# Many-Worlds Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics

*First published Sun Mar 24, 2002; substantive revision Thu Aug 5, 2021*

The Many-Worlds Interpretation (MWI) of quantum mechanics holds that there are many worlds which exist in parallel at the same space and time as our own. The existence of the other worlds makes it possible to remove randomness and action at a distance from quantum theory and thus from all physics. The MWI provides a solution to the measurement problem of quantum mechanics.

- 1. Introduction
- 2. Definitions
- 3. Correspondence Between the Formalism and Our Experience
- 4. Probability in the MWI
- 5. Tests of the MWI
- 6. Objections to the MWI
- 7. Why the MWI?
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Introduction

The fundamental idea of the MWI, going back to Everett 1957, is that there are myriads of worlds in the Universe in addition to the world we are aware of. In particular, every time a quantum experiment with different possible outcomes is performed, all outcomes are obtained, each in a different newly created world, even if we are only aware of the world with the outcome we have seen. The reader can split the world right now using this interactive quantum world splitter. The creation of worlds takes place everywhere, not just in physics laboratories, for example, the explosion of a star during a supernova.

There are numerous variations and reinterpretations of the original Everett proposal, most of which are briefly discussed in the entry on Everett’s relative state formulation of quantum mechanics. Here, a particular approach to the MWI (which differs from the popular “actual splitting worlds” approach in De Witt 1970) will be presented in detail, followed by a discussion relevant for many variants of the MWI.

The MWI consists of two parts:

- A theory which yields the time evolution of the quantum state of the (single) Universe.
- A prescription which sets up a correspondence between the quantum state of the Universe and our experiences.

Part (i) states that the ontology of the universe is a quantum state, which evolves according to the Schrödinger equation or its relativistic generalization. It is a rigorous mathematical theory and is not problematic philosophically. Part (ii) involves “our experiences” which do not have a rigorous definition. An additional difficulty in setting up (ii) follows from the fact that human languages were developed at a time when people did not suspect the existence of parallel worlds.

The mathematical part of the MWI, (i), yields less than mathematical parts of some other theories such as Bohmian mechanics. The Schrödinger equation itself does not explain why we experience definite results in quantum measurements. In contrast, in Bohmian mechanics the mathematical part yields almost everything, and the analog of (ii) is very simple: it is the postulate according to which only the “Bohmian positions” (and not the quantum wave) correspond to our experience. The Bohmian positions of all particles yield the familiar picture of the (single) world we are aware of. The simplicity of part (ii) of Bohmian mechanics comes at the price of adding problematic physical features to part (i), e.g., the nonlocal dynamics of Bohmian trajectories.

## 2. Definitions

### 2.1 What is “A World”?

A world is the totality of macroscopic objects: stars, cities, people, grains of sand, etc. in a definite classically described state.

The concept of a “world” in the MWI belongs to part (ii) of the theory, i.e., it is not a rigorously defined mathematical entity, but a term defined by us (sentient beings) to describe our experience. When we refer to the “definite classically described state” of, say, a cat, it means that the position and the state (alive, dead, smiling, etc.) of the cat is specified according to our ability to distinguish between the alternatives, and that this specification corresponds to a classical picture, e.g., no superpositions of dead and alive cats are allowed in a single world.

Another concept, which is closer to Everett’s original proposal,
see Saunders 1995, is that of a relative, or perspectival world
defined for every physical system and every one of its states:
following Lewis 1986 we call it a *centered world*. This
concept is useful when a world is centered on a perceptual state of a
sentient being. In this world, all objects which the sentient being
perceives have definite states, but objects that are not under
observation might be in a superposition of different (classical)
states. The advantage of a centered world is that a quantum phenomenon
in a distant galaxy does not split it, while the advantage of the
definition presented here is that we can consider a world without
specifying a center; our usual language is just as useful for
describing worlds that existed at times when there were no sentient
beings.

The concept of a world in the MWI is based on the layman’s
conception of a world; however, several features are different.
Obviously, the definition of the world as *everything that
exists* does not hold in the MWI. “Everything that
exists” is the Universe, and there is only one Universe. The
Universe incorporates many worlds similar to the one the layman is
familiar with. A layman believes that our present world has a unique
past and future. According to the MWI, a world defined at some moment
of time corresponds to a unique world at a time in the past, but to a
multitude of worlds at a time in the future.

### 2.2 Who am I?

I am an object, such as the Earth, a cat, etc. “I” is defined at a particular time by a complete (classical) description of the state of my body and of my brain. “I” and “Lev” do not refer to the same things (even though my name is Lev). At the present moment there are many different “Lev”s in different worlds (not more than one in each world), but it is meaningless to say that now there is another “I”. I have a particular, well defined past: I correspond to a particular “Lev” in 2020, but not to a particular “Lev” in the future: I correspond to a multitude of “Lev”s in 2030. This correspondence is seen in my memory of a unique past: a “Lev” in 2021 shares memories with one particular “Lev” in 2020 but with multiple “Lev”s in 2030. In the framework of the MWI it is meaningless to ask: Which “Lev” in 2030 will I be? I will correspond to them all. Every time I perform a quantum experiment (with several outcomes) it only seems to me that a single definite result is obtained. Indeed, the “Lev” who obtains this particular result thinks this way. However, this “Lev” cannot be identified as the only “Lev” after the experiment. The “Lev” before the experiment corresponds to multiple “Lev”s who obtain all possible results.

Although this approach to the concept of personal identity seems somewhat unusual, it is plausible in the light of the critique of personal identity by Parfit 1986. Parfit considers some artificial situations in which a person splits into several copies, and argues that there is no good answer to the question: “Which copy is me?” He concludes that personal identity is not what matters when the observer divides. Saunders and Wallace 2008a argue that based on the semantics of Lewis 1986 one can find a meaning for this question. However, in their reply (Saunders and Wallace 2008b) to Tappenden 2008 they emphasise that their work is not about the nature of “I”, but about “serviceability”. Indeed, as it will be explained below, I should behave as if “Which copy is me?” is a legitimate question.

## 3. Correspondence Between the Formalism and Our Experience

We should not expect to have a detailed and complete explanation of
our experience in terms of the wave function of \(10^{33}\) particles
that we and our immediate environment are made of. We just have to be
able to draw a basic picture which is free of paradoxes. There are
many attempts to provide an explanation of what we see based on the
MWI or its variants in Lockwood 1989, Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990,
Albert 1992, Saunders 1993, Penrose 1994, Chalmers 1996, Deutsch 1996,
Joos *et al.* 2003, Schlosshauer 2007, Wallace 2012, Cunningham
2014, Vaidman 2016a, Zurek 2018, Vaidman 2019, and Tappenden 2019a. A
sketch of the connection between the wave function of the Universe and
our experience follows.

### 3.1 The Quantum State of a Macroscopic Object

The basis for the correspondence between the quantum state (the wave function) of the Universe and our experience is the description that physicists give in the framework of standard quantum theory for objects composed of elementary particles. Elementary particles of the same kind are identical (see the elaborate discussion in the entry on identity and individuality in quantum theory). The essence of an object is the (massively entangled) quantum state of its particles and not the particles themselves. One quantum state of a set of elementary particles might be a cat and another state of the same particles might be a small table. An object is a spatial pattern of such a quantum state. Clearly, we cannot now write down an exact wave function of a cat. We know, to a reasonable approximation, the wave function of the elementary particles that constitute a nucleon. The wave function of the electrons and the nucleons that together make up an atom is known with even better precision. The wave functions of molecules (i.e. the wave functions of the ions and electrons out of which molecules are built) are well studied. A lot is known about biological cells, and physicists are making progress in the quantum representation of biological systems Cao et. al 2020. Out of cells we construct various tissues and then the whole body of a cat or a table. So, let us denote the quantum state of a macroscopic object constructed in this way \(\ket{\Psi}_\object.\)

In our construction \(\ket{\Psi}_\object\) represents an object in a definite state and position. According to the definition of a world we have adopted, in each world the cat is in a definite state: either alive or dead. Schrödinger’s experiment with the cat leads to a splitting of worlds even before opening the box. Note that in the centered world approach, the superposed Schrödinger’s cat is a member of the single world of the observer before she opens the sealed box with the cat. The observer directly perceives the facts related to the experiment and deduces that the cat is in a superposition.

Formally, the quantum state of an object which consists of \(N\)
particles is defined in \(3N\) dimensional configuration space, see
Albert 1996, 2015. However, in order to understand our experience, it
is crucial to make a connection to \(3\) dimensional space, see Stoica
2019. We only experience objects defined in \(3D\)-space. The causes
of our experience are interactions, and in nature there are only local
interactions in three spatial dimensions. These interactions can be
expressed as couplings to some macroscopic variables of the object
described by quantum waves well localized in \(3D\)-space, which are
in a product with the relative variables state of the object (like
entangled electrons in atoms) and other parts of the object, see
Vaidman 2019 (Sec. 5.6). Another way to bridge between the wave
function of the object and our experience of that object is the
three-dimensional picture of the density of the wave function of
molecules of the macroscopic object which has the familiar geometrical
form of the object. Note that in some other interpretations of quantum
mechanics, similar densities are given additional ontological
significance (Allori *et al.* 2014.)

### 3.2 The Quantum State of a World

The wave function of all particles in the Universe corresponding to any particular world will be a product of the states of the sets of particles corresponding to all objects in the world multiplied by the quantum state \(\ket{\Phi}\) of all the particles that do not constitute “objects”. Within a world, “objects” have definite macroscopic states by fiat:

\[\tag{1} \ket{\Psi_\world} = \ket{\Psi}_{\object\ 1} \ket{\Psi}_{\object\ 2} \cdots \ket{\Psi}_{\object\ N} \ket{\Phi} \]The product state is only for variables which are relevant for the macroscopic description of the objects. There might be some entanglement between weakly coupled variables like nuclear spins belonging to different objects. In order to keep the form of the quantum state of the world (1), the quantum state of such variables should belong to \(\ket{\Phi}.\)

Consider a text-book description of quantum measurements based on the von Neumann 1955 approach according to which each quantum measurement ends up with the collapse of the wave function to the eigenstate of the measured variable. The quantum measurement device must be a macroscopic object with macroscopically different states corresponding to different outcomes. In this case, the MWI all-particles wave function corresponding to a world with a particular outcome is the same as in the von Neumann theory provided there is a collapse to the wave function with this outcome. The von Neumann 1955 analysis helps in understanding the correspondence between the wave function and our perception of the world. However, as Becker 2004 explains, the status of the wave function for von Neumann is not ontological as in the MWI described here, but epistemic: it summarises information about the results of measurements.

In most situations, only macroscopic objects are relevant to our experience. However, today’s technology has reached a point in which interference experiments are performed with single particles. In such situations a description of a world with states of only macroscopic objects, such as sources and detectors, is possible but cumbersome. Hence it is fruitful to add a description of some microscopic objects. Vaidman 2010 argues that the proper way to describe the relevant microscopic particles is by the two-state vector which consists of the usual, forward evolving state specified by the measurement in the past and a backward evolving state specified by the measurement in the future. Such a description provides a simple explanation of the weak trace the particles leave, Vaidman 2013.

### 3.3 The Quantum State of the Universe

The quantum state of the Universe (i.e. the Universal wave function) can be decomposed into a superposition of terms corresponding to different worlds:

\[\tag{2} \ket{\Psi_\universe} = \sum \alpha_i \ket{\Psi_{\world\ i}} \]Different worlds correspond to different classically described states of at least one object. Different classically described states correspond to orthogonal quantum states. Therefore, different worlds correspond to orthogonal states: all states \(\ket{\Psi_{\world\ i}}\) are mutually orthogonal and consequently, \(\sum \lvert\alpha_i\rvert^2 = 1\) (here we include as a “world” a situation in which there are no macroscopic objects).

### 3.4 FAPP

The construction of the quantum state of the Universe in terms of the
quantum states of objects presented above is only approximate; it is
good only *for all practical purposes* (FAPP). Indeed, the
concept of an object itself has no rigorous definition: should a mouse
that a cat just swallowed be considered as a part of the cat? The
concept of a “definite position” is also only
approximately defined: how far should a cat be displaced for it to be
considered to exist in a different position? If the displacement is
much smaller than the quantum uncertainty, it must be considered to
exist in the same place, because in this case the quantum state of the
cat is almost the same and the displacement is undetectable in
principle. But this is only an absolute bound, because our ability to
distinguish various locations of the cat is far from this quantum
limit. Furthermore, the state of an object (e.g. alive or dead) is
meaningful only if the object is considered for a period of time. In
our construction, however, the quantum state of an object is defined
at a particular time. In fact, we have to ensure that the quantum
state will have the shape of the object not only at that time, but for
some period of time. Splitting of the world during this period of time
is another source of ambiguity because there is no precise definition
of when the splitting occurs. The time of splitting corresponds to the
time of the collapse in the approach given by von Neumann 1955. He
provided a very extensive discussion showing that it does not matter
when exactly the collapse occurs, and this analysis shows also that it
does not matter when the splitting in the MWI occurs.

The reason that it is possible to propose only an approximate prescription for the correspondence between the quantum state of the Universe and our experience is essentially the same reason for the claim of Bell 1990 that “ordinary quantum mechanics is just fine FAPP”. The concepts we use: “object”, “measurement”, etc. are not rigorously defined. Bell and many others were looking (until now in vain) for a “precise quantum mechanics”. Since it is not enough for a physical theory to be just fine FAPP, a quantum mechanics needs rigorous foundations. The MWI has rigorous foundations for (i), the “physics part” of the theory; only part (ii), corresponding to our experience, is approximate (just fine FAPP). But “just fine FAPP” means that the theory explains our experience for any possible experiment, and this is the goal of (ii). See Wallace 2002, 2010a, 2012 for more arguments why a FAPP definition of a world is enough.

### 3.5 Preferred Basis

The mathematical structure of the theory (i) allows infinitely many ways to decompose the quantum state of the Universe into a superposition of orthogonal states. The basis for the decomposition into world states follows from the definition of a world composed of objects in definite positions and states (“definite” on the scale of our ability to distinguish them). In the alternative approach, the basis of a centered world is defined directly by an observer. Therefore, given the nature of the observer and her concepts for describing the world, the particular choice of the decomposition (2) follows (up to a precision which is good FAPP, as required). If we do not ask why we are what we are, and why the world we perceive is what it is, but only how we can explain relations between the events we observe in our world, then the problem of the preferred basis does not arise: we and the concepts of our world define the preferred basis.

But if we do ask why we are what we are, we can explain more. Looking
at the details of the physical world, the structure of the
Hamiltonian, the value of the Planck constant, etc., one can
understand why the sentient beings we know are of a particular type
and why they have their particular concepts for describing their
worlds. The main argument is that the locality of interactions yields
the *stability* of worlds in which objects are well localized. The
small value of the Planck constant allows macroscopic objects to be
well localized for a long period of time. Worlds corresponding to
localized quantum states \(\ket{\Psi_{\world\ i}}\) do not split for a
long enough time such that sentient beings can perceive the locations
of macroscopic objects. By contrast, a “world” obtained in
another decomposition, e.g., the “world +” which is
characterized by the relative phase of a superposition of states of
macroscopic objects being in macroscopically distinguishable states
\(A\) and \(B\), \(1/\sqrt{2}\,(\ket{\Psi_A} +
\ket{\Psi_B})\ket{\Phi},\) splits immediately, during a period of time
which is much smaller than the perception time of any feasible
sentient being, into two worlds: the new “world+” and the
“world\(-\)”:
\(1/\sqrt{2}\,(\ket{\Psi_A}-\ket{\Psi_B})\ket{\Phi'}.\) This is the
phenomenon of
decoherence
which has attracted enormous attention in recent years, e.g., Joos
*et al.* 2003, Zurek 2003, Schlosshauer 2007, Wallace 2012,
Riedel 2017, Schlosshauer 2019, Boge 2019, Saunders forthcoming-a also in the
“decoherent histories” framework of Gell-Mann and Hartle
1990, see Saunders 1995 and Riedel *et al.*2016.

### 3.6 The Measure of Existence

There are many worlds existing in parallel in the Universe. Although
all worlds are of the same physical size (this might not be true if we
take into account the quantum aspects of early cosmology), and in
every world sentient beings feel as “real” as in any other
world, there is a sense in which some worlds are larger than others.
Vaidman 1998 describes this property as the *measure of
existence* of a world.

There are two aspects of the measure of existence of a world. First,
it quantifies the ability of the world to interfere with other worlds
in a gedanken experiment, as expounded at the end of this section.
Second, the measure of existence is the basis for introducing an
*illusion of probability* in the MWI as described in the next
chapter. The measure of existence is the parallel of the probability
measure discussed in Everett 1957 and pictorially described in
Lockwood 1989 (p. 230).

Given the decomposition (2), the measure of existence of the world \(i\) is \(\mu_i = \lvert \alpha_i\rvert^2.\) It can also be expressed as the expectation value of \(\mathbf{P}_i\), the projection operator on the space of quantum states corresponding to the actual values of all physical variables describing the world \(i\):

\[\tag{3} \mu_i = \langle \Psi_\universe \mid \mathbf{P}_i \mid \Psi_\universe \rangle. \]Note, that although the measure of existence of a world is expressed using the quantum state of the Universe (2), the concept of measure of existence, as the concept of a world belongs to part (ii) of the MWI, the bridge to our experience.

“I” also have a measure of existence. It is the sum of the measures of existence of all different worlds in which I exist. Note that I do not directly experience the measure of my existence. I feel the same weight, see the same brightness, etc. irrespectively of how tiny my measure of existence might be.

My current measure of existence is relevant only for gedanken situations like Wigner’s friend Wigner 1961 (recently revived by Frauchiger and Renner 2018) which demonstrates the meaning of the measure of existence of a world as a measure of its ability to interfere with other worlds. If I am a friend of Wigner, a gedanken superpower who can perform interference experiments with macroscopic objects like people, and I perform an experiment with two outcomes A and B such that two worlds will be created with different measures of existence, say \(2\mu_{A}= \mu_{B}\), then there is a difference between Lev A and Lev B in how Wigner can affect their future through the interference of worlds. Both Lev A and Lev B consider performing a new experiment with the same device. Wigner can interfere the worlds in such a way that Lev A (the one with a smaller measure of existence) will not have the future with result A of the second experiment. However, Wigner cannot prevent the future result A from Lev B, see Vaidman 1998 (p. 256).

## 4. Probability in the MWI

The probability in the MWI cannot be introduced in a simple way as in quantum theory with collapse. However, even if there is no probability in the MWI, it is possible to explain our illusion of apparent probabilistic events. Due to the identity of the mathematical counterparts of worlds, we should not expect any difference between our experience in a particular world of the MWI and the experience in a single-world universe with collapse at every quantum measurement.

### 4.1 Probability from Uncertainty

The difficulty with the concept of probability in a deterministic
theory, such as the MWI, is that the only possible meaning for
probability is an *ignorance probability*, but there is no
relevant information that an observer who is going to perform a
quantum experiment is ignorant about. The quantum state of the
Universe at one time specifies the quantum state at all times. If I am
going to perform a quantum experiment with two possible outcomes such
that standard quantum mechanics predicts probability 1/3 for outcome A
and 2/3 for outcome B, then, according to the MWI, both the world with
outcome A and the world with outcome B will exist. It is senseless to
ask: “What is the probability that I will get A instead of
B?” because I will correspond to both “Lev”s: the
one who observes A and the other one who observes B.

To solve this difficulty, Albert and Loewer 1988 proposed the Many Minds interpretation (in which the different worlds are only in the minds of sentient beings). In addition to the quantum wave of the Universe, Albert and Loewer postulate that every sentient being has a continuum of minds. Whenever the quantum wave of the Universe develops into a superposition containing states of a sentient being corresponding to different perceptions, the minds of this sentient being evolve randomly and independently to mental states corresponding to these different states of perception (with probabilities equal to the quantum probabilities for these states). In particular, whenever a measurement is performed by an observer, the observer’s minds develop mental states that correspond to perceptions of the different outcomes, i.e. corresponding to the worlds A or B in our example. Since there is a continuum of minds, there will always be an infinity of minds in any sentient being and the procedure can continue indefinitely. This resolves the difficulty: each “I” corresponds to one mind and it ends up in a state corresponding to a world with a particular outcome. However, this solution comes at the price of introducing additional structure into the theory, including a genuinely random process.

Saunders 2010 claims to solve the problem without introducing additional structure into the theory. Working in the Heisenberg picture, he uses appropriate semantics and mereology according to which distinct worlds have no parts in common, not even at early times when the worlds are qualitatively identical. In the terminology of Lewis 1986 (p. 206) we have the divergence of worlds rather than overlap. Wilson 2013, 2020 develops this idea by introducing a framework called “indexicalism”, which involves a set of distinct diverging “parallel” worlds in which each observer is located in only one world and all propositions are construed as self-locating (indexical). In Wilson’s words, “indexicalism” allows us to vindicate treating the weights as a candidate objective probability measure. However, it is not clear how this program can succeed, see Marchildon 2015, Harding 2020, Tappenden 2019a. It is hard to identify diverging worlds in our experience and there is nothing in the mathematical formalism of standard quantum mechanics which can be a counterpart of diverging worlds, see also Kent 2010 (p. 345). In the next section, the measure of existence of worlds is related to subjective ignorance probability.

There are more proposals to deal with the issue of probability in the
MWI. Barrett 2017 argues that for a derivation of the Probability
Postulate it is necessary to add some assumptions to unitary
evolution. For example, Weissman 1999 has proposed a modification of
quantum theory with additional non-linear decoherence (and hence with
even more worlds than in the standard MWI) which can lead
asymptotically to worlds of equal mean measure for different outcomes.
Hanson 2003, 2006 proposed decoherence dynamics in which observers of
different worlds “mangle” each other such that an
approximate Born rule is obtained. Van Wesep 2006 used an algebraic
method for deriving the probability rule, whereas Buniy *et
al.* 2006 used the decoherent histories approach of Gell-Mann and
Hartle 1990. Waegell and McQueen 2020 considered probability based on
the ontology of `local worlds’ introduced by Waegell 2018, which
is a concept inspired by the approach of Deutsch and Hayden 2000.

### 4.2 Illusion of Probability from Post-Measurement Uncertainty

Vaidman 1998 introduced the ignorance probability of an agent in the
framework of the MWI in a situation of post-measurement
uncertainty, see also Tappenden 2011, Vaidman 2012, Tipler 2014,
2019b, Schwarz 2015. It seems senseless to ask: “What is the
probability that Lev in the world \(A\) will observe \(A\)?”
This probability is trivially equal to 1. The task is to define the
probability in such a way that we could reconstruct the prediction of
the standard approach, where the probability for \(A\) is 1/3. It is
indeed senseless to ask *you* what is the probability that Lev
in the world \(A\) will observe \(A\), but this might be a meaningful
question when addressed to Lev in the world of the outcome \(A\).
Under normal circumstances, the world \(A\) is created (i.e. measuring
devices and objects which interact with measuring devices become
localized according to the outcome \(A)\) before Lev is aware of the
result \(A\). Then, it is sensible to ask this Lev about his
probability of being in world \(A\). There is a definite outcome which
this Lev will see, but he is ignorant of this outcome at the time of
the question. In order to make this point vivid, Vaidman 1998 proposed
an experiment in which the experimenter is given a sleeping pill
before the experiment. Then, while asleep, he is moved to room \(A\)
or to room \(B\) depending on the results of the experiment. When the
experimenter has woken up (in one of the rooms), but before he has
opened his eyes, he is asked “In which room are you?”
Certainly, there is a matter of fact about which room he is in (he can
learn about it by opening his eyes), but he is ignorant about this
fact at the time of the question.

This construction provides the ignorance interpretation of probability, but the value of the probability has to be postulated:

**Probability Postulate**

An observer should set his subjective probability of the outcome of a
quantum experiment in proportion to the total measure of existence of
all worlds with that outcome.

This postulate (named the *Born-Vaidman rule* by Tappenden
2011) is a counterpart of the collapse postulate of the standard
quantum mechanics according to which, after a measurement, the quantum
state collapses to a particular branch with probability proportional
to its squared amplitude. (See the section on the measurement problem
in the entry on
philosophical issues in quantum theory.)
However, it differs in two aspects. First, it parallels only the
second part of the collapse postulate, the Born Rule, and second, it
is related only to part (ii) of the MWI, the connection to our
experience, and not to the mathematical part of the theory (i).

The question of the probability of obtaining A makes sense for Lev in
world A before he becomes aware of the outcome and for Lev in world B
before he becomes aware of the outcome. Both “Lev”s have
the same information on the basis of which they should give their
answer. According to the probability postulate they will give the
*same* answer: 1/3 (the relative measure of existence of the
world \(A)\). Since Lev before the measurement is associated with two
“Lev”s after the measurement who have identical ignorance
probability concepts for the outcome of the experiment, one can define
the probability of the outcome of the experiment to be performed as
the ignorance probability of the successors of Lev for being in a
world with a particular outcome.

The “sleeping pill” argument does not reduce the probability of an outcome of a quantum experiment to a familiar concept of probability in the classical context. The quantum situation is genuinely different. Since all outcomes of a quantum experiment are realized, there is no probability in the usual sense. Nevertheless, this construction explains the illusion of probability. It leads believers in the MWI to behave according to the following principle:

**Behavior Principle**

We care about all our successive worlds in proportion to their
measures of existence.

With this principle our behavior should be similar to the behavior of a believer in the collapse theory who cares about possible future worlds in proportion to the probability of their occurrence.

The important part of the Probability Postulate is the supervenience of subjective probability on the measure of existence. Given this supervenience, the proportionality follows naturally from the following argument. By the assumption, if after a quantum measurement all the worlds have equal measures of existence, the probability of a particular outcome is simply proportional to the number of worlds with this outcome. The measures of existence of worlds are, in general, not equal, but the experimenters in all the worlds can perform additional specially tailored auxiliary measurements of some variables such that all the new worlds will have equal measures of existence. The experimenters should be completely indifferent to the results of these auxiliary measurements: their only purpose is to split the worlds into “equal-weight” worlds. Then, the additivity of the measure of existence yields the Probability Postulate.

There are many other arguments (apart from the empirical evidence)
supporting the Probability Postulate. Gleason’s 1957 theorem
about the uniqueness of the probability measure uses a natural
principle that the probability of an outcome is independent of splitting
into parallel worlds. Tappenden 2000, 2017 adopts a different semantics
according to which “I” live in all branches and have
“distinct experiences” in different
“superslices”. He uses “weight of a
superslice” instead of “measure of existence” and argues that it
is intelligible to associate probabilities according to the
Probability Postulate. Exploiting a variety of ideas in decoherence
theory such as the relational theory of tense and theories of identity
over time, Saunders 1998 argues for the “identification of
probability with the Hilbert Space norm” (which equals the
measure of existence). Page 2003 promotes an approach named
*Mindless Sensationalism*. The basic concept in this approach
is a conscious experience. He assigns *weights* to different
experiences depending on the quantum state of the universe, as the
expectation values of presently-unknown positive operators
corresponding to the experiences (similar to the measures of existence
of the corresponding worlds). Page writes “…
experiences with greater weights exist in some sense more
…” (2003, 479). In all of these approaches, the postulate is
introduced through an analogy with treatments of time, e.g., the
measure of existence of a world is analogous to the duration of a
time interval. Note also Greaves 2004 who advocates the
“Behavior Principle” on the basis of the
decision-theoretic reflection principle related to the next
section.

### 4.3 Probability Postulate from Symmetry Arguments

In an ambitious work Deutsch 1999 claimed to derive the Probability
Postulate from the quantum formalism and classical decision theory. In
Deutsch’s argument the notion of probability is operationalised
by being reduced to an agent’s betting preferences. So an agent
who is indifferent between receiving $20 on those branches where spin
“up” is observed and receiving $10 on all branches *by
definition* is deemed to give probability 1/2 to the spin-up
branches. Deutsch then attempts, using some symmetry arguments, to
prove that the only rationally coherent strategy for an agent is to
assign these operationalised “probabilities” to equal the
quantum-mechanical branch weights. Wallace 2003, 2007, 2010b, 2012
developed this approach by making explicit the tacit assumptions in
Deutsch’s argument. In the most recent version of these proofs,
the central assumptions are (i) the symmetry structure of unitary
quantum mechanics; (ii) that an agent’s preferences are
consistent across time; (iii) that an agent is indifferent to the
fine-grained branching structure of the world per se. Early criticisms
of the Deutsch-Wallace approach focussed on circularity concerns
(Barnum *et al.* 2000, Baker 2007, Hemmo and Pitowsky 2007). As
the program led to more explicit proofs, criticism turned to the
decision-theoretic assumptions being made Lewis 2010, Albert 2010,
Kent 2010, Price 2010). The analysis of the Deutsch-Wallace program
continues in a flurry of (mostly critical) papers Adlam 2014, Dawid
and Thébault 2014, Dawid and Thébault 2015,
Dizadji-Bahmani 2015, Jansson 2016, Read 2018, Mandolesi 2018,
Mandolesi 2019, Araujo 2019, Brown and Ben Porath 2020, Saunders
forthcoming-b.

Zurek 2005 offers a new twist to the Born rule derivation based on the permutation symmetry of states corresponding to worlds with equal measures of existence. He considered entangled systems and relies on “envariance” symmetry: a unitary evolution of a system which can be undone by the unitary evolution of the system it is entangled with. Zurek assumes that a manipulation of the second system does not change the probability of the measurement on the first system. The swap of the states of the system swaps the probabilities of the outcomes, because the outcomes are correlated with the other systems, where nothing has been changed. Since the swaps of the two systems lead to the original state, the probabilities should be unchanged, but they have swapped, so they must be equal.

Sebens and Carroll 2018 provided a proof of the Probability Postulate based on symmetry considerations in the framework of the self-location uncertainty of Vaidman 1998. However Kent 2015 and McQueen and Vaidman 2019 argued that their proof fails because it starts with a meaningless question. The proof considers a situation as in a sleeping pill experiment presented above: I was asleep during a quantum measurement, but unlike the original proposal, there was not any change in my state. I was not moved to different rooms according to the results of the experiment. Still, the question is asked: What is the probability for me to be in a world with a particular outcome? Whether that question can be meaningfully asked depends on whether I have branched. The critics argue that, although there are separate worlds, I have not yet branched and thus the question is not meaningful (at this stage, I am in both worlds). The Sebens and Carroll proof might get off the ground if the program of diverging worlds Saunders 2010, forthcoming-b succeeds. Note also that Dawid and Friederich 2020 criticise Sebens and Carroll 2018 on other grounds.

Vaidman 2012 uses symmetry to derive the Probability Postulate in another way. He starts from a situation which is symmetric in all relevant respects, so all outcomes must have equal probability. To derive the postulate, he assumes relativistic causality which tells us that the probability of an outcome of a measurement in one location cannot be affected by spatially remote manipulations, see McQueen and Vaidman 2019. Vaidman 2020 stresses, however, that relativistic causality of the evolution of the wave function of the Universe is not enough. In addition, we have to postulate the relativistic causality of the subjective experience of an observer within his world.

## 5. Tests of the MWI

It has frequently been claimed, e.g. by De Witt 1970, that the MWI is
in principle indistinguishable from the ideal collapse theory. This is
not so. The collapse leads to effects that do not exist if the MWI is
the correct theory. To observe the collapse we would need a super
technology which allows for the “undoing” of a quantum
experiment, including a reversal of the detection process by
macroscopic devices. See Lockwood 1989 (p. 223), Vaidman 1998 (p.
257), and other proposals in Deutsch 1986. These proposals are all for
gedanken experiments that cannot be performed with current or any
foreseeable future technology. Indeed, in these experiments an
interference of different worlds has to be observed. Worlds are
different when at least one macroscopic object is in macroscopically
distinguishable states. Thus, what is needed is an interference
experiment with a macroscopic body. Today there are interference
experiments with larger and larger objects (e.g., molecules with 2000
atoms, see Fein *et al.* 2019), but these objects are still not
large enough to be considered “macroscopic”. Such
experiments can only refine the constraints on the boundary where the
collapse might take place. A decisive experiment should involve the
interference of states which differ in a macroscopic number of degrees
of freedom: an impossible task for today’s technology. It can be
argued, see for example Parrochia 2020, that the burden of an
experimental proof lies with the opponents of the MWI, because it is
they who claim that there is a new physics beyond the well-tested
Schrödinger equation. As the analysis of Schlosshauer 2006 shows,
we have no such evidence.

The MWI is wrong if there is a physical process of collapse of the
wave function of the Universe to a single-world quantum state. Some
ingenious proposals for such a process have been made (see Pearle 1986
and the entry on
collapse theories).
These proposals (and Weissman’s 1999 non-linear decoherence
idea) have additional observable effects, such as a tiny energy
non-conservation, that were tested in several experiments, e.g.
Collett* et al.* 1995, Diosi 2015. The effects were not found
and some (but not all!) of these models have been ruled out, see
Vinante *et al.* 2020.

Much of the experimental evidence for quantum mechanics is statistical in nature. Greaves and Myrvold 2010 argued that our experimental data from quantum experiments supports the Probability Postulate of the MWI no less than it supports the Born rule in other approaches to quantum mechanics (see, however, Kent 2010, Albert 2010, and Price 2010 for some criticisms). Barrett and Huttegger 2020 argue that “even an ideal observer under ideal epistemic conditions may never have any empirical evidence whatsoever for believing that the results of one’s quantum-mechanical experiments are randomly determined”. Thus, statistical analysis of quantum experiments should not help us testing the MWI, but we might mention speculative cosmological arguments in support of the MWI by Page 1999, Kragh 2009, Aguirre and Tegmark 2011, and Tipler 2012.

## 6. Objections to the MWI

Some of the objections to the MWI follow from misinterpretations due
to the multitude of various MWIs. The terminology of the MWI can be
confusing: “world” is “universe” in Deutsch
1996, while “universe” is “multiverse”. There
are two very different approaches with the same name “The
Many-Minds Interpretation (MMI)”. The MMI of Albert and Loewer
1988 mentioned above should not be confused with the MMI of Lockwood
*et al.* 1996 (which resembles the approach of Zeh 1981).
Further, the MWI in the Heisenberg representation, Deutsch 2002,
differs significantly from the MWI presented in the Schrödinger
representation (used here). The MWI presented here is very close to
Everett’s original proposal, but in the entry on
Everett’s relative state formulation of quantum mechanics,
as well as in his book, Barrett 1999, uses the name “MWI”
for the splitting worlds view publicized by De Witt 1970. This
approach has been justly criticized: it has both some kind of collapse
(an irreversible splitting of worlds in a preferred basis) and the
multitude of worlds. Now we consider some objections in detail.

### 6.1 Ockham’s Razor

It seems that the preponderance of opposition to the MWI comes from the introduction of a very large number of worlds that we do not see: this looks like an extreme violation of Ockham’s principle: “Entities are not to be multiplied beyond necessity”. However, in judging physical theories one could reasonably argue that one should not multiply physical laws beyond necessity either (such a version of Ockham’s Razor has been applied in the past), and in this respect the MWI is the most economical theory. Indeed, it has all the laws of the standard quantum theory, but without the collapse postulate, which is the most problematic of the physical laws. The MWI is also more economical than Bohmian mechanics, which has in addition the ontology of the particle trajectories and the laws which give their evolution. Tipler 1986a (p. 208) has presented an effective analogy with the criticism of Copernican theory on the grounds of Ockham’s razor.

One might also consider a possible philosophical advantage of the plurality of worlds in the MWI, similar to that claimed by realists about possible worlds, such as Lewis 1986 (see the discussion of the analogy between the MWI and Lewis’s theory by Skyrms 1976 and Wilson 2020). However, the analogy is not complete: Lewis’ theory considers all logically possible worlds, far more than all the worlds that are incorporated in the quantum state of the Universe.

### 6.2 The Problem of Preferred Basis

A common criticism of the MWI stems from the fact that the formalism of quantum theory allows infinitely many ways to decompose the quantum state of the Universe into a superposition of orthogonal states. The question arises: “Why choose the particular decomposition (2) and not any other?” Since other decompositions might lead to a very different picture, the whole construction seems to lack predictive power.

The locality of physical interactions defines the preferred basis. As described in Section 3.5, only localized states of macroscopic objects are stable. And indeed, due to the extensive research on decoherence, the problem of preferred basis is not considered as a serious objection anymore, see Wallace 2010a. Singling out position as a preferred variable for solving the preferred basis problem might be considered as a weakness, but on the other hand, it is implausible that out of a mathematical theory of vectors in Hilbert space one can derive what our world should be. We have to add some ingredients to our theory and adding locality, the property of all known physical interactions, seems to be very natural (in fact, it plays a crucial role in all interpretations). Hemmo and Shenker 2020 also argued that something has to be added to the Hilbert space structure, but viewed the addition of a locality of interaction postulate as the reason that Ockham’s razor does not cut in favour of the MWI. Note, that taking position as a preferred variable is not an ontological claim here, in contrast to the options discussed in the next section.

### 6.3 The Wave Function is not Enough

As mentioned above, the gap between the mathematical formalism of the
MWI, namely the wave function of the Universe, and our experience is
larger than in other interpretations. This is the reason why many
thought that the ontology of the wave function is not enough. Bell
1987 (p.201) felt that either the wave function is not everything, or
it is not right. He was looking for a theory with local
“beables”. Many followed Bell in search of a
“primitive ontology” in 3+1 space-time, see Allori *et
al.* 2014.

A particular reason why the wave function of the Universe cannot be
the whole ontology lies in the argument, led by Maudlin 2010, that
this is the wrong type of object. The wave function of the Universe
(considered to have N particles) is defined in 3N dimensional
configuration space, while we need an entity in 3+1 space-time (like
the primitive ontology), see discussion by Albert 1996, Lewis 2004,
Monton 2006, Ney 2021. Addition of “primitive ontology” to
the wave function of the Universe helps us understand our experience,
but complicates the mathematical part of the theory. In the framework
of the MWI, it is not necessary. The expectation values of the density
of each particle in space-time, which is the concept derived from the
wave functions corresponding to different worlds, can play the role of
“primitive ontology”. Since interactions between particles
are local in space, this is what is needed for finding causal
connections ending at our experience. The density of particles is
gauge independent and also properly transforms between different
Lorentz observers such that they all agree upon their experiences. In
particular, the explanation of our experience is unaffected by the
“narratability failure” problem of Albert 2013: the wave
function description might be different for different Lorentz frames,
but the description in terms of densities of particles is the same.
Note also an alternative approach based on 3+1 space-time by Wallace
and Timpson 2010 who, being dissatisfied with the wave function
ontology, introduced the formulation of * Spacetime State
Realism*. Recently more works appeared on this subject: Ney and
Albert 2013, Myrvold 2015, Gao 2017, Lombardi *et al.* 2019,
Maudlin 2019, Chen 2019, Carroll and Singh 2019. These works show
significant difficulties in obtaining our world as emergent from the
Universal wave function. This explains the skeptical tone of
Everett’s relative-state formulation of quantum mechanics.
But, as discussed in Sec.3, the success of the
“emergence” program is not crucial: it is enough to find
the counterpart of the world we experience in the Universal wave
function.

### 6.4 Derivation of the Probability Postulate

A popular criticism of the MWI in the past, see Belinfante 1975, which was repeated by Putnam 2005, is based on the naive derivation of the probability of an outcome of a quantum experiment as being proportional to the number of worlds with this outcome. Such a derivation leads to the wrong predictions, but accepting the idea of probability being proportional to the measure of existence of a world resolves this problem. Although this involves adding a postulate, we do not complicate the mathematical part (i) of the theory since we do not change the ontology, namely, the wave function. It is a postulate belonging to part (ii), the connection to our experience, and it is a very natural postulate: differences in the mathematical descriptions of worlds are manifest in our experience, see Saunders 1998.

Another criticism related to probability follows from the claim,
apparently made by Everett himself and later by many other proponents
of the MWI, see De Witt 1970, that the Probability Postulate can be
* derived * just from the formalism of the MWI. Unfortunately,
the criticism of this derivation (which might well be correct) is
considered to be a criticism of the MWI, see Kent 1990. The recent
revival of this claim involving decision theory, Deutsch 1999, 2012,
and some other symmetry arguments Zurek 2005, Sebens and Carroll 2018
also encountered strong criticisms (see Section 4.3) which might be
perceived as criticisms of the MWI itself. Whereas the MWI may have no
advantage over other interpretations insofar as the derivation of the
Born rule is concerned, Papineau 2010 argues that it also has no
disadvantages.

The issue, named by Wallace 2003 as the “incoherence” probability problem, is arguably the most serious difficulty. How can one talk about probability when all possible outcomes happen? This led Saunders and Wallace 2008a to introduce uncertainty to the MWI, see recent analysis in Saunders forthcoming-b. However, Section 4.2 shows how one can explain the illusion of probability of an observer in a world, while the Universe incorporating all the worlds remains deterministic, see also Vaidman 2014. Albert 2010, 2015 argue that Vaidman’s probability appears too late. Vaidman 2012 and McQueen and Vaidman 2019 answer Albert by viewing the probability as the value of a rational bet on a particular result. The results of the betting of the experimenter are relevant for his successors emerging in different worlds after performing the experiment. Since the experimenter is related to all of his successors and they all have identical rational strategies for betting, then this should also be the strategy of the experimenter before the experiment.

### 6.5 Social Behavior of a Believer in the MWI

There are claims that a believer in the MWI will behave in an irrational way. One claim is based on the naive argument described in the previous section: a believer who assigns equal probabilities to all different worlds will make equal bets for the outcomes of quantum experiments that have unequal probabilities.

Another claim, Lewis 2000, is related to the strategy of a believer in
the MWI who is offered to play a *quantum Russian roulette*
game. The argument is that I, who would not accept an offer to play a
classical Russian roulette game, should agree to play the roulette any
number of times if the triggering occurs according to the outcome of a
quantum experiment. Indeed, at the end, there will be one world in
which Lev is a multi-millionaire and in all other worlds there will be
no Lev Vaidman alive. Thus, in the future, Lev will be a rich and
presumably happy man.

However, adopting the Probability Postulate leads all believers in the
MWI to behave according to the Behavior Principle and with this
principle our behavior is similar to the behavior of a believer in the
collapse theory who cares about possible future worlds according to
the probability of their occurrence. I should not agree to play
quantum Russian roulette because the measure of existence of worlds
with Lev dead will be much larger than the measure of existence of the
worlds with a rich and alive Lev. This approach also resolves the
puzzle which Wilson 2017 raises concerning *The Quantum Doomsday
Argument*.

Although in most situations the Behavior Principle makes the MWI believer act in the usual way, there are some situations in which a belief in the MWI might cause a change in behaviour. Assume that I am forced to play a game of Russian roulette and given a choice between classical or quantum roulette. If my subjective preference is to ensure the existence of Lev in the future, I should choose a quantum version. However, if I am terribly afraid of dying, I should choose classical roulette which gives me some chance not to die.

Albrecht and Phillips 2014 claim that even a toss of a regular coin splits the world, so there is no need for a quantum splitter, supporting a common view that the splitting of worlds happens very often. Surely, there are many splitting events: every Geiger counter or single-photon detector splits the world, but the frequency of splitting outside a physics laboratory is a complicated physics question. Not every situation leads to a multitude of worlds: this would contradict our ability to predict how our world will look in the near future.

## 7. Why the MWI?

For proponents of the MWI, the main reason for adopting it is that it avoids the collapse of the quantum wave. (Other no-collapse theories are not better than MWI for various reasons, e.g., the nonlocality of Bohmian mechanics, see Brown and Wallace 2005; and the disadvantage of all of them is that they have some additional structure, see Vaidman 2014). The collapse postulate is a physical law that differs from all known physics in two aspects: it is genuinely random and it involves some kind of action at a distance. Note that action at a distance due to collapse is a controversial issue, see the discussion in Vaidman 2016b and Myrvold 2016. According to the collapse postulate the outcome of a quantum experiment is not determined by the initial conditions of the Universe prior to the experiment: only the probabilities are governed by the initial state. There is no experimental evidence in favor of collapse and against the MWI. We need not assume that Nature plays dice: science has stronger explanatory power. The MWI is a deterministic theory for a physical Universe and it explains why a world appears to be indeterministic for human observers.

The MWI does not have action at a distance. The most celebrated example of nonlocality of quantum mechanics given by Bell’s theorem in the context of the Einstein-Podolsky-Rosen argument cannot get off the ground in the framework of the MWI because it requires a single outcome of a quantum experiment, see the discussion in Bacciagaluppi 2002, Brown and Timpson 2016. Although the MWI removes the most bothersome aspect of nonlocality, action at a distance, the other aspect of quantum nonlocality, the nonseparability of remote objects manifested in entanglement, is still there. A “world” is a nonlocal concept. This explains why we observe nonlocal correlations in a particular world.

Deutsch 2012 claims to provide an alternative vindication of quantum
locality using a quantum information framework. This approach started
with Deutsch and Hayden 2000 analyzing the flow of quantum information
using the Heisenberg picture. After discussions by Rubin 2001 and
Deutsch 2002, Hewitt-Horsman and Vedral 2007 analyzed the uniqueness
of the physical picture of the information flow. Timpson 2005 and
Wallace and Timpson 2007 questioned the locality demonstration in this
approach and the meaning of the locality claim was clarified in
Deutsch 2012. Rubin 2011 suggested that this approach might provide a
simpler route toward generalization of the MWI of quantum mechanics to
the MWI of field theory. Recent works Raymond-Robichaud 2020, Kuypers
and Deutsch 2021, Bédard 2021a, clarified the meaning of the
Deutsch and Hayden proposal as an alternative local MWI which not only
lacks action at a distance, but provides a set of local descriptions
which completely describes the whole physical Universe. However, there
is a complexity price. Bédard 2021b argues that * “the
descriptor of a single qubit has larger dimensionality than the
Schrödinger state of the whole network or of the
Universe!”*

The MWI resolves most, if not all, paradoxes of quantum mechanics
(e.g., Schrödinger’s cat), see Vaidman 1994, McQueen and Vaidman
2020. A physical paradox is a phenomenon contradicting our intuition.
The laws of physics govern the Universe incorporating all the worlds
and this is why, when we limit ourselves to a single world, we may run
into a paradox. An example is getting information about a region from
where no particle ever came using the *interaction-free
measurement* of Elitzur and Vaidman 1993. Indeed, on the scale of
the Universe there is no paradox: in other worlds particles were in
that region.

Vaidman 2001 finds it advantageous to think about all worlds together
even in analysing a controversial issue of classical probability
theory, the
Sleeping Beauty problem.
Accepting the Probability Postulate reduces the analysis of
probability to a calculation of the measures of existence of various
worlds. Note, however, that the Quantum Sleeping Beauty problem also
became a topic of a hot controversy: Lewis 2007, Papineau and
Durà-Vilà 2009, Groisman *et al.* 2013, Bradley
2011, Wilson 2014, Schwarz 2015.

Strong proponents of the MWI can be found among cosmologists, e.g., Tipler 1986b, Aguirre and Tegmark 2011. In quantum cosmology the MWI allows for discussion of the whole Universe, thereby avoiding the difficulty of the standard interpretation which requires an external observer, see Susskind 2016 for more analysis of the connections between the MWI and cosmology. Bousso and Susskind 2012 argued that even considerations in the framework of string theory lead to the MWI.

Another community where many favor the MWI is that of the researchers in quantum information. In quantum computing, the key issue is the parallel processing performed on the same computer; this is very similar to the basic picture of the MWI. Recently the usefulness of the MWI for explaining the speedup of quantum computation has been questioned: Steane 2003, Duwell 2007, Cuffaro 2012, forthcoming. It is not that the quantum computation cannot be understood without the framework of the MWI; rather, it is just easier to think about quantum algorithms as parallel computations performed in parallel worlds, Deutsch and Jozsa 1992. There is no way to use all the information obtained in all parallel computations — the quantum computer algorithm is a method in which the outcomes of all calculations interfere, yielding the desired result. The cluster-state quantum computer also performs parallel computations, although it is harder to see how we get the final result. The criticism follows from identifying the computational worlds with decoherent worlds. A quantum computing process has no decoherence and the preferred basis is chosen to be the computational basis.

Recent studies suggest that some of the fathers of quantum mechanics
held views close to the MWI: Allori *et al.* 2011 say this
about Schrödinger, and Becker 2004 about von Neumann. At the
birth of the MWI Wheeler 1957 wrote: “No escape seems possible
from this relative state formulation if one wants to have a complete
mathematical model for the quantum mechanics …” Since then,
the MWI struggled against the
Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics,
see Byrne 2010, Barrett and Byrne 2012, gaining legitimacy in recent
years Deutsch 1996, Bevers 2011, Barrett 2011, Tegmark 2014, Susskind
2016, Zurek 2018 and Brown 2020 in spite of the very diverse opinions
in the talks of its 50th anniversary celebration: Oxford 2007,
Perimeter 2007, Saunders *et al.* 2010.

Berenstain 2020 argues that the MWI is the latest example of successive scientific revolutions which forced humans to abandon the prejudice that they occupy a privileged position at the center of the Universe. The heliocentric model of the Solar System, Darwinian evolution and the Special Theory of Relativity follow this pattern. The MWI offers metaphysical neutrality between the perspectives of observers on different branches of the Universal wave function, as opposed to single-world theories which give a privileged perspective on reality to one observer.

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### Preprints

- Cuffaro, M. E., forthcoming, ‘The Philosophy of
Quantum Computing’, in E. Miranda (ed.),
*Quantum Computing in the Arts and Humanities: An Introduction to Core Concepts, Theory and Applications*, Dordrecht: Springer, [Cuffaro forthcoming preprint]. - Parrochia, D., 2020, ‘Are there Really Many Worlds in the “Many-Worlds Interpretation” of Quantum Mechanics?”, [Parrochia 2020 preprint].
- Saunders, S., forthcoming-a, ‘The Everett Interpretation:
Structure’,
*The Routledge Companion to the Philosophy of Physics*, E. Knox and A. Wilson (eds.), London: Routledge, [Saunders forthcoming-a preprint]. - –––, forthcoming-b, ‘The Everett Interpretation:
Probability’,
*The Routledge Companion to the Philosophy of Physics*, E. Knox and A. Wilson (eds.), London: Routledge, [Saunders forthcoming-b reprint].

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### Acknowledgments

I thank Michael Ridley for his work on the new edition of this entry. I am grateful to everybody who has borne with me through endless discussions of the MWI via email, Zoom (and face-to-face in pandemic-free parallel worlds). I acknowledge partial support by grant 2064/19 of the Israel Science Foundation.