Identity and Individuality in Quantum Theory

First published Tue Feb 15, 2000; substantive revision Wed Oct 30, 2019

What are the metaphysical implications of quantum physics? One way of approaching this question is to consider the impact of the theory on our understanding of objects as individuals with well defined identity conditions. According to the ‘Received View’, which was elaborated as the quantum revolution was taking place, quantum theory implies that the fundamental particles of physics cannot be regarded as individual objects in this sense. Such a view has motivated the development of non-standard formal systems which are appropriate for representing non-individual objects. However, it has also been argued that quantum physics is in fact compatible with a metaphysics of individual objects, but that such objects are indistinguishable in a sense which leads to the violation of Leibniz’s famous Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles. This last claim has also been contested opening up a further way of understanding the individuality of quantum entities. As a result, we are faced with a form of underdetermination of the relevant metaphysics by the physics, in which we have, on the one hand, quantum objects-as-individuals and, on the other, quantum objects-as-non-individuals. It has been argued that this underdetermination of such fundamental metaphysical ‘packages’ has important implications for the realism-antirealism debate.

1. Introduction

It is typically held that chairs, trees, rocks, people and many of the so-called ‘everyday’ objects we encounter can be regarded as individuals. The issue, then, is how this individuality is to be understood, or what constitutes the ‘principle’ of individuality. This is an issue which has a very long history in philosophy. A number of approaches to it can be broadly delineated.

We might begin by noting that a tree and rock, say, can be distinguished in terms of their different properties. We might then go further and insist that this also forms the basis for ascribing individuality to them. Even two apparently very similar objects, such as two coins of the same denomination or so-called identical twins, will display some differences in their properties – a scratch here, a scar there, and so on. On this account such differences are sufficient to both distinguish and individuate the objects. This undergirds the so-called ‘bundle’ view of objects, according to which an object is nothing but a bundle of properties. In order to guarantee individuation, no two objects can then be absolutely indistinguishable, or indiscernible, in the sense of possessing exactly the same set of properties. This last claim has been expressed as the Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles and it ensures the individuality of the objects that fall under its scope; we shall return to it below.

However, this approach has been criticised on the grounds (among others) that we can surely conceive of two absolutely indistinguishable objects: thinking of Star Trek, we could imagine a replicator device which precisely reproduces an object, such as a coin or even a person, giving two such objects exactly the same set of properties. Not quite, one might respond, since these two objects do not and indeed cannot exist at the same place at the same time; that is, they do not possess the same spatio-temporal properties. In terms of these properties, then, the objects can still be distinguished and hence regarded as different individuals. Clearly, then, this approach to the issue of individuality must be underpinned by the assumption that individual objects are impenetrable.

A more thorough-going criticism of this property based approach to individuality insists that it conflates epistemological issues concerning how we distinguish objects, with ontological issues concerning the metaphysical basis of individuality. Thus, it is argued, to talk of distinguishability requires at least two objects but we can imagine a universe in which there exists only one. In such a situation, it is claimed, it would be inappropriate to say that the object is distinguishable but not that it is an individual. Although we do not actually find ourselves in such situations, of course, still, it is insisted, distinguishability and individuality should be kept conceptually distinct.

If this line of argument is accepted, then the principle of individuality must be sought in something over and above the properties of an object. One candidate is the notion of substance, in which properties are taken to inhere in some way. Locke famously described substance as a ‘something, we know not what’, since to describe it we would have to talk of its properties, but bare substance, by its very nature, has no properties itself.

Alternatively, the individuality of an object has been expressed in terms of its ‘haecceity’ or ‘primitive thisness’ (Adams 1979). As the name suggests, this is taken to be the primitive basis of individuality, which cannot be analysed further. However, it has also been identified with the notion of self-identity, understood as a relational property (Adams ibid.) and expressed more formally as ‘a=a’. Each individual is understood to be identical to itself. This may seem like a form of the property-based approach we started with, but self-identity is a rather peculiar kind of property. As we’ll see, denying that quantum objects are self-identical may be one way of capturing the idea that they are non-individuals.

This is just a sketch of some of the various positions that have been adopted. There has been considerable debate over which of them applies to the everyday objects mentioned above. But at least it is generally agreed that such objects should be regarded as individuals to begin with. What about the fundamental objects posited by current physical theories, such as electrons, protons, neutrons etc.? Can these be regarded as individuals? One response is that they cannot, since they behave very differently in aggregates from ‘classical’ individuals.

2. Quantum Non-Individuality

The argument for the above conclusion – that the fundamental objects of physics cannot be regarded as individuals – can be summed up as follows: First of all, both ‘classical’ and ‘quantal’ objects of the same kind (e.g. electrons) can be regarded as indistinguishable in the sense of possessing the same intrinsic properties, such as rest mass, charge, spin etc. Consider now the distribution of two such indistinguishable particles over two boxes, or two states in general:

two boxes side by side, two circles in the first box (1)

two boxes side by side, two circles in the second box (2)

two boxes side by side, one circle in each box (3)


In classical physics, (3) is given a weight of twice that of (1) or (2), corresponding to the two ways the former can be achieved by permuting the particles. This gives us four combinations or complexions in total and hence we can conclude that the probability of finding one particle in each state, for example, is 1/2. (Note that it is assumed that none of the four combinations is regarded as privileged in any way, so each is just as likely to occur.) This is an example of the well-known ‘Maxwell-Boltzmann’ statistics to which, it is claimed, thermodynamics was reduced at the turn of the twentieth century.

In quantum statistical mechanics, however, we have two ‘standard’ forms: one for which there are three possible arrangements in the above situation (both particles in one box, both particles in the other, and one in each box), giving ‘Bose-Einstein’ statistics; and one for which there is only one arrangement (one particle in each box), giving ‘Fermi-Dirac’ statistics (which underpins the Pauli Exclusion Principle and all that entails). Setting aside the differences between these two kinds of quantum statistics, the important point for the present discussion is that in the quantum case, a permutation of the particles is not regarded as giving rise to a new arrangement. This result lies at the very heart of quantum physics; putting things slightly more formally, it is expressed by the so-called ‘Indistinguishability Postulate’:

If a particle permutation P is applied to any state function for an assembly of particles, then there is no way of distinguishing the resulting permuted state function from the original unpermuted one by means of any observation at any time.

(The state function of quantum mechanics determines the probability of measurement results. Hence what the Indistinguishability Postulate expresses is that a particle permutation does not lead to any difference in the probabilities for measurement outcomes.)

The argument then continues as follows: that a permutation of the particles is counted as giving a different arrangement in classical statistical mechanics implies that, although they are indistinguishable, such particles can be regarded as individuals (indeed, Boltzmann himself made this explicit in the first axiom of his ‘Lectures on Mechanics’, couched in terms of the impenetrability assumption noted above). Since this individuality resides in something over and above the intrinsic properties of the particles in terms of which they can be regarded as indistinguishable, it has been called ‘Transcendental Individuality’ by Post (1963). This notion can be cashed out in various well-known ways, as indicated in the Introduction above: in terms of some kind of underlying Lockean substance, for example, or in terms of primitive thisness. More generally, one might approach it in modal fashion, through the doctrine of haecceitism: this asserts that two possible worlds may describe some individual in qualitatively the same way (that is, as possessing the same set of properties), yet represent that individual differently by ascribing a different haecceity or thisness in each world, or more generally, by ascribing some non-qualitative aspect to the individual (Lewis 1986; Huggett 1999a).

Conversely, it is argued, if such permutations are not counted in quantum statistics, it follows that quantum objects cannot be regarded as individuals in any of these senses (Post 1963). In other words, they are very different from most everyday objects in that they are ‘non-individuals’, in some sense.

This radical metaphysical conclusion can be traced back to the reflections of Born and Heisenberg themselves and was further elaborated in the very earliest discussions of the foundations of quantum physics. As Weyl put it in his classic text on group theory and quantum mechanics:

… the possibility that one of the identical twins Mike and Ike is in the quantum state E1 and the other in the quantum state E2 does not include two differentiable cases which are permuted on permuting Mike and Ike; it is impossible for either of these individuals to retain his identity so that one of them will always be able to say ‘I’m Mike’ and the other ‘I’m Ike.’ Even in principle one cannot demand an alibi of an electron! (Weyl 1931)

Recalling the discussion sketched in the Introduction, if we were to create a twin using some kind of Star trek replicator, say, then in the classical domain such a twin could insist that ‘I’m here and she’s there’ or, more generally, ‘I’m in this state and she’s in that one’ and ‘swapping us over makes a difference’. In the classical domain each (indistinguishable) twin has a metaphysical ‘alibi’ grounded in their individuality. Weyl’s point is that in quantum mechanics, they do not.

3. Quantum Individuality

This conclusion – that quantal objects are not individuals – is not the whole story, however. First of all, the contrast between classical and quantum physics with regard to individuality and non-individuality is not as straightforward as it might seem. As already indicated, the above account involving permutations of particles in boxes appears to fit nicely with an understanding of individuality in terms of Lockean substance or primitive thisness. However, one can give an alternative field-theoretic account in which particles are represented as dichotomic ‘Yes/No’ fields: with such a field, the field amplitude is simply ‘Yes’ at location x if the ‘particle’ is present at x and ‘No’ if it is not (Redhead 1983). On this account, individuality is conferred via spatio-temporal location together with the assumption of impenetrability mentioned in the Introduction. Thus the above account of particle individuality in terms of either Lockean substance or primitive thisness is not necessary for classical statistical mechanics.

The particles-and-boxes picture above corresponds to the physicists’ multidimensional ‘phase space’, which describes which individuals have which properties, whereas the field- theoretic representation corresponds to ‘distribution space’, which simply describes which properties are instantiated in what numbers. Huggett has pointed out that the former supports haecceitism, whereas the latter does not and, furthermore, that the empirical evidence provides no basis for choosing between these two spaces (Huggett 1999a). Thus the claim that classical statistical mechanics is wedded to haecceitism also becomes suspect.

Secondly, the above argument from permutations can be considered from a radically different perspective. In the classical case the situations with one particle in each box are given a weight of ‘2’ in the counting of possible arrangements. In the case of quantum statistics this situation is given a weight of ‘1’. With this weighting, there are two possible statistics, as we noted: Bose-Einstein, corresponding to a symmetric state function for the assembly of particles and Fermi-Dirac, corresponding to an anti-symmetric state function. Given the Indistinguishability Postulate, it can be shown that symmetric state functions will always remain symmetric and anti-symmetric always anti-symmetric. Thus, if the initial condition is imposed that the state of the system is either symmetric or anti-symmetric, then only one of the two possibilities – Bose-Einstein or Fermi-Dirac – is ever available to the system, and this explains why the weighting assigned to ‘one particle in each state’ is half the classical value. This gives us an alternative way of understanding the difference between classical and quantum statistics, not in terms of the lack of individuality of the objects, but rather in terms of which states are accessible to them (French 1989). In other words, the implication of the different ‘counting’ in quantum statistics can be understood as not that the objects are non-individuals in some sense, but that there are different sets of states available to them, compared to the classical case. On this view, the objects can still be regarded as individuals, with the issue remaining as to how that individuality is to be cashed out.

Both of these perspectives raise interesting and distinct metaphysical issues (for a useful introduction see Castellani 1998b). Let us consider, first, the objects-as-individuals ‘package’. How is the relevant notion of individuality to be articulated? One option would be to take one of the traditional lines and ground it some form of primitive thisness or Lockean substance. However, this kind of metaphysics is anathema to many of a naturalistic persuasion, not least because it lies beyond the physical pale, as it were. Alternatively, one might take individuality to be primitive but then assuage any naturalistic tendencies by tying it to the idea of ‘countability’ – in the sense that we can always count how many quantum objects are in a given state – and take the latter to be both physically significant and capable of being ‘read off’ from the theory (Dorato and Morganti 2013). Nevertheless, it may be felt that naturalism is better satisfied by eschewing such primitivist moves and taking the individuality of the objects to be reducible to their discernibility and ground the latter in their properties, as presented by the theory (a feeling that may be further supported by doubts as to the physical plausibility of possible worlds containing only one object, as mentioned above). Of course, for this to work, we need some assurance that no two objects are indiscernible (or indistinguishable) in the relevant sense. Traditionally this assurance has been provided by Leibniz’s famous Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, so let us consider the status of this Principle in the context of modern physics.

4. Quantum Physics and the Identity of Indiscernibles

Now, of course, both quantum and classical objects of the same kind – such as electrons, say – are indistinguishable in the sense that they possess all intrinsic properties – charge, spin, rest mass etc. – in common. However, quantum objects are indistinguishable in a much stronger sense in that it is not just that two or more electrons possess the same intrinsic properties but that – on the standard understanding – no measurement whatsoever could in principle determine which one is which. If the non-intrinsic, state-dependent properties are identified with all the monadic or relational properties which can be expressed in terms of physical magnitudes standardly associated with self-adjoint operators that can be defined for the objects, then it can be shown that two bosons or two fermions in a joint symmetric or anti-symmetric state respectively have the same monadic properties and the same relational properties one to another (French and Redhead 1988; see also Butterfield 1993). This has immediate implications for the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles which, expressed crudely, insists that two things which are indiscernible, must be, in fact, identical.

Setting aside the historical issue of Leibniz’s own attitude towards his Principle (see, for example, Rodriguez-Pereyra 2014), supporters of it have tended to retreat from the claim that it is necessary and have adopted the alternative view that it is at least contingently true (in the face of apparent counter-examples such as possible worlds containing just two indistinguishable spheres). There is the further issue as to how the Principle should be characterised and, in particular, there is the question of what properties are to be included within the scope of those relevant to judgments of indiscernibility. Excluding the property of self-identity (which, again, we’ll come back to below), three forms of the Principle can be broadly distinguished according to the properties involved: the weakest form, PII(1), states that it is not possible for two individuals to possess all properties and relations in common; the next strongest, PII(2), excludes spatio-temporal properties from this description; and the strongest form, PII(3), includes only monadic, non-relational properties. Thus, for example, PII(3) is the claim that no two individuals can possess all the same monadic properties (a strong claim indeed, although it is one way of understanding Leibniz’s own view).

In fact, PII(2) and PII(3) are clearly violated in classical physics, where distinct particles of the same kind are typically regarded as indistinguishable in the sense of possessing all intrinsic properties in common and such properties are regarded as non-relational in general and non-spatio-temporal in particular. (Of course, Leibniz himself would not have been perturbed by this result, since he took the Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles to ultimately apply only to ‘monads’, which were the fundamental entities of his ontology. Physical objects such as particles were regarded by him as merely ‘well founded phenomena’.) However, PII(1) is not violated classically, since classical statistical mechanics typically assumes that such particles are impenetrable, in precisely the sense that their spatio-temporal trajectories cannot overlap. Hence they can be individuated via their spatio-temporal properties, as indicated above.

The situation appears to be very different in quantum mechanics, however. If the particles are taken to possess both their intrinsic and state-dependent properties in common, as suggested above, then there is a sense in which even the weakest form of the Principle, PII(1), fails (Cortes 1976; Teller 1983; French and Redhead 1988; for an alternative view, see van Fraassen 1985 and 1991). On this understanding, the Principle of Identity of Indiscernibles is actually false. Hence it cannot be used to effectively guarantee individuation via the state-dependent properties by analogy with the classical case. If one wishes to maintain that quantum particles are individuals, then their individuality will have to be taken as conferred by Lockean substance, primitive thisness or, in general, some form of non-qualitative haecceistic difference.

However, this conclusion has been challenged. First of all, it has been questioned whether quantum particles can be said to possess the relevant state-dependent properties in the sense that would be damaging to PII (Massimi 2001; see also Mittelstaedt and Castellani 2000). However, this argument only applies to monadic, state-dependent properties and so the above conclusion still holds for PII(2) and PII(3). In effect, what has been shown is that those versions of PII which allow relations to individuate are not the weakest forms of the Principle, but the only forms which are applicable.

This shift to relations as individuating elements has led to the development of a form of PII, based on Quine’s suggestions about discernibility, which allows objects to be ‘weakly’ discernible in relational terms (Saunders 2003a and 2006; for a useful overview see Bigaj 2015a). Consider for example, two fermions in a spherically-symmetric singlet state. The fermions are not only indistinguishable in the above sense but also possess exactly the same set of spatio-temporal properties and relations. However, each enters into the symmetric but irreflexive relation of ‘having opposite direction of each component of spin to …’ on the basis of which they can be said to be ‘weakly discernible’ (for general discussions of different kinds of discernibility see Caulton and Butterfield 2012a; Bigaj 2014; Ketland 2011; Ladyman, Linnebo and Pettigrew 2012). If we extend PII to incorporate such relations, the Principle can, it seems, be made compatible with quantum physics and the individuality of the fermions can be grounded in these irreflexive relations, without having to appeal to anything like primitive thisness. This result has also been extended to bosons (Muller and Saunders 2008; Muller and Seevinck 2009), although some of the details are contentious, in particular with regard to the interpretation of some of the mathematical features that are appealed to in this account (see Bigaj 2015a and 2015b; Caulton 2013; Huggett and Norton 2014; Norton 2015). In addition to such technical issues, there is the further philosophical concern that the appeal to irreflexive relations in order to ground the individuality of the objects which bear such relations involves a circularity: in order to appeal to such relations, one has had to already individuate the particles which are so related and the numerical diversity of the particles has been presupposed by the relation which hence cannot account for it (see French and Krause 2006; Hawley 2006 and 2009). One response to this worry would be to question the underlying assumption that relata must have the relevant ontological priority over relations and adopt some form of structuralist view of objects according to which the relata are eliminable in terms of relations (perhaps ‘emerging’, in some sense as ‘intersections’ of them) or, more mildly perhaps, argue that neither are accorded priority but come as a ‘package’ as it were (for further discussion see French 2014). It has been suggested, for example, that this whole discussion of weak discernibility reveals a category of entity that has received little attention so far, namely that of ‘relationals’: objects that can be discerned by means of relations only (Muller 2011, 2015). I shall return to the structuralist perspective below (but for an alternative, ‘coherentist’ account, see Calosi and Morganti 2018). More generally, however, it has been argued that this whole debate is orthogonal to that over the status of PII since what weak discernibility grounds is merely numerical distinctness, rather than the robust sense of discernibility that PII was originally concerned with (Ladyman and Bigaj 2010). The latter involves some sense of difference over and above numerical distinctness but weakly discernible relations such as ‘having opposite direction of each component of spin to …’ do not provide this. Hence, it is claimed, PII remains violated by quantum mechanics (although see Friebe 2014 where the principle is defended in the context of a specific understanding of quantum entanglement).

The above considerations are typically presented within the ‘orthodox’ interpretation of quantum mechanics but there are a further set of responses which step outside of this. Thus van Fraassen, for example (van Fraassen 1985 and 1991) has advocated a form of ‘modal’ interpretation, in the context of which (standard) PII can be retained. At the core of this approach lies a distinction between two kinds of state: the ‘value’ state, which is specified by stating which observables have values and what they are; and the ‘dynamic’ state, which is specified by stating how the system will develop both if isolated and if acted upon in some definite fashion. The evolution of the latter is deterministic, in accordance with Schroedinger’s equation, but the value state changes unpredictably, within the limits set by the dynamic state (for criticism see some of the papers in Dieks and Vermaas 1998). Because the actual values of observables do not increase predictive power if added to the relevant dynamic state description, they are deemed to be ‘empirically superfluous’. In the case of fermions, at least, distinct value states can be assigned to each particle and PII saved.

However concerns have been raised over the objectivity of such value state attributions (Massimi op. cit., p. 318, fn. 11) and one might regard the associated ‘empirically superfluous’ properties as merely conceptual. This bears again on the important issue of what kinds of properties may be admitted to lie within the scope of the Principle. Clearly some would appear to be beyond the pale: saving PII by regarding the particle labels themselves as intrinsic properties is surely unacceptable. Furthermore, bosons must be treated differently, since they can have the same dynamic and value states. In this case, van Fraassen suggests that each boson is individuated by its history, where this is again to be understood as ‘empirically superfluous’. Of course, it might seem odd that an approach which originally sought to avoid the grounding of the individuality of objects in something like Lockean substance should find itself having to include empirically superfluous factors within the scope of PII.

Another ‘unorthodox’ approach incorporates the Bohmian interpretation of quantum mechanics and in particular it has been suggested that it might form the basis of an alternative conception of particle individuality in terms of their spatio-temporal trajectories. As is well known, attributing distinguishing spatio-temporal trajectories to quantum objects faces acute difficulties under the orthodox interpretation of quantum mechanics. On the Bohm interpretation, however, they are allowed; indeed, the only observable admitted is that of position. What this interpretation gives us is a dual ontology of point particles plus `pilot’ wave, where the role of the latter is to determine the instantaneous velocities of the former through the so-called ‘guidance equations’. These ‘complete’ the standard formulation of quantum mechanics so that, in addition to the quantum state, whose development is determined by the Schrödinger equation, there is also a set of single-particle trajectories, each of which is determined by the guidance equation, plus the initial positions of the particles (for a review see Cushing et al. 1996). Such an interpretation appears to provide a natural home for the metaphysical package which takes quantum objects to be individuals (see, for example, Brown et al. 1999) and, indeed, a form of PII(1) can now be defended against the above conclusion.

Nevertheless, things are not quite as straightforward as they might seem: it has been argued that intrinsic properties cannot be considered as possessed solely by the objects but in some sense must be assigned to the pilot wave as well (Brown et al.1994). Thus, again, there is an ontological cost involved in retaining this view of objects as individuals.

What if one were to consider the evolution of the system concerned in the multi-dimensional ‘configuration space’ in terms of which the wave function must be described? Here the implications of considering particle permutations are encoded in the topology of such a space by identifying points corresponding to such a permutation and thereby constructing what is known as the ‘reduced configuration space’ formed by the action of the permutation group on the full configuration space. As in the case of ‘ordinary’ space-time, some form of ‘impenetrability assumption’ must be adopted to ensure that – in the case of those particles that are not bosons at least – no two particles occupy the same point of this reduced space.Here Bohmian mechanics offers some advantage: it turns out that the guidance equations ensure the non-coincidence of the relevant particle trajectories (Brown et al. 1999). In effect ‘impenetrability’ is built into the dynamics and thus the configuration space approach and de Broglie-Bohm interpretation fit nicely together.

Returning to the core point, one can maintain that quantum objects are individuals, even granted the implications of quantum statistics. And one can either take that individuality to be ungrounded and ‘primitive’ or ground it in some form of primitive thisness or, more plausibly for many, in the associated properties via an updated and extended form of PII (criticisms and concerns notwithstanding). However, there is also the alternative, articulated during the throes of the quantum revolution itself, as noted above, which is to take quantum objects to be non-individuals in some sense. Of course, if this alternative metaphysical ‘package’ is adopted then Leibniz’s Principle simply does not apply. But now the obvious question arises: what sense can we make of this notion of ‘non-individuality’?

5. Non-individuality and self-identity

Let us recall Weyl’s statement that one can’t ask alibis of electrons. Dalla Chiara and Toraldo di Francia refer to quantum physics as ‘the land of anonymity’, in the sense that, on this view, the objects cannot be uniquely labelled (1993 and 1995). They ask, then, how can we talk about what happens in such a land? Their suggestion is that quantum objects can be regarded as ‘intensional-like entities’, where the intensions are represented by conjunctions of intrinsic properties. The extension of the natural kind, ‘electron’, say, is then given by the collection of indistinguishable elements, or a ‘quaset’. The theory of such quasets then gives the possibility of a semantics for quantum objects without alibis (ibid.).

Alternatively, but relatedly, non-individuality can be understood in terms of the denial of self-identity. This suggestion can be found most prominently in the philosophical reflections of Born, Schrödinger, Hesse and Post (Born 1943; Schrödinger 1952; Hesse 1963; Post 1963). It is immediately and clearly problematic, however: how can we have objects that are not identical to themselves? Such self-identity seems bound up with the very notion of objecthood in the sense that it is an essential part of what it is to be that object (thus it has been suggested that non-individuality might be better understood in terms of the loss of patio-temporal trajectories in quantum physics; see Arenhart, Bueno and Krause 2019). This intuition is summed up in the Quinean slogan, ‘no entity without identity’ (Quine 1969), with all its attendant consequences regarding reference etc.

However, Barcan Marcus has offered an alternative perspective, insisting on ‘No identity without entity.’ (Marcus 1993) and arguing that although ‘… all terms may “refer” to objects… not all objects are things, where a thing is at least that about which it is appropriate to assert the identity relation.’ (ibid., p. 25) Object-reference then becomes a wider notion than thing-reference. Within such a framework, we can then begin to get a formal grip on the notion of objects which are not self-identical through so-called ‘Schrödinger logics’, introduced by da Costa (da Costa and Krause 1994) These are many-sorted logics in which the expression x = y is not a well-formed formula in general; it is where x and y are one sort of term, but not for the other sort corresponding to quantum objects. A semantics for such logics can be given in terms of ‘quasi-sets’ (da Costa and Krause 1997). The motivation behind such developments is the idea that collections of quantum objects cannot be considered as sets in the usual Cantorian sense of ‘… collections into a whole of definite, distinct objects of our intuition or of our thought.’ (Cantor 1955, p. 85). Quasi-set theory incorporates two kinds of basic posits or ‘Urelemente’: m-atoms, whose intended interpretation are the quantal objects and M-atoms, which stand for the ‘everyday’ objects, and which fall within the remit of classical set theory with Ur-elements. Quasi-sets are then the collections obtained by applying the usual Zermelo-Fraenkel framework plus Ur-element ZFU-like axioms to a basic domain composed of m-atoms, M-atoms and aggregates of them (Krause 1992; for a comparison of qua-set theory with quasi-set theory, see Dalla Chiara, Giuntini and Krause 1998).

These developments supply the beginnings of a categorial framework for quantum ‘non- individuality’ which, it is claimed, helps to articulate this notion and, bluntly, make it philosophically respectable (extensive details are given in French and Krause 2006; see also Arenhart 2012; Domenach and Holik 2007; Domenach, Holik and Krause, 2008; Krause 2010). Crucially, within this formal framework, a sense of countability is retained in that collections of quantum entities possess a (kind of) cardinality but not an ordinality, so we can, in effect, say how many objects there are, even though we cannot place them in numerical order. Critical discussions of both these formal details and of the basis for attributing ‘non-individuality’ to quantum objects can be found in Bueno et. al. 2011 and Sant’ Anna 2019. Much of this criticism has proceeded on the basis of insisting that we do not need to adopt such an apparently radical approach. Thus advocates of ‘weak discernibility’, discussed above, have argued that this notion yields an appropriately naturalist sense of individuality, suitable for quantum physics, whereas Dorato and Morganti (2013) insist, as already noted, that one can retain countability, and individuality, as primitive notions and that this is to be preferred over any shift to non-individuality (for a response to the latter and defence of the above formal framework, see Arenhart and Krause 2014). Jantzen on the other hand, has argued that identity and cardinality are tied together as a ‘matter of meaning’ rather than metaphysics and that, consequently, talk of entities without identity is either meaningless or, in fact, talk about something else altogether (Jantzen 2019). Likewise Bueno has insisted that identity is too fundamental to be given up so readily and suggests that we can infer the non-individuality of quantum particles directly from their indistinguishability with identity itself understood as a ‘useful idealization’ that simplifies our conceptual framework and allows us to predict the behaviour of the relevant objects – in this case quantal entities (Bueno 2014; for responses see Arenhart 2017a and Krause and Arenhart 2019).

Both the framework of quasi-set theory and the underlying metaphysics have been extended into the foundations of Quantum Field Theory, where it has been argued, one has non-individual ‘quanta’ (Teller 1995). A form of quasi-set theory may provide one way of formally capturing this notion (French and Krause 2006; for concerns about such a move see Sant’ Anna 2019). It has also been suggested that this offers a way of understanding the sense in which quantum objects may be regarded as vague (French and Krause 2003), although it has been questioned whether vagueness is the appropriate notion here (Darby 2010) and also whether quasi-set theory offers the most perspicuous way of capturing this sense (Smith 2008). Finally, for those who are leery of quasi-sets and their attendant formal apparatus, there is also the option of returning to Weyl’s original insight, which underpins the quote above, and appropriating his idea of an ‘aggregate’. If this is interpreted non-set-theoretically as an equivalence relation, where the relevant elements are understood as simply objects that have certain properties in common, one can continue to maintain that such objects do not have well-defined identity conditions (Bueno 2019). Indeed, there may be a variety of such frameworks, both formal and metaphysical, in terms of which non-individuality may be understood (Arenhart 2017b).

6. Metaphysical Underdetermination

We now appear to have an interesting situation. Quantum mechanics is compatible with two distinct metaphysical ‘packages’, one in which the objects are regarded as individuals and one in which they are not. Thus, we have a form of ‘underdetermination’ of the metaphysics by the physics (see van Fraassen 1985 and 1991; French 1989; Huggett 1997). This has implications for the broader issue of realism within the philosophy of science. If asked to spell out her beliefs, the realist will point to currently accepted fundamental physics, such as quantum mechanics, and insist that the world is, at least approximately, however the physics says it is. Of course, there are the well-known problems of ontological change (giving rise to the so-called Pessimistic Meta-Induction) and Underdetermination of Theories by the Empirical data. However, this underdetermination of metaphysical packages seems to pose an even more fundamental problem, as the physics involved is well entrenched and the difference in the metaphysics seemingly as wide as it could be. These packages support dramatically different world-views: one in which quantum objects, such as electrons, quarks and so forth, are individuals and one in which they are not. The realist must then face the question: which package corresponds to the world?

One option would be to refuse to answer and insist that all the realist is required to do is to state how the world is, according to our best theories; that is, to articulate her realism in terms of electrons, quarks etc. and what physics tells us about them and no more, metaphysically speaking. This might be called a ‘shallow’ form of realism (Magnus 2012) and it raises the obvious worry that the content of such shallow realism amounts to no more than a recitation of the relevant physical content of our best theories, with no consideration of whether that content is concerned with objects or not, and whether the former are individuals or not.

At the other extreme, one might be tempted to give up realism altogether and adopt an anti-realist stance. Thus the constructive empiricist, taking realism to be metaphysically informed, and hence ‘deep’ rather than ‘shallow’, draws as the lesson from this underdetermination, ‘so much for metaphysics’ and realism along with it. Since on this view, all that theories can tell us is how the world could be, the different metaphysical packages of objects-as-individuals and as non-individuals simply amount to different ways of spelling that out (van Fraassen 1991).

In between these extremes are various options for handling the underdetermination, corresponding to different levels of ‘deep’ realism. Thus one might try to argue that the underdetermination can be ‘broken’ in some way. One might, for example, appeal to some metaphysical factor or other in support of one package over the other, or shift to meta-metaphysical considerations in order to argue, for example, that individuality based on weak discernibility has certain advantages over rival accounts and also over non-individuality, with its attendant non-standard formal underpinning. However Arenhart argues that weak discernibility generates further metaphysical underdetermination and hence cannot support a fully naturalistic understanding of quantum mechanics as some of its advocates have claimed (Arenhart 2017b). Alternatively, of course, one could argue the other way and insist that the non-individuality package avoids having to choose between different metaphysical accounts of individuality, at least, and that the formal shift to quasi-set theory is not as dramatic as might be thought. Ultimately, however, its not at all clear what weight should be given to the various factors involved or even if a coherent weighting scheme can be applied in the first place.

Instead one might appeal to broadly methodological factors to break the underdetermination. Thus it has been argued that the package of objects-as-non-individuals meshes better with quantum field theory (QFT) where, it is claimed, talk of individuals is avoided from the word go (Post 1963; Redhead and Teller 1991 and 1992; Teller 1995). The central argument for this claim focuses on the core understanding that objects may indeed be regarded as individuals in quantum physics but as such are subject to restrictions on the sets of states they may occupy. The states that are inaccessible to the particles of a particular kind, such as electrons say, can be taken as corresponding to just so much ‘surplus structure’. In particular, if the view of particles as individuals is adopted, then it is entirely mysterious as to why a particular sub-set of these inaccessible, surplus states, namely those that are non-symmetric, are not actually realised. Applying the general methodological principle that a theory which does not contain such surplus structure is to be preferred over one that does, Redhead and Teller conclude that we have grounds for preferring the non-individuals package and the mystery of the inaccessible states simply does not arise (Redhead and Teller 1991 and 1992).

This line of argument has been criticised by Huggett on the grounds that the apparent mystery is a mere fabrication: the inaccessible non-symmetric states can be ruled out as simply not physically possible (Huggett 1995). The surplus structure, then, is a consequence of the representation chosen and has no further metaphysical significance. However, it has been insisted that a theory should also tell us why a particular state of affairs is not possible. So, consider the possible state of affairs in which a cold cup of tea spontaneously starts to boil. Statistical mechanics can explain why we never observe such a possibility, whereas the quantum-objects-as-individuals view cannot explain why we never observe non-symmetric states and hence it is deficient in this regard (Teller 1998).

Unfortunately, the analogy is problematic. Statistical mechanics does not say that the above situation never occurs but only that the probability of its occurrence is extremely low. The question then reduces to that of ‘why is this probability so low?’ The answer to that is typically given in terms of the very low number of states corresponding to the tea boiling compared to the vast number of states for which it remains cold. Why, then, this disparity in the number of accessible states? Or, equivalently, why do we find ourselves in situations in which entropy increases? One answer takes us back to the initial conditions of the Big Bang. A similar line can then be taken in the case of quantum statistics. Why do we never observe non-symmetric states? Because that is the way the universe is and we should not expect quantum mechanics alone to have to explain why certain initial conditions obtain and not others. Here we recall that the symmetry of the Hamiltonian ensures that if a particle is in a state of a particular symmetry (corresponding to Bose-Einstein statistics, say, or Fermi-Dirac) to begin with, it will remain in states of that symmetry. Hence, if non-symmetric states do not feature in the initial conditions which held at the beginning of the universe, they will remain forever inaccessible to the particles. The issue then turns on different views of the significance of the above ‘surplus structure’ (see Belousek 2000.)

Furthermore, even if we accept the methodological principle of ‘the less surplus structure the better’, it is not clear that QFT understood in terms of non-individual ‘quanta’ offers any significant advantage in this respect (although see da Costa and Holik 2015 for an account in these terms of states with undefined particle number, characteristic of QFT). Indeed, it has been argued that the formalism of QFT is also compatible with the alternative package of objects as individuals. Van Fraassen has pressed this claim (1991), drawing on de Muynck’s construction of state spaces for QFT which involve labelled particles (1975). Butterfield, however, has argued that the existence of states that are superpositions of particle number, within QFT, undermines the equivalence (1993). Nevertheless, Huggett insists, in this case the undermining is empirical, rather than methodological (Huggett 1995). When the number is constant, it is the states for arbitrary numbers of particles which are so much surplus structure and now, if the methodological argument is applied, it is the individuals package which is to be preferred.

It is also worth noting, perhaps, that some of this ‘surplus’ structure corresponds to so-called ‘paraparticle’ statistics, or forms of quantum statistics that are neither bosonic nor fermionic. These were acknowledged as possible by Dirac as early as the 1930s but were only fully developed theoretically from the late 1950s. For a brief period in the mid-1960s it was thought that quarks might be paraparticles, before the same statistical behaviour came to be described in terms of the new intrinsic property of ‘colour’ leading to the development of quantum chromodynamics, which effectively pushed paraparticle theory into the theoretical twilight (for a summary of the history see French and Krause 2006, Ch. 3; for a discussion of paraparticles in the context of issues relating to particle indistinguishability, see Caulton and Butterfield 2012b). This suggests that paraparticle statistics can always be re-described in conventional terms – a suggestion that has been taken up by Baker et. al. in the context of algebraic QFT, thereby eliminating this form of surplus structure at least (Baker, Halvorson and Swanson 2015).

There remains considerable scope for further exploration of all these issues and concerns in the context of quantum field theory (see also Auyang 1995) and a collection of relevant historical and philosophical reflections can be found in Cao (1999).

A further approach to this underdetermination is to reject both packages and seek a third way. Thus Morganti has argued that both of the above metaphysical packages assume that everything qualitative about an object must be encoded in terms of a property that it possesses (Morganti 2009). Dropping this assumption allows us to consider quantum statistics as describing ‘inherent’ properties of the assembly as a whole. The (anti-)symmetry of the relevant states is then accounted for in terms of the disposition of the system to give rise to certain correlated outcomes upon measurement. This is presented as an extension of Teller’s ‘relational holism’ (Teller 1989), and relatedly, the notion of ‘inherence’ involves the denial of the supervenience of the properties of the whole on those of the parts. However, as just indicated, it comes with a cost: that of admitting holistic dispositional properties and the metaphysics of these in the quantum context requires further development, as does the sense in which such inherent properties ‘emerge’ when systems interact. Earlier and along similar metaphysical lines, Lavine suggested that quantum objects can be regarded as the smallest possible amounts of ‘stuff’ and, crucially, that a multi-particle state represents a further amount of stuff such that it does not contain proper parts (1991; see also Jantzen 2019). Such a view, he claims, avoids the metaphysically problematic aspects of both the individuals and non-individuals packages. Of course, there are then the issues of the metaphysics and logic of ‘stuff’, but it can be argued that these are familiar and not peculiar to quantum mechanics. One such issue concerns the nature of ‘stuff’: is it our familiar primitive substance? Substance as a fundamental metaphysical primitive faces well-known difficulties and it has been suggested that it should be dropped in favour of some form of ‘bundle theory’, as mentioned at the very beginning of this article. If the individual objects are understood to be bundles of ‘tropes’, where a trope is an individual instance of a property or a relation, and if this notion is broadened to include individuals whose existence depends on that of others which are not a part of them then, it is claimed, this notion may be flexible enough to accommodate quantum physics (Simons 1998; see also Morganti 2013). Another issue concerns the manner in which ‘stuff’ combines: how do we go from the amounts of stuff represented by two independent photons, to the amount represented by a joint two-photon state? The analogies Lavine gives are well known: drops of water, money in the bank, bumps on a rope (Teller 1983; Hesse 1963). Of course, these may also be appropriated by the non-individual objects view but, more significantly, they are suggestive of a field-theoretic approach in which the ‘stuff’ in question is the quantum field.

Here we return to issues concerning the metaphysics of quantum field theory and it is worth pointing out that underdetermination may arise here too. In classical physics we are faced with a choice between the view of the field as a kind of global substance or stuff and an alternative conception in terms of field quantities assigned to and hence as properties of, the points of space-time. In the case of quantum field theory, the field quantities are not well-defined at such points (because of difficulties in defining exact locational states in quantum field theory) but are instead regarded as ‘smeared’ over space-time regions (see Teller 1999). The underdetermination remains, of course: between an understanding of the given quantum field in terms of some kind of global substance and the alternative conception in terms of the properties of space-time regions. Taking the first option obviously requires a metaphysically articulated form of substantivalism applicable to quantum field theory. Many commentators have preferred the second option, but now, of course, attention must be paid to the metaphysical status of the space-time regions over which the field properties are taken to be instantiated. Typically, these will be taken to be composed of points of space-time and conceiving of a field in terms of a set of properties meshes comfortably with the approach that takes space-time to be a kind of substance or ‘stuff’ itself. But this too faces well known difficulties in the context of modern physics (see, for example, Earman 1989). In particular, space-time substantivalism has been argued to have extremely unpalatable consequences (Earman and Norton 1987). Unfortunately, such a properties-based account of fields is difficult to reconcile with the alternative view of space-time as merely a system of relations (such as contiguity) between physical bodies: if the field quantities are properties of space-time regions and the latter are understood, ultimately, to be reducible to relations between physical objects, where the latter are conceived of in field-theoretic terms, then a circularity arises (see Rovelli 1999). One way forward would be to draw on alternative accounts of the nature of spacetime. Thus Stachel has suggested that we drop the sharp, metaphysical distinction between things and relations between things and adopt a broadly ‘structuralist’ view of spacetime (Stachel 1999; see the essays in Rickles, French & Saatsi 2006). Suitably extended, such a ‘structuralist’ approach might offer a way around the above incompatibility by regarding both space-time and the quantum field in structural terms, rather than in terms of substances, properties or relations (see Auyang 1995; Cao 2003; French and Ladyman 2003; Kantorovich 2003; Lyre 2004; Saunders 2003b).

This takes us to a further possible response to the above metaphysical underdetermination which urges realism to retreat from a metaphysics of objects and develop an ontology of structure compatible with the physics (Ladyman 1998 and 2014). An early attempt to do this in the quantum context can be seen in the work of Cassirer who noted the implications of the new physics for the standard notion of individual objects and concluded that quantum objects were describable only as ‘“points of intersection” of certain relations’ (1937, p. 180) Setting aside the neo-Kantian elements in Cassirer’s structuralism, this view of quantum entities has been developed in the context of a form of ‘ontic’ structural realism (Ladyman and Ross 2007). Drawing on the views of both Weyl and Wigner, quantum objects are here understood as ontologically constituted, group theoretically, in terms of sets of invariants, such as rest mass, charge, spin, and so on (Castellani 1998a). From this perspective, both the individuality and non-individuality packages get off on the wrong feet, as it were, by assuming that the way the world is, according to physics, is a world of objects, which can either be regarded as individuals, whether primitively or via weak discernibility, or as non-individuals, whether formally represented through quasi-set theory or not. How, then, should we regard the ‘Indistinguishability Postulate’ with which we began this discussion of identity and individuality in the quantum context? Both the above packages rest upon a certain understanding of particle permutations, as encapsulated in that Postulate, namely that these are to be conceived in terms of swapping the particles between states, or boxes in our illustrative sketch. However, we can also think of the ‘Indistinguishability Postulate’ as expressing a fundamental symmetry constraint on quantum mechanics, to the effect that the relevant states should be invariant under particle permutations. An alternative way of regarding this ‘permutation invariance’ that aligns with a widely accepted view of symmetry principles in general is that it expresses a certain representational redundancy in the formalism. Thus, referring to our sketch above, the permuted arrangement of one particle in each box, which is counted in classical statistical mechanics but not in the quantum form, can be considered as ‘representationally redundant’ in this sense. This casts ‘permutation invariance’ as one of a number of such symmetry principles that have acquired a fundamental role in modern physics (Huggett 1999b; French and Rickles 2003). Not surprisingly perhaps, such a re-casting may also have metaphysical implications in that when applied to certain systems obeying Fermi-Dirac statistics – that is, systems of ‘material’ particles – the composition of such systems (in the sense that they may be regarded as composed or made up of sub-systems considered as ‘parts’) violates standard mereological principles (Caulton 2015; for some possible responses see Bigaj 2016). More generally it has been argued that ‘permutation invariance’ is incompatible with a particle ontology understood even in a metaphysically minimal sense (Jantzen 2011). Given the fundamental significance of the former, it has been suggested that the latter must then be jettisoned. A possible alternative is to adopt a form of space-time substantivalism and take property-bearing regions of space-time to provide the appropriate ontological basis (Jantzen 2011). However that runs into the sorts of problems touched on above. More radically, perhaps, dropping the above ‘object-oriented’ assumption would undercut the metaphysical underdetermination entirely and open up space for an alternative ontology in terms of which quantum entities are conceived of as nothing more than features of ‘the structure of the world’ (see French and Ladyman 2003). This can then be articulated in terms of the relevant laws and symmetries with the properties of such putative entities understood as the determinate aspects of this structure (see French 2014; for further consideration of such an ontology in the context of ‘structural realism’, see Ladyman 2014).


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


Thanks to Otavio Bueno, Rob Clifton, Nick Huggett, Decio Krause and James Ladyman for helpful comments.

Copyright © 2019 by
Steven French

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