning the subject on their own. QM is not introduced until page 115. The introductory chapter on linear algebra is very good. At 676 pages, it is comprehensive. It covers Feynman path integrals more thoroughly than other books, and contains solved problems. If you buy one book on QM, this is a good choice.

- Zettili, N., 2009,
*Quantum Mechanics: Concepts and Applications*, Chichester: John Wiley & Sons, Ltd.This is a very good book as well. It covers theory and problem solving in an integrated way. It is easy to follow and full of problems and solutions that are related to the experimental basis of the theory.

### Useful General Texts in Mathematics and Physics

Whether studying quantum mechanics on one’s own, or in a classroom setting, it is useful to have these books on hand as accompaniments. Even a seasoned teacher will find himself from time to time reaching for them:

- Benenson, W., J. Harris, H. Stoecker, , and H. Lutz,
2006,
*Handbook of Physics*(2nd edition), Berlin: Springer. - Bronshtein, I.N., and K.A. Semendyayev,
2007,
*Handbook of Mathematics*(5th edition), Berlin: Springer. - Halliday, D., R. Resnick, and J. Walker, 2008,
*Fundamentals of Physics*(8th edition), Hoboken, NJ: Wiley. - Halmos, P., 1957,
*Introduction to Hilbert Space*(2nd edition), Providence: AMS Chelsea Publishing.

### Books on Philosophy of QM

The last three decades have been a golden age for studying foundations of quantum Mechanics. Most of the active research is published in journals. The discussion surrounding standard non-relativistic quantum mechanics has stabilized in a way that makes it possible to survey. Three recent books absorb and organize the work of these decades.

- Barrett, J., 2019,
*The Conceptual Foundations of Quantum Mechanics*, New York: Oxford University Press.This is a recent text on the history and conceptual foundations of quantum mechanics. It will serve an excellent primary text on the foundations of quantum mechanics for philosophy students, and will also make an excellent supplement to the standard quantum physics texts of physics students.

- Lewis, P., 2016,
*Quantum Ontology: A Guide to the Metaphysics of Quantum Mechanics*, New York: Oxford University Press.Lewis’s book gives a very good presentation of the most influential and well-developed interpretations of the formalism and provides an even-handed comparative assessment. It provides is an up-to-date survey of the landscape with sophisticated analysis and commentary. The book is well-suited for use in or for the layperson with a serious interest in foundations. The discussion is sophisticated without undue technicality and manages philosophical analysis in a jargon-free way.

- Maudlin, T., 2019,
*Philosophy of Physics: Quantum Theory*, Princeton: Princeton University Press.This is an excellent, if challenging introduction to quantum foundations. The book is unparalleled in clarity and uncompromising in its insistence on ontological intelligibility. It is more selective than Lewis and Barrett’s book (it covers Everettian Quantum Mechanics and Bohmian Mechanics and Spontaneous Collapse theories, but the Copenhagen approach is dismissed because it doesn’t have an explicit ontology). The author makes no bones about where his own sympathies lie, but it will reward the study of any beginning student or seasoned practitioner.

Here are some general texts to introduce you to the philosophy of QM.

- Albert, D., 1994,
*Quantum Mechanics and Experience*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Bell, J.S., 1987,
*Speakable and Unspeakable in Quantum Mechanics*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Busch, P., P. Lahti, and P. Mittelstaedt, 1991,
*The Quantum Theory of Measurement*, Berlin: Springer-Verlag. - Clifton, R.K. (ed.), 1996,
*Perspectives on Quantum Reality*, Dordrecht: Kluwer. - d’Espagnat, B., 1995,
*Veiled Reality*, Reading, MA: Addison-Wesley. - Hughes, R.I.G., 1989,
*Structure and Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Omnès, R., 1994,
*The Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics*, Princeton: Princeton University Press. - Primas, H., 1983,
*Quantum Mechanics, Chemistry and Reductionism*(2nd edition), Berlin: Springer. - Rae, A., 1986,
*Quantum Physics: Illusion or Reality?*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. - Redhead, M.L.G., 1989,
*Incompleteness, Nonlocality and Realism*, Oxford: Clarendon Press. - Squires, E., 1990,
*Conscious Mind in the Physical World*, Bristol, New York: Adam Hilger. - Whitaker, A., 1996,
*Einstein, Bohr and the Quantum Dilemma*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

More specialized readings include:

- Becker, A., 2018,
*What is Real? The Unfinished Quest for the Meaning of Quantum Mechanics*, New York: Basic Books.This is a retelling of the early history of quantum theory that describes how Bohr’s influence persuaded a generation of physicists that the demand for a clear account of quantum ontology was somehow inappropriate. The book is a gripping tale of a turbulent time in the history of physics, when personalities clashed as deeply as philosophical sympathies.

- Carroll, S., 2019,
*Something Deeply Hidden: Quantum Worlds and the Emergence of Spacetime*, New York: Dutton.This is a lively development and well-written defense of the Everettian viewpoint that looks beyond standard non-relativistic theory and argues that the real lesson of quantum conundra and their reconciliation of quantum mechanics with General Relativity is the recognition that space-time is not fundamental.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- Preskill, J., 1998, Quantum Computation (Lecture Notes for Physics 219, California Institute of Technology)