Notes to Quantum Logic and Probability Theory

1. A few qualifications are in order already: In a more general formulation, one considers the lattice of projections of a von Neumann algebra. Only in the context of non-relativistic quantum mechanics, and then only absent superselection rules, is this algebra a type I factor. For the expository purposes of this paper, we restrict our discussion to this context.

2. Throughout this paper, I use the term “logic” rather narrowly to refer to the algebraic and order-theoretic aspect of propositional logic. There exists a substantial technical literature devoted to non-classical formal deductive systems that are intended to stand to quantum propositional logics rather as classical deductive systems stand to Boolean algebras. A good reference for this material is Kalmbach 1983.

3. It is important to note here that even in classical mechanics, only subsets of the state-space that are measurable (in the sense of measure theory) are regarded as representing observable properties of the system, and only these are assigned probabilities. The difference is that in the classical case, the observable properties form a sub-Boolean algebra of the power set of \(S\), while in the quantum case, they do not.

4. For a recent, and particularly sharp, critique of Putnam’s proposal, see Maudlin 2005. A more slightly more sympathetic treatment is given by Bacciagaluppi (2009), who suggests that one’s attitude towards the kind of revision of logic Putnam proposes will be bound up with one’s preferences regarding a physical interpretation of quantum mechanics. In particular, Bacciagaluppi suggests that the Everett interpretation that consistent with something resembling Putnam’s thesis.

5. The first explicit formulation of this interpretation seems to have been given by Jauch and Piron (1969).

6. So-called modal interpretations of quantum mechanics do not attempt to assign actual values (or ranges of values) to all observables. Rather, they identify (in various different ways) a privileged observable or class of observables as having “definite values”, and thereby avoid the various no-go theorems for hidden variables. For references and further details, see the entry on modal interpretations of quantum mechanics.

7. Of course, another possible response to such a question is to dismiss it, perhaps with the observation that mathematical models of natural phenomena evolve, more or less organically, to fit the facts, and require no a priori justification. Or, to put it differently, we can insist that quantum logic has the structure that it does just because the world has that structure.

8. These include, besides Mackey’s original formalism, that of Piron (1976), the approach based on partial Boolean algebras of Kochen and Specker (1965, 1967), and various approaches emphasizing the convex structure of the set of (statistical) states of a system, e.g., Holevo 1982, Ludwig 1983, Pitowsky 1989.

9. Even at this point, a couple of remarks are in order. First, notice that \(E\) need not be the set of outcomes of any humanly executable, let alone repeatable, measurement or experiment. Any exhaustive set of mutually exclusive alternatives will serve, at least as long as some sense can be attached to the terms “occurrence” and “realization” (even as terms of art). Secondly, notice that every standard interpretation of probability theory, whether relative-frequentist, propensity, subjective or what-have-you, represents probability weights mathematically in the same way.  Thus, the framework just sketched is agnostic among these interpretations.

10. It is worth remarking that all approaches to a generalized probability theory contain some mechanism for identifying outcomes of distinct measurements or values of distinct observables, though this mechanism varies from author to author . The most common approaches are to identify outcomes that are equi-probable in every state (as in the work of Mackey), or to identify outcomes that are certain (i.e., have probability 1) in exactly the same states (as in the work of Piron). Both of these prescriptions become problematic in the context of sequential measurements—see, e.g., Cooke and Hilgevoord 1981. The Foulis-Randall theory has the advantage of remaining neutral as to the precise mechanism whereby outcomes are identified.

11. It is easy to see that this condition, which is sometimes used as the definition of algebraicity, implies algebraicity as we have defined it. For the converse, we argue as follows. Let \(A, B, C\) be events of an algebraic test space \(\mathcal{A}\), with \(A \sim B\) and \(C\) complementary to \(B\). Then, because \(\mathcal{A}\) is algebraic, \(A\binbot C\), and so \(A\cup C\) is an event. To show that \(C\) is complementary to \(A\), we need to show that \(A\cup C\) is a test. To do this, let \(D\) be complementary to \(A\cup C\). Then \(C\cup D\) is complementary to \(A\), and, since \(A \sim B\) , we have \((C\cup D)\binbot B\). But then \(B\cup C\cup D\) is an event, containing the test \(B\cup C\).

In an algebraic test space, tests are maximal events; that is, a test has no non-empty complement. If \(E\) and \(F\) are tests and \(E\subseteq F\), then we have \(F \sim E\) (since the empty set is a common complement of \(F\) and \(E\)); since \(E\binbot(F / E)\), we have \(F\binbot(F / E)\) as well, and so \((F / E)\) is empty, and \(F = E\).

It follows that \(D\) is empty, whence \(A\cup C\) is a test.

12. Cabello (2012, Other Internet Resources) attributes to Ernst Specker the following comment: “Do you know what, according to me, is the fundamental theorem of quantum mechanics? (…) That is, if you have several questions and you can answer any two of them, then you can also answer all of them.” This is exactly regularity. As Harding’s results show, it is very far from uniquely quantum-mechanical. On the other hand, regularity, and even orthocoherence, are strong constraints on a probabilistic model. For instance, it is pointed out in Henson 2012 (Other Internet Resources) that orthocoherence enforces the quantum-mechanical upper-bound on the so-called “KCBS” parameter, one proposed measure of the degree to which a probabilistic model is contextual. Othocoherent probabilistic models, then, cannot be, by this measure, more “non-contextual” than allowed by quantum mechanics.

13. The approach taken here is modeled on, but somewhat less general than, that of Foulis, Piron and Randall (1983). See also Randall and Foulis (1985).

14. Indeed, the pair \((S, F)\) is an adjunction between \(\wp(X)\) and \(\wp(\Delta)\)—that is, for any \(\Gamma \in \wp(\Delta)\) and any \(J \in \wp(X)\), we have \(S(\Gamma) \subseteq J\) if and only if \(\Gamma \subseteq F(J)\). It follows that the mappings

\[\Gamma \rightarrow F(S(\Gamma)) \textrm{ and }J \rightarrow S(F(J))\]

are respectively a closure operator on \(\wp(\Delta)\) and an interior operator on \(\wp(X)\). The collection of closed subsets of \(\Delta\) and the collection of open subsets of \(X\) (which are exactly the ranges of the mappings \(F\) and \(S)\) are complete lattices, closed under intersection and union respectively, and are mapped isomorphically onto one another by \(S\) and \(F\). (See the supplement on ordering relations for further details.)

15. In the case where \(\Delta\) is a convex set of states the closed subsets of \(\Delta\) are faces of \(\Delta\); that is, \(F(J)\) is itself convex, and if a convex combination of states lies in \(F(J)\), then those states themselves lie in \(F(J)\). The faces of any convex set \(\Delta\), ordered by inclusion, form a complete lattice, closed under intersection. Thus, in this context, the property lattice is a complete sublattice of the face lattice of the state-space. This is the starting point for a number of approaches to generalized probability theory. Note that if \(\Delta\) is a simplex, as it is for classical models, then the face lattice of \(\Delta\) is a Boolean algebra.

16. This condition fails for the projection lattice modeling a quantum-mechanical system with superselection rules, but continues to hold for the lattices associated with each superselection sector.

17. The first such examples were obtained by H. Keller. Recently, M. P. Soler has shown that if a generalized Hilbert space contains any infinite orthonormal set, it must in fact be a classical Hilbert space—i.e., the division ring D must be the field of real numbers, the field of complex numbers, or the ring of quaternions. See Holland 1995 for references and further discussion. For an interesting recent attempt to motivate the hypothesis of Soler’s theorem, see Pitowsky 2006.

18. For a development of this idea in a more general context, see Wilce 2000a.

19. Interesting recent work of Meyer (1999) and Clifton & Kent (2000) shows that the quantum test space \(F(\mathbf{H})\) contains a dense semi-classical sub-test space. A detailed hidden-variables model along these lines has not been seriously entertained (and would presumably be otherwise problematic), but these results do suggest that experiments having finite precision can not rule out non-contextual hidden variables.

Copyright © 2017 by
Alexander Wilce <>

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