# Quantum Logic and Probability Theory

*First published Mon Feb 4, 2002; substantive revision Thu Jan 26, 2017*

Mathematically, quantum mechanics can be regarded as a non-classical probability calculus resting upon a non-classical propositional logic. More specifically, in quantum mechanics each probability-bearing proposition of the form “the value of physical quantity \(A\) lies in the range \(B\)” is represented by a projection operator on a Hilbert space \(\mathbf{H}\). These form a non-Boolean—in particular, non-distributive—orthocomplemented lattice. Quantum-mechanical states correspond exactly to probability measures (suitably defined) on this lattice.

What are we to make of this? Some have argued that the empirical
success of quantum mechanics calls for a revolution in logic itself.
This view is associated with the demand for a realistic interpretation
of quantum mechanics, i.e., one not grounded in any primitive notion
of measurement. Against this, there is a long tradition of
interpreting quantum mechanics operationally, that is, as being
precisely a theory of measurement. On this latter view, it is not
surprising that a “logic” of measurement-outcomes, in a
setting where not all measurements are compatible, should prove not to
be Boolean. Rather, the mystery is why it should have the
*particular* non-Boolean structure that it does in quantum
mechanics. A substantial literature has grown up around the programme
of giving some independent motivation for this
structure—ideally, by deriving it from more primitive and
plausible axioms governing a generalized probability theory.

- 1. Quantum Mechanics as a Probability Calculus
- 2. Interpretations of Quantum Logic
- 3. Generalized Probability Theory
- 4. Logics associated with probabilistic models
- 5. Piron’s Theorem
- 6. Classical Representations
- 7. Composite Systems
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Quantum Mechanics as a Probability Calculus

It is uncontroversial (though remarkable) that the formal apparatus of
quantum mechanics reduces neatly to a generalization of classical
probability in which the role played by a Boolean algebra of events in
the latter is taken over by the “quantum logic” of
projection operators on a Hilbert
space.^{[1]}
Moreover, the usual statistical interpretation of quantum mechanics
asks us to take this generalized quantum probability theory quite
literally—that is, not as merely a formal analogue of its
classical counterpart, but as a genuine doctrine of chances. In this
section, I survey this quantum probability theory and its supporting
quantum
logic.^{[2]}

[For further background on Hilbert spaces, see the entry on quantum mechanics. For further background on ordered sets and lattices, see the supplementary document: The Basic Theory of Ordering Relations. Concepts and results explained these supplements will be used freely in what follows.]

### 1.1 Quantum Probability in a Nutshell

The quantum-probabilistic formalism, as developed by von Neumann
[1932], assumes that each physical system is associated with a
(separable) Hilbert space \(\mathbf{H}\), the unit vectors of which
correspond to possible physical *states* of the system. Each
“observable” real-valued random quantity is represented by
a self-adjoint operator \(A\) on \(\mathbf{H}\), the spectrum of which
is the set of possible values of \(A\). If \(u\) is a unit vector in
the domain of \(A\), representing a state, then the expected value of
the observable represented by \(A\) in this state is given by the
inner product \(\langle Au,u\rangle\). The observables represented by
two operators \(A\) and \(B\) are commensurable iff \(A\) and \(B\)
commute, i.e., *AB = BA*. (For further discussion, see the
entry on quantum mechanics.)

### 1.2 The “Logic” of Projections

As stressed by von Neumann, the \(\{0,1\}\)-valued observables may be
regarded as encoding propositions about—or, to use his phrasing,
properties of—the state of the system. It is not difficult to
show that a self-adjoint operator \(P\) with spectrum contained in the
two-point set \(\{0,1\}\) must be a projection; i.e., \(P^2 = P\).
Such operators are in one-to-one correspondence with the closed
subspaces of \(\mathbf{H}\). Indeed, if \(P\) is a projection, its
range is closed, and any closed subspace is the range of a unique
projection. If \(u\) is any unit vector, then \(\langle Pu,u\rangle =
\llvert Pu\rrvert ^2\) is the expected value of the corresponding
observable in the state represented by \(u\). Since this observable is
\(\{0,1\}\)-valued, we can interpret this expected value as the
*probability* that a measurement of the observable will produce
the “affirmative” answer 1. In particular, the affirmative
answer will have probability 1 if and only if *Pu = u*; that
is, \(u\) lies in the range of \(P\). Von Neumann concludes that

… the relation between the properties of a physical system on the one hand, and the projections on the other, makes possible a sort of logical calculus with these. However, in contrast to the concepts of ordinary logic, this system is extended by the concept of “simultaneous decidability” which is characteristic for quantum mechanics. (1932: 253)

Let’s examine this “logical calculus” of projections. Ordered by set-inclusion, the closed subspaces of \(\mathbf{H}\) form a complete lattice, in which the meet (greatest lower bound) of a set of subspaces is their intersection, while their join (least upper bound) is the closed span of their union. Since a typical closed subspace has infinitely many complementary closed subspaces, this lattice is not distributive; however, it is orthocomplemented by the mapping

\[\mathbf{M} \rightarrow \mathbf{M}^{\bot} = \{v\in \mathbf{H} \mid \forall u\in \mathbf{M}(\langle v,u\rangle = 0)\}.\]
In view of the
above-mentioned one-one correspondence between closed subspaces and
projections, we may impose upon the set \(L(\mathbf{H})\) the
structure of a complete orthocomplemented lattice, defining \(P\le
Q\), where \(\rran (P) \subseteq \rran (Q)\) and \(P' = 1 - P\) (so
that \(\rran (P') = \rran (P)^{\bot})\). It is straightforward that
\(P\le Q\) just in case \(PQ = QP = P\). More generally, if *PQ =
QP*, then \(PQ = P\wedge Q\), the meet of \(P\) and \(Q\) in
\(L(\mathbf{H})\); also in this case their join is given by \(P\vee Q
= P+Q - PQ\).

**1.1 Lemma**:

Let \(P\) and \(Q\) be projection operators on the Hilbert space
\(\mathbf{H}\). The following are equivalent:

- \(PQ = QP\)
- The sublattice of \(L(\mathbf{H})\) generated by \(P, Q, P'\) and \(Q'\) is Boolean
- \(P, Q\) lie in a common Boolean sub-ortholattice of \(L(\mathbf{H})\).

Adhering to the idea that commuting observables—in particular, projections—are simultaneously measurable, we conclude that the members of a Boolean sub-ortholattice of \(L(\mathbf{H})\) are simultaneously testable. This suggests that we can maintain a classical logical interpretation of the meet, join and orthocomplement as applied to commuting projections.

### 1.3 Probability Measures and Gleason’s Theorem

The foregoing discussion motivates the following. Call projections
\(P\) and \(Q\) *orthogonal*, and write \(P\binbot Q\) iff \(P
\le Q'\). Note that \(P\binbot Q\) iff \(PQ = QP = 0\). If \(P\) and
\(Q\) are orthogonal projections, then their join is simply their sum;
traditionally, this is denoted \(P\oplus Q\). We denote the identity
mapping on \(\mathbf{H}\) by \(\mathbf{1}\).

**1.2 Definition**:

A (countably additive) *probability measure* on
\(L(\mathbf{H})\) is a mapping \(\mu : L \rightarrow\) [0,1] such that
\(\mu(\mathbf{1}) = 1\) and, for any sequence of pair-wise orthogonal
projections \(P_i, i = 1,2\),…

Here is one way in which we can manufacture a probability measure on \(L(\mathbf{H})\). Let \(u\) be a unit vector of \(\mathbf{H}\), and set \(\mu_u (P) = \langle Pu,u\rangle\). This gives the usual quantum-mechanical recipe for the probability that \(P\) will have value 1 in the state \(u\). Note that we can also express \(\mu_u\) as \(\mu_u(P) = Tr(P P_u)\), where \(P_u\) is the one-dimensional projection associated with the unit vector \(u\), i.e., \(P_u(x) = \langle x, u \rangle u\) for all \(x \in \mathbf{H}\).

More generally, if \(\mu_i, i=1,2,\ldots\), are probability measures on \(L(\mathbf{H})\), then so is any “mixture”, or convex combination \(\mu = \sum_i t_i\mu_i\) where \(0\le t_i\le 1\) and \(\sum_i t_i = 1\). Given any sequence \(u_1, u_2,\ldots\), of unit vectors, let \(\mu_i = \mu_{u_{ i}}\) and let \(P_i = P_{u_{ i}}\). Forming the operator

\[W = t_1 P_1 + t_2P_2 +\ldots,\]one sees that

\[\mu(P) = t_1 Tr(P P_1) + t_2 Tr(P P_2) + \ldots = Tr(WP)\]
An operator expressible in this way as a convex combination of
one-dimensional projections in is called a *density operator*.
Density operators are the standard mathematical representation for
general (pure or “mixed”) quantum-mechanical states. We
have just seen that every density operator \(W\) gives rise to a
countably additive probability measure on \(L(\mathbf{H})\). The
following striking converse, due to A. Gleason [1957], shows that the
theory of probability measures on \(L(\mathbf{H})\) is co-extensive
with the theory of (mixed) quantum mechanical states on
\(\mathbf{H}\):

**1.3 Gleason’s Theorem**:

Let \(\mathbf{H}\) have dimension \(\gt 2\). Then every countably
additive probability measure on \(L(\mathbf{H})\) has the form
\(\mu(P) = Tr(WP)\), for a density operator \(W\) on \(\mathbf{H}\).

An important consequence of Gleason’s Theorem is that \(L(\mathbf{H})\) does not admit any probability measures having only the values 0 and 1. To see this, note that for any density operator \(W\), the mapping \(u \rightarrow \langle Wu,u\rangle\) is continuous on the unit sphere of \(\mathbf{H}\). But since the latter is connected, no continuous function on it can take only the two values 0 and 1. This result is often taken to rule out the possibility of “hidden variables”—an issue taken up in more detail in section 6.

### 1.4 The Reconstruction of QM

From the single premise that the “experimental
propositions” associated with a physical system are encoded by
projections in the way indicated above, one can reconstruct the rest
of the formal apparatus of quantum mechanics. The first step, of
course, is Gleason’s theorem, which tells us that probability
measures on \(L(\mathbf{H})\) correspond to density operators. There
remains to recover, e.g., the representation of
“observables” by self-adjoint operators, and the dynamics
(unitary evolution). The former can be recovered with the help of the
Spectral theorem and the latter with the aid of a deep theorem of E.
Wigner on the projective representation of groups. See also R. Wright
[1980]. A detailed outline of this reconstruction (which involves some
distinctly non-trivial mathematics) can be found in the book of
Varadarajan [1985]. The point to bear in mind is that, once the
quantum-logical skeleton \(L(\mathbf{H})\) is in place, the remaining
statistical and dynamical apparatus of quantum mechanics is
essentially fixed. In this sense, then, quantum mechanics—or, at
any rate, its mathematical framework—*reduces to* quantum
logic and its attendant probability theory.

## 2. Interpretations of Quantum Logic

The reduction of QM to probability theory based on \(L(\mathbf{H})\) is mathematically compelling, but what does it tell us about QM—or, assuming QM to be a correct and complete physical theory, about the world? How, in other words, are we to interpret the quantum logic \(L(\mathbf{H})\)? The answer will turn on how we unpack the phrase, freely used above,

- (*) The value of the observable \(A\) lies in the range \(B\).

One possible reading of (*) is *operational*:
“measurement of the observable \(A\) would yield (or will yield,
or has yielded) a value in the set \(B\)”. On this view,
projections represent statements about the possible results of
measurements. This sits badly with realists of a certain stripe, who,
shunning reference to “measurement”, prefer to understand
(*) as a *property ascription*:

the system has a certain categorical property, which corresponds to the observable \(A\) having, independently of any measurement, a value in the set \(B\).

(One must be careful in how one understands this last phrase, however: construed incautiously, it seems to posit a hidden-variables interpretation of quantum mechanics of just the sort ruled out by Gleason’s Theorem. I will have more to say about this below.)

### 2.1 Realist Quantum Logic

The interpretation of projection operators as representing the
properties of a physical system is already explicit in von
Neumann’s *Grundlagen*.. However, the logical operations
discussed there apply only to commuting projections, which are
identified with simultaneously decidable propositions. In 1936
Birkhoff and von Neumann took a step further, proposing to interpret
the lattice-theoretic meet and join of projections as their
conjunction and disjunction, *whether or not* they commute.
Immediately this proposal faces the problem that the lattice
\(L(\mathbf{H})\) is not distributive, making it impossible to give
these “quantum” connectives a truth-functional
interpretation. Undaunted, von Neumann and Birkhoff suggested that the
empirical success of quantum mechanics as a framework for physics
casts into doubt the universal validity of the distributive laws of
propositional logic. Their phrasing remains cautious:

Whereas logicians have usually assumed that properties … of negation were the ones least able to withstand a critical analysis, the study of mechanics points to the distributive identities … as the weakest link in the algebra of logic. (1936: 837)

In the 1960s and early 1970s, this thesis was advanced rather more
aggressively by a number of authors, including especially David
Finkelstein and Hilary Putnam, who argued that quantum mechanics
requires a revolution in our understanding of logic *per se*.
According to Putnam, “Logic is as empirical as geometry.
… We live in a world with a non-classical logic” ([1968]
1979: 184).

For Putnam, the elements of \(L(\mathbf{H})\) represent categorical properties that an object possesses, or does not, independently of whether or not we look. Inasmuch as this picture of physical properties is confirmed by the empirical success of quantum mechanics, we must, on this view, accept that the way in which physical properties actually hang together is not Boolean. Since logic is, for Putnam, very much the study of how physical properties actually hang together, he concludes that classical logic is simply mistaken: the distributive law is not universally valid.

Classically, if \(S\) is the set of states of a physical system, then
*every* subset of \(S\) corresponds to a categorical property
of the system, and vice versa. In quantum mechanics, the state space
is the (projective) unit sphere \(S = S(\mathbf{H})\) of a Hilbert
space. However, not all subsets of \(S\) correspond to
quantum-mechanical properties of the system. The latter correspond
only to subsets of the special form \(S \cap \mathbf{M}\), for
\(\mathbf{M}\) a closed linear subspace of \(\mathbf{H}\). In
particular, only subsets of this form are assigned probabilities. This
leaves us with two options. One is to take only these special
properties as “real” (or “physical”, or
“meaningful”), regarding more general subsets of \(S\) as
corresponding to no real categorical properties at all. The other is
to regard the “quantum” properties as a small subset of
the set of all physically (or at any rate, metaphysically) reasonable,
but not necessarily *observable*, properties of the system. On
this latter view, the set of *all* properties of a physical
system is entirely classical in its logical structure, but we decline
to assign probabilities to the non-observable
properties.^{[3]}

This second position, while certainly not inconsistent with realism
*per se*, turns upon a distinction involving a notion of
“observation”, “measurement”,
“test”, or something of this sort—a notion that
realists are often at pains to avoid in connection with fundamental
physical theory. Of course, any realist account of a statistical
physical theory such as quantum mechanics will ultimately have to
render up some explanation of how measurements are supposed to take
place. That is, it will have to give an account of which physical
interactions between “object” and “probe”
systems count as measurements, and of how these interactions cause the
probe system to evolve into final “outcome-states” that
correspond to—and have the same probabilities as—the
outcomes predicted by the theory. This is the notorious
*measurement problem*.

In fact, Putnam advanced his version of quantum-logical realism as
offering a (radical) dissolution of the measurement problem: According
to Putnam, the measurement problem (and indeed every other
quantum-mechanical “paradox”) arises through an improper
application of the distributive law, and hence *disappears*
once this is recognized. This proposal, however, is widely regarded as
mistaken.^{[4]}

As mentioned above, realist interpretations of quantum mechanics must
be careful in how they construe the phrase “the observable \(A\)
has a value in the set \(B\)”. The simplest and most traditional
proposal—often dubbed the “eigenstate-eigenvalue
link” (Fine [1973])—is that (*) holds if and only if a
measurement of \(A\) yields a value in the set \(B\) with certainty,
i.e., with (quantum-mechanical!) probability 1. While this certainly
gives a realist interpretation of
(*),^{[5]}
it does not provide a solution to the measurement problem. Indeed, we
can use it to give a sharp formulation of that problem: even though
\(A\) is certain to yield a value in \(B\) when measured, unless the
quantum state is an eigenstate of the measured observable \(A\), the
system does not possess any categorical property corresponding to
\(A\)’s having a specific value in the set \(B\). Putnam seems
to assume that a realist interpretation of (*) should consist in
assigning to \(A\) some unknown value within \(B\), for which quantum
mechanics yields a non-trivial probability. However, an attempt to
make such assignments simultaneously for all observables runs afoul of
Gleason’s
Theorem.^{[6]}

### 2.2 Operational Quantum Logic

If we put aside scruples about “measurement” as a
primitive term in physical theory, and accept a principled distinction
between “testable” and non-testable properties, then the
fact that \(L(\mathbf{H})\) is not Boolean is unremarkable, and
carries no implication about logic *per se*. Quantum mechanics
is, on this view, a theory about the possible statistical
distributions of outcomes of certain measurements, and its
non-classical “logic” simply reflects the fact that not
all observable phenomena can be observed simultaneously. Because of
this, the set of probability-bearing events (or propositions) is
*less* rich than it would be in classical probability theory,
and the set of possible statistical distributions, accordingly, less
tightly constrained. That some “non-classical” probability
distributions allowed by this theory are actually manifested in nature
is perhaps surprising, but in no way requires any deep shift in our
understanding of logic or, for that matter, of probability.

This is hardly the last word, however. Having accepted all of the
above, there still remains the question of *why* the logic of
measurement outcomes should have the very special form
\(L(\mathbf{H})\), and never anything more
general.^{[7]}
This question entertains the idea that the formal structure of
quantum mechanics may be *uniquely determined* by a small
number of reasonable assumptions, together perhaps with certain
manifest regularities in the observed phenomena. This possibility is
already contemplated in von Neumann’s *Grundlagen* (and
also his later work in continuous geometry), but first becomes
explicit—and programmatic—in the work of George Mackey
[1957, 1963]. Mackey presents a sequence of six axioms, framing a very
conservative generalized probability theory, that underwrite the
construction of a “logic” of experimental propositions,
or, in his terminology, “questions”, having the structure
of a sigma-orthomodular partially-ordered set (see Section 4 and the
supplement document
The Basic Theory of Ordering Relations
for definitions of these terms). The outstanding problem, for Mackey,
was to explain why this poset *ought to* be isomorphic to
\(L(\mathbf{H})\):

Almost all modern quantum mechanics is based implicitly or explicitly on the following assumption, which we shall state as an axiom:Axiom VII: The partially ordered set of all questions in quantum mechanics is isomorphic to the partially ordered set of all closed subspaces of a separable, infinite dimensional Hilbert space.This axiom has rather a different character from Axioms I through VI. These all had some degree of physical naturalness and plausibility. Axiom VII seems entirely ad hoc. Why do we make it? Can we justify making it? … Ideally, one would like to have a list of physically plausible assumptions from which one could deduce Axiom VII. Short of this one would like a list from which one could deduce a set of possibilities for the structure … all but one of which could be shown to be inconsistent with suitably planned experiments. [Mackey 1963: 71–72]

Since Mackey’s writing there has grown up an extensive technical literature exploring variations on his axiomatic framework in an effort to supply the missing assumptions. The remainder of this article presents a brief survey of the current state of this project.

## 3. Generalized Probability Theory

Rather than restate Mackey’s axioms verbatim, I shall paraphrase
them in the context of an approach to generalized probability theory
due to D. J. Foulis and C. H. Randall having—among the many more
or less analogous approaches
available^{[8]}—certain
advantages of simplicity and flexibility. References for this section
are Foulis, Greechie, and Rüttimann [1992]; Foulis, Piron and
Randall [1983]; Randall and Foulis [1983]; see also Gudder [1989];
Wilce [2000b] and Wilce [2009] for surveys.

### 3.1 Discrete Classical Probability Theory

It will be helpful to begin with a review of classical probability
theory. In its simplest formulation, classical probability theory
deals with a (discrete) set \(E\) of mutually exclusive outcomes, as
of some measurement, experiment, etc., and with the various
*probability weights* that can be defined thereon—that
is, with mappings \(\omega : E \rightarrow[0,1]\) summing to 1 over
\(E\).^{[9]}

Notice that the set \(\Delta(E)\) of all probability weights on \(E\)
is *convex*, in that, given any sequence
\(\omega_1,\omega_2,\ldots\) of probability weights and any sequence
\(t_1,t_2,\ldots\) of non-negative real numbers summing to one, the
convex sum or “mixture” \(t_1\omega_1 + t_2\omega_2
+\ldots\) (taken pointwise on \(E)\) is again a probability weight.
The extreme points of this convex set are exactly the
“point-masses” \(\delta(x)\) associated with the outcomes
\(x \in E\):

Thus, \(\Delta(E)\) is a *simplex*:
each point \(\omega \in \Delta(E)\) is representable in a unique way
as a convex combination of extreme points, namely:

We also
need to recall the concept of a *random variable*. If \(E\) is
an outcome set and \(V\), some set of “values” (real
numbers, pointer-readings, or what not), a \(V\)-*valued random
variable* is simply a mapping \(f : E \rightarrow V\). The
heuristic (but it need only be taken as that) is that one
“measures” the random variable \(f\) by
“performing” the experiment represented by \(E\) and, upon
obtaining the outcome \(x \in E\), recording \(f(x)\) as the measured
value. Note that if \(V\) is a set of real numbers, or, more
generally, a subset of a vector space, we may define the *expected
value* of \(f\) in a state \(\omega \in \Delta(E)\) by:

### 3.2 Test Spaces

A very natural direction in which to generalize discrete classical
probability theory is to allow for a multiplicity of outcome-sets,
each representing a different “experiment”. To formalize
this, let us agree that a *test space* is a non-empty
collection A of non-empty sets \(E,F,\ldots\), each construed as a
discrete outcome-set as in classical probability theory. Each set \(E
\in \mathcal{A}\) is called a *test*. The set \(X = \cup
\mathcal{A}\) of all outcomes of all tests belonging to
\(\mathcal{A}\) is called the *outcome space* of
\(\mathcal{A}\). Notice that we allow distinct tests to overlap, i.e.,
to have outcomes in
common.^{[10]}

If \(\mathcal{A}\) is a test space with outcome-space \(X\), a
*state* on \(\mathcal{A}\) is a mapping \(\omega : X
\rightarrow\) [0,1] such that \(\sum_{x\in E} \omega(x) = 1\) for
every test \(E \in \mathcal{A}\). Thus, a state is a consistent
assignment of a probability weight to each test—consistent in
that, where two distinct tests share a common outcome, the state
assigns that outcome the same probability whether it is secured as a
result of one test or the other. (This may be regarded as a normative
requirement on the outcome-identifications implicit in the structure
of \(\mathcal{A}\): if outcomes of two tests are not equiprobable in
all states, they ought not to be identified.) The set of all states on
\(\mathcal{A}\) is denoted by \(\Omega(\mathcal{A})\). This is a
convex set, but in contrast to the situation in discrete classical
probability theory, it is generally not a simplex.

The concept of a random variable admits several generalizations to the
setting of test spaces. Let us agree that a *simple (real-valued)
random variable* on a test space \(\mathcal{A}\) is a mapping \(f
: E \rightarrow \mathbf{R}\) where \(E\) is a test in \(\mathcal{A}\).
We define the *expected value* of \(f\) in a state \(\omega \in
\Omega(\mathcal{A})\) in the obvious way, namely, as the expected
value of \(f\) with respect to the probability weight obtained by
restricting \(\omega\) to \(E\) (provided, of course, that this
expected value exists). One can go on to define more general classes
of random variables by taking suitable limits (for details, see Younce
[1987]).

In classical probability theory (and especially in classical
statistics) one usually focuses, not on the set of all possible
probability weights, but on some designated subset of these (e.g.,
those belonging to a given family of distributions). Accordingly, by a
*probabilistic model*, I mean pair \((\mathcal{A},\Delta)\)
consisting of a test space \(\mathcal{A}\) and a designated set of
states \(\Delta \subseteq \Omega(\mathcal{A})\) on \(\mathcal{A}\).
I’ll refer to \(\mathcal{A}\) as the *test space* and to
\(\Delta\) as the *state space* of the model.

I’ll now indicate how this framework can accommodate both the usual measure-theoretic formalism of full-blown classical probability theory and the Hilbert-space formalism of quantum probability theory.

### 3.3 Kolmogorovian Probability Theory

Let \(S\) be a set, understood for the moment as the state-space of a physical system, and let \(\Sigma\) be a \(\sigma\)-algebra of subsets of \(S\). We can regard each partition \(E\) of \(S\) into countably many pair-wise disjoint \(\Sigma\)-measurable subsets as representing a “coarse-grained” approximation to an imagined perfect experiment that would reveal the state of the system. Let \(\mathcal{A}_{\Sigma}\) be the test space consisting of all such partitions. Note that the outcome set for \(\mathcal{A}_{\Sigma}\) is the set \(X = \Sigma \setminus \{\varnothing \}\) of non-empty \(\Sigma\)-measurable subsets of \(S\). Evidently, the probability weights on \(\mathcal{A}_{\Sigma}\) correspond exactly to the countably additive probability measures on \(\Sigma\).

### 3.4 Quantum Probability Theory

Let \(\mathbf{H}\) denote a complex Hilbert space and let \(\mathcal{A}_{\mathbf{H}}\) denote the collection of (unordered) orthonormal bases of \(\mathbf{H}\). Thus, the outcome-space \(X\) of \(\mathcal{A}_{\mathbf{H}}\) will be the unit sphere of \(\mathbf{H}\). Note that if \(u\) is any unit vector of \(\mathbf{H}\) and \(E \in \mathcal{A}_{\mathbf{H}}\) is any orthonormal basis, we have

\[\sum_{x\in E} \lvert\langle u,x\rangle\rvert^2 = \llvert u\rrvert ^2 = 1\]Thus, each unit vector of \(\mathbf{H}\) determines a probability weight on \(\mathcal{A}_{\mathbf{H}}\). Quantum mechanics asks us to take this literally: any “maximal” discrete quantum-mechanical observable is modeled by an orthonormal basis, and any pure quantum mechanical state, by a unit vector in exactly this way. Conversely, every orthonormal basis and every unit vector are understood to correspond to such a measurement and such a state.

Gleason’s theorem can now be invoked to identify the states on \(\mathcal{A}_{\mathbf{H}}\) with the density operators on \(\mathbf{H}\): to each state \(\omega\) in \(\Omega(\mathcal{A}_{\mathbf{H}})\) there corresponds a unique density operator \(W\) such that, for every unit vector \(x\) of \(\mathbf{H}, \omega(x) = \langle Wx,x\rangle = Tr(WP_x), P_x\) being the one-dimensional projection associated with \(x\). Conversely, of course, every such density operator defines a unique state by the formula above. We can also represent simple real-valued random variables operator-theoretically. Each bounded simple random variable \(f\) gives rise to a bounded self-adjoint operator \(A = \sum_{x\in E} f(x)P_x\). The spectral theorem tells us that every self-adjoint operator on \(\mathbf{H}\) can be obtained by taking suitable limits of operators of this form.

## 4. Logics associated with probabilistic models

Associated with any statistical model \((\mathcal{A},\Delta)\) are
several partially ordered sets, each of which has some claim to the
status of an “empirical logic” associated with the model.
In this section, I’ll discuss two: the so-called *operational
logic* \(\Pi(\mathcal{A})\) and the *property lattice*
\(\mathbf{L}(\mathcal{A},\Delta)\). Under relatively benign conditions
on \(\mathcal{A}\), the former is an *orthoalgebra*. The latter
is always a complete lattice, and under plausible further assumptions,
atomic. Moreover, there is a natural order preserving mapping from
\(\Pi\) to \(\mathbf{L}\). This is not generally an order-isomorphism,
but when it is, we obtain a complete orthomodular lattice, and thus
come a step closer to the projection lattice of a Hilbert space.

### 4.1 Operational Logics

If \(\mathcal{A}\) is a test space, an \(\mathcal{A}\)*-event*
is a set of \(\mathcal{A}\)-outcomes that is contained in some test.
In other words, an \(\mathcal{A}\)-event is simply an event in the
classical sense for any one of the tests belonging to \(\mathcal{A}\).
Now, if \(A\) and \(B\) are two \(\mathcal{A}\)-events, we say that
\(A\) and \(B\) are *orthogonal*, and write \(A\binbot B\), if
they are disjoint and their union is again an event. We say that two
orthogonal events are *complements* of one another if their
union is a test. We say that events \(A\) and \(B\) are
*perspective*, and write \(A\sim B\), if they share any common
complement. (Notice that any two tests \(E\) and \(F\) are
perspective, since they are both complementary to the empty
event.)

**4.1 Definition**:

A test space \(\mathcal{A}\) is said to be *algebraic* if for
all events \(A, B, C\) of \(\mathcal{A}\), \(A\sim B \binbot C\)
implies \(A\binbot C\).

While it is possible to construct perfectly plausible examples of test spaces that are not algebraic, many test spaces that one encounters in nature do enjoy this property. In particular, the Borel and quantum test spaces described in the preceding section are algebraic. The more important point is that, as an axiom, algebraicity is relatively benign, in the sense that many test spaces can be “completed” to become algebraic. In particular, if every outcome has probability greater than 1/2 in at least one state, then \(\mathcal{A}\) is contained in an algebraic test space \(\mathcal{B}\) having the same outcomes and the same states as \(\mathcal{A}\) (see Gudder [1989] for details).

It can be
shown^{[11]}
that test space \(\mathcal{A}\) is algebraic if and only if it
satisfies the condition

For all events \(A, B\) of \(\mathcal{A}\), if \(A\sim B\), then any complement of \(B\) is a complement of \(A\).

From this, it is not hard to see that, for an algebraic test space
\(\mathcal{A}\), the relation \(\sim \) of perspectivity is then an
equivalence relation on the set of \(\mathcal{A}\)-events. More than
this, if \(\mathcal{A}\) is algebraic, then \(\sim \) is a
*congruence* for the partial binary operation of forming unions
of orthogonal events: in other words, for all \(\mathcal{A}\)-events
\(A, B\), and \(C, A\sim B\) and \(B\binbot C\) imply that \(A\binbot
C\) and \(A\cup C \sim B\cup C\).

Let \(\Pi(\mathcal{A})\) be the set of equivalence classes of
\(\mathcal{A}\)-events under perspectivity, and denote the equivalence
class of an event \(A\) by \(p(A)\); we then have a natural partial
binary operation on \(\Pi(\mathcal{A})\) defined by \(p(A)\oplus p(B)
= p(A\cup B)\) for orthogonal events \(A\) and \(B\). Setting 0 :\(=
p(\varnothing)\) and 1 :\(= p(E), E\) any member of \(\mathcal{A}\),
we obtain a partial-algebraic structure \((\Pi(\mathcal{A}),\oplus
,0,1)\), called the *logic* of \(\mathcal{A}\). This satisfies
the following conditions:

- \(\oplus\) is associative and commutative:
- If \(a\oplus(b\oplus c)\) is defined, so is \((a\oplus b)\oplus c\), and the two are equal
- If \(a\oplus b\) is defined, so is \(b\oplus a\), and the two are equal.

- \(0\oplus a = a\), for every \(a \in \mathbf{L}\)
- For every \(a \in \mathbf{L}\), there exists a unique \(a' \in \mathbf{L}\) with \(a\oplus a' = 1\)
- \(a\oplus a\) exists only if \(a = 0\)

We may now define:

**4.2 Definition**:

A structure \((\mathbf{L},\oplus ,0,1)\) satisfying conditions
(a)–(d) above is called an *orthoalgebra*.

Thus, the logic of an algebraic test space is an orthoalgebra. One can show that, conversely, every orthoalgebra arises as the logic \(\Pi(\mathcal{A})\) of an algebraic test space \(\mathcal{A}\) (Golfin 1988). Note that non-isomorphic test spaces can have isomorphic logics.

### 4.2 Orthocoherence

Any orthoalgebra \(\mathbf{L}\) is partially ordered by the relation
\(a\le b\) iff \(b = a\oplus c\) for some \(c\binbot a\). Relative to
this ordering, the mapping \(a\rightarrow a'\) is an
orthocomplementation and \(a\binbot b\) iff \(a\le b'\). It can be
shown that \(a\oplus b\) is always a minimal upper bound for \(a\) and
\(b\), but it is generally not the *least* upper bound. Indeed,
we have the following [ref]:

**4.3 Lemma**:

For an orthoalgebra \((\mathbf{L},\oplus ,0,1)\), the following are
equivalent:

- \(a\oplus b = a\vee b\), for all \(a, b\) in \(\mathbf{L}\)
- If \(a\oplus b, b\oplus c\), and \(c\oplus a\) all exist, then so does \(a\oplus b\oplus c\)
- The orthoposet \((\mathbf{L},\le ,')\) is
*orthomodular*, i.e., for all \(a, b\in L\), if \(a\le b\) then \((b \wedge a') \vee a\) exists and equals \(b\).

An orthoalgebra satisfying condition (b) is said to be
*orthocoherent*. In other words: an orthoalgebra is
orthocoherent if and only if finite pairwise summable subsets of
\(\mathbf{L}\) are jointly summable. The lemma tells us that every
orthocoherent orthoalgebra is, *inter alia*, an orthomodular
poset. Conversely, an orthocomplemented poset is orthomodular iff
\(a\oplus b = a\vee b\) is defined for all pairs with \(a\le b'\) and
the resulting partial binary operation is associative—in which
case the resulting structure \((\mathbf{L},\oplus ,0,1)\) is an
orthocoherent orthoalgebra, the canonical ordering on which agrees
with the given ordering on \(\mathbf{L}\). Thus, orthomodular posets
(the framework for Mackey’s version of quantum logic) are
equivalent to orthocoherent orthoalgebras.

A condition related to, but stronger than, orthocoherence is that any
pairwise *compatible* propositions should be jointly
compatible. This is sometimes called *regularity*. Most
naturally occurring orthomodular lattices and posets are regular. In
particular, Harding (1996, 1998) has shown that the direct-product
decompositions of any algebraic, relational or topological structure
can be organized in a natural way into a regular orthomodular
poset.^{[12]}

Some version of orthocoherence or regularity was taken by Mackey and many of his successors as an axiom. (Orthocoherence appears, in an infinitary form, as Mackey’s axiom V; regularity appears in the definition of a partial Boolean algebra in the work of Kochen and Specker (1965).) However, it is quite easy to construct simple model test spaces, having perfectly straightforward—even classical—interpretations, the logics of which are not orthocoherent. There has never been given any entirely compelling reason for regarding orthocoherence as an essential feature of all reasonable physical models. Moreover, certain apparently quite well-motivated constructions that one wants to perform with test spaces tend to destroy orthocoherence (see section 7).

### 4.3 Lattices of Properties

The decision to accept measurements and their outcomes as primitive
concepts in our description of physical systems does not mean that we
must forgo talk of the physical properties of such a system. Indeed,
such talk is readily accommodated in the present framework.
formalism.^{[13]}
In the approach we have been pursuing, a physical system is
represented by a probabilistic model \((\mathcal{A},\Delta)\), and the
system’s states are identified with the probability weights in
\(\Delta\). Classically, *any* subset \(\Gamma\) of the
state-space \(\Delta\) corresponds to a categorical property of the
system. However, in quantum mechanics, and indeed even classically,
not every such property will be testable (or “physical”).
In quantum mechanics, only subsets of the state-space corresponding to
closed subspaces of the Hilbert space are testable; in classical
mechanics, one usually takes only, e.g., Borel sets to correspond to
testable properties: the difference is that the testable properties in
the latter case happen still to form a Boolean algebra of sets, where
in the former case, they do not.

One way to frame this distinction is as follows. The *support*
of a set of states \(\Gamma \subseteq \Delta\) is the set

of outcomes that are possible when the property \(\Gamma\) obtains.
There is a sense in which two properties are empirically
indistinguishable if they have the same support: we cannot distinguish
between them by means of a single execution of a single test. We might
therefore wish to identify physical properties with classes of
physically indistinguishable classical properties, or, equivalently,
with their associated supports. However, if we wish to adhere to the
programme of representing physical properties as subsets (rather than
as equivalence-classes of subsets) of the state-space, we can do so,
as follows. Define a mapping \(F : \wp(X) \rightarrow \wp(\Delta)\) by
\(F(J) = \{\omega \in \Delta \mid S(\omega) \subseteq J \}\). The
mapping \(\Gamma \rightarrow F(S(\Gamma))\) is then a *closure
operator* on \(\wp(\Delta)\), and the collection of closed sets
(that is, the range of \(F)\) is a complete lattice of sets, closed
under arbitrary
intersection.^{[14]}
Evidently, classical properties—subsets of
\(\Delta\)—have the same support iff they have the same closure,
so we may identify physical properties with closed subsets of the
state-space:

**4.4 Definition**:

The *property lattice* of the model \((\mathcal{A},\Delta)\) is
the complete lattice \(\mathbf{L} = \mathbf{L}(\mathcal{A},\Delta)\)
of all subsets of \(\Delta\) of the form \(F(J), J\) any set of
outcomes.^{[15]}

We now have two different “logics” associated with an entity \((\mathcal{A},\Delta)\) with \(\mathcal{A}\) algebraic: a “logic” \(\Pi(\mathcal{A})\) of experimental propositions that is an orthoalgebra, but generally not a lattice, and a “logic” \(\mathbf{L}(\mathcal{A},\Delta)\) of properties that is a complete lattice, but rarely orthocomplemented in any natural way (Randall and Foulis 1983). The two are connected by a natural mapping [ ] : \(\Pi \rightarrow \mathbf{L}\), given by \(p \rightarrow[p] = F(J_p)\) where for each \(p\in \Pi\), \(J_p = \{x\in X \mid p(x) \nleq p' \}\). That is, \(J_p\) is the set of outcomes that are consistent with \(p\), and [\(p\)] is the largest (i.e., weakest) physical property making \(p\) certain to be confirmed if tested.

The mapping \(p \rightarrow[p\)] is order preserving. For both the
classical and quantum-mechanical models considered above, it is in
fact an order-isomorphism. Whenever this is the case, \(\Pi\) will
inherit from \(\mathbf{L}\) the structure of a complete lattice, which
will then automatically be orthomodular by Lemma 4.3. In other words,
in such cases we have only *one* logic, which is a complete
orthomodular lattice. While it is surely too much to expect that [ ]
will be an order-isomorphism every *conceivable* physical
system—indeed, we can easily construct toy examples to the
contrary—the condition is at least reasonably transparent in its
meaning.

## 5. Piron’s Theorem

Suppose that the logic and property lattices of a model *are*
isomorphic, so that the logic of propositions/properties is a complete
orthomodular lattice. The question then arises: how close does this
bring us to quantum mechanics—that is, to the projection lattice
\(L(\mathbf{H})\) of a Hilbert space?

The answer is: without additional assumptions, not very. The lattice
\(L(\mathbf{H})\) has several quite special order-theoretic features.
First it is *atomic*—every element is the join of minimal
non-zero elements (i.e., one-dimensional subspaces). Second, it is
*irreducible*—it can not be expressed as a non-trivial
direct product of simpler
OMLs.^{[16]}
Finally, and most significantly, it satisfies the so-called
*atomic covering law*: if \(p \in L(\mathbf{H})\) is an atom
and \(p\nleq q\), then \(p \vee q\) *covers* \(q\) (no element
of \(L(\mathbf{H})\) lies strictly between \(p \vee q\) and
\(q)\).

These properties still do not quite suffice to capture
\(L(\mathbf{H})\), but they do get us into the right ballpark. Let
\(\mathbf{V}\) be any inner product space over an involutive division
ring \(D\). A subspace \(\mathbf{M}\) of \(\mathbf{V}\) is said to be
\(\bot\)-*closed* iff \(\mathbf{M} = \mathbf{M}^{\bot \bot}\),
where \(\mathbf{M}^{\bot} = \{v\in \mathbf{V} \mid \forall m\in
\mathbf{M}( \langle v,m\rangle = 0)\}\). Ordered by set-inclusion, the
collection \(L(\mathbf{V})\) of all \(\bot\)-closed subspaces of
\(\mathbf{V}\) forms a complete atomic lattice, orthocomplemented by
the mapping \(\mathbf{M} \rightarrow \mathbf{M}^{\bot}\). A theorem of
Amemiya and Araki (1966) shows that a real, complex or quaternionic
inner product space \(\mathbf{V}\) with \(L(\mathbf{V})\)
orthomodular, is necessarily complete. For this reason, an inner
product space \(\mathbf{V}\) over an involutive division ring is
called a *generalized Hilbert space* if its
lattice\(L(\mathbf{V})\) of \(\bot\)-closed subspaces is orthomodular.
The following representation theorem is due to C. Piron [1964]:

**5.1 Theorem**:

Let \(L\) be a complete, atomic, irreducible orthomodular lattice
satisfying the atomic covering law. If \(L\) contains at least 4
orthogonal atoms, then there exists an involutive division ring \(D\)
and a generalized Hilbert space \(\mathbf{V}\) over \(D\) such that
\(L\) is isomorphic to \(L(\mathbf{V})\).

It should be noted that generalized Hilbert spaces have been
constructed over fairly exotic division
rings.^{[17]}
Thus, while it brings us tantalizingly close, Piron’s theorem
does not quite bring us all the way back to orthodox quantum
mechanics.

### 5.1 Conditioning and the Covering Law

Let us call a complete orthomodular lattice satisfying the hypotheses
of Piron’s theorem a *Piron lattice*. Can we give any
general reason for supposing that the logic/property lattice of a
physical system (one for which these are isomorphic) is a Piron
lattice? Or, failing this, can we at least ascribe some clear physical
content to these assumptions? The atomicity of \(L\) follows if we
assume that every pure state represents a “physical
property”. This is a strong assumption, but its content seems
clear enough. Irreducibility is usually regarded as a benign
assumption, in that a reducible system can be decomposed into its
irreducible parts, to each of which Piron’s Theorem applies.

The covering law presents a more delicate problem. While it is
probably safe to say that no simple and entirely compelling argument
has been given for assuming its general validity, Piron [1964, 1976]
and others (e.g., Beltrametti and Cassinelli [1981] and Guz [1978])
have derived the covering law from assumptions about the way in which
measurement results warrant inference from an initial state to a final
state. Here is a brief sketch of how this argument goes. Suppose that
there is some reasonable way to define, for an initial state \(q\) of
the system, represented by an atom of the logic/property lattice
\(L\), a final state \(\phi_p (q)\)—either another atom, or
perhaps 0—conditional on the proposition \(p\) having been
confirmed. Various arguments can be adduced suggesting that the only
reasonable candidate for such a mapping is the *Sasaki
projection* \(\phi_p : L \rightarrow L\), defined by

\(\phi_p (q) = (q \vee p') \wedge
p\).^{[18]}

It can be shown that an atomic OML satisfies the atomic covering law just in case Sasaki projections take atoms again to atoms, or to 0. Another interesting view of the covering law is developed by Cohen and Svetlichny [1987].

## 6. Classical Representations

The perennial question in the interpretation of quantum mechanics is
that of whether or not essentially classical explanations are
available, even in principle, for quantum-mechanical phenomena.
Quantum logic has played a large role in shaping (and clarifying) this
discussion, in particular by allowing us to be quite precise about
what we *mean* by a classical explanation.

### 6.1 Classical Embeddings

Suppose we are given a statistical model \((\mathcal{A},\Delta)\). A
very straightforward approach to constructing a “classical
interpretation” of \((\mathcal{A},\Delta)\) would begin by
trying to embed \(\mathcal{A}\) in a Borel test space \(\mathcal{B}\),
with the hope of then accounting for the statistical states in
\(\delta\) as averages over “hidden” classical—that
is, dispersion-free—states on the latter. Thus, we’d want
to find a set \(S\) and a mapping \(X \rightarrow \wp(S)\) assigning
to each outcome \(x\) of \(\mathcal{A}\) a *set* \(x* \subseteq
S\) in such a way that, for each test \(E \in \mathcal{A}, \{x* \mid x
\in E\}\) forms a partition of \(S\). If this can be done, then each
outcome \(x\) of \(\mathcal{A}\) simply records the fact that the
system is in one of a certain set of states, namely, \(x\)*. If we let
\(\Sigma\) be the \(\sigma\)-algebra of sets generated by sets of the
form \(\{x* \mid x \in X\}\), we find that each probability measure
\(\mu\) on \(\Sigma\) pulls back to a state \(\mu\)* on
\(\mathcal{A}\), namely, \(\mu *(x) = \mu(x\)*). So long as every
state in \(\delta\) is of this form, we may claim to have given a
completely classical interpretation of the model
\((\mathcal{A},\Delta)\).

The minimal candidate for \(S\) is the set of *all*
dispersion-free states on \(\mathcal{A}\). Setting \(x* = \{s\in S
\mid s(x) = 1\}\) gives us a classical interpretation as above, which
I’ll call the *classical image* of \(\mathcal{A}\). Any
other classical interpretation factors through this one. Notice,
however, that the mapping \(x \rightarrow x\)* is injective only if
there are sufficiently many dispersion-free states to separate
distinct outcomes of \(\mathcal{A}\). If \(\mathcal{A}\) has \(no\)
dispersion-free states at all, then its classical image is
*empty*. Gleason’s theorem tells us that this is the case
for quantum-mechanical models. Thus, this particular kind of classical
explanation is not available for quantum mechanical models.

It is sometimes overlooked that, even if a test space \(\mathcal{A}\)
does have a separating set of dispersion-free states, there may exist
statistical states on \(\mathcal{A}\) that *can not* be
realized as mixtures of these. The classical image provides no
explanation for such states. For a very simple example of this sort of
thing, consider the the test space:

and the state \(\omega(a) = \omega(b) = \omega(c) = \frac{1}{2}\), \(\omega(x) = \omega(y) = \omega(z) = 0\). It is a simple exercise to show that \(\omega\) cannot be expressed as a weighted average of \(\{0,1\}\)-valued states on \(\mathcal{A}\). For further examples and discussion of this point, see Wright 1980.

### 6.2 Contextual Hidden Variables

The upshot of the foregoing discussion is that most test spaces
can’t be embedded into any classical test space, and that even
where such an embedding exists, it typically fails to account for some
of the model’s states. However, there is one very important
class of models for which a satisfactory classical interpretation is
*always* possible. Let us call a test space \(\mathcal{A}\)
*semi-classical* if its tests do not overlap; i.e., if \(E \cap
F = \varnothing\) for \(E, F \in \mathcal{A}\), with \(E\ne F\).

**6.1 Lemma**:

Let \(\mathcal{A}\) be semi-classical. Then \(\mathcal{A}\) has a
separating set of dispersion-free states, and every extreme state on
\(\mathcal{A}\) is dispersion-free.

As long as \(\mathcal{A}\) is locally countable (i.e., no test \(E\) in \(\mathcal{A}\) is uncountable), every state can be represented as a convex combination, in a suitable sense, of extreme states (Wilce [1992]). Thus, every state of a locally countable semi-classical test space has a classical interpretation.

Even though neither Borel test spaces nor quantum test spaces are semi-classical, one might argue that in any real laboratory situation, semi-classicality is the rule. Ordinarily, when one writes down in one’s laboratory notebook that one has performed a given test and obtained a given outcome, one always has a record of which test was performed. Indeed, given any test space \(\mathcal{A}\), we may always form a semi-classical test space simply by forming the co-product (disjoint union) of the tests in \(\mathcal{A}\). More formally:

**6.2 Definition**:

For each test \(E\) in \(\mathcal{A}\), let \(E^{\sim} = \{ (x,E) \mid
x \in E \}\). The *semi-classical cover* of \(\mathcal{A}\) is
the test space

We can regard \(\mathcal{A}\) as arising from \(\mathcal{A}^{\sim}\)
by deletion of the record of which test was performed to secure a
given outcome. Note that every state on \(\mathcal{A}\) defines a
state \(\omega^{\sim}\) on \(\mathcal{A}^{\sim}\) by \(\omega^{\sim}
(x,E) = \omega(x)\). The mapping \(\omega \rightarrow \omega^{\sim}\)
is plainly injective; thus, we may identify the state-space of
\(\mathcal{A}\) with a subset of the state-space of
\(\mathcal{A}^{\sim}\). Notice that there will typically be many
states on \(\mathcal{A}^{\sim}\) that *do not* descend to
states on \(\mathcal{A}\). We might wish to think of these as
“non-physical”, since they do not respect the (presumably,
physically motivated) outcome-identifications whereby \(\mathcal{A}\)
is defined.

Since it is semi-classical, \(\mathcal{A}^{\sim}\) admits a classical
interpretation, as per Lemma 7.1. Let’s examine this. An element
of \(S(\mathcal{A}^{\sim}\)) amounts to a mapping \(f :
\mathcal{A}^{\sim} \rightarrow X\), assigning to each test \(E \in
\mathcal{A}\), an outcome \(f(E) \in E\). This is a (rather brutal)
example of what is meant by a *contextual (dispersion-free) hidden
variable*. The construction above tells us that such contextual
hidden variables will be available for statistical models quite
generally. For other results to the same effect, see Kochen and
Specker [1967], Gudder [1970], Holevo [1982], and, in a different
direction, Pitowsky
[1989].^{[19]}

Note that the simple random variables on \(\mathcal{A}\) correspond
exactly to the simple random variables on \(\mathcal{A}^{\sim}\), and
that these, in turn, correspond to *some* of the simple random
variables (in the usual sense) on the measurable space
\(S(\mathcal{A}^{\sim}\)). Thus, we have the following picture: The
model \((\mathcal{A},\Delta)\) can always be obtained from a classical
model simply by omitting some random variables, and identifying
outcomes that can no longer be distinguished by those that remain.

All of this might suggest that our generalized probability theory presents no significant conceptual departure from classical probability theory. On the other hand, models constructed along the foregoing lines have a distinctly ad hoc character. In particular, the set of “physical” states in one of the classical (or semi-classical) models constructed above is determined not by any independent physical principle, but only by consistency with the original, non-semiclassical model. Another objection is that the contextual hidden variables introduced in this section are badly non-local. It is by now widely recognized that this non-locality is the principal locus of non-classicality in quantum (and more general) probability models. (For more on this, see the entry on Bell’s theorem.)

## 7. Composite Systems

Some of the most puzzling features of quantum mechanics arise in connection with attempts to describe compound physical systems. It is in this context, for instance, that both the measurement problem and the non-locality results centered on Bell’s theorem arise. It is interesting that coupled systems also present a challenge to the quantum-logical programme. I will conclude this article with a description of two results that show that the coupling of quantum-logical models tends to move us further from the realm of Hilbert space quantum mechanics.

### 7.1 The Foulis-Randall Example

A particularly striking result in this connection is the observation of Foulis and Randall [1981a] that any reasonable (and reasonably general) tensor product of orthoalgebras will fail to preserve ortho-coherence. Consider the test space

\[\mathcal{A}_5 = \{\{a,x,b\}, \{b,y,c\}, \{c,z,d\}, \{d,w,e\}, \{e,v,a\}\}\]consisting of five three-outcome tests pasted together in a loop. This test space is by no means pathological; it is both ortho-coherent and algebraic, and its logic is an orthomodular lattice. Moreover, it admits a separating set of dispersion-free states and hence, a classical interpretation. It can also be embedded in the test space \(\mathcal{A}_{\mathbf{H}}\) of any 3-dimensional Hilbert space \(\mathbf{H}\). Now consider how we might model a compound system consisting of two separated sub-systems each modeled by \(\mathcal{A}_5\). We would need to construct a test space \(\mathcal{B}\) and a mapping \(\otimes : X \times X \rightarrow Y = \cup \mathcal{B}\) satisfying, minimally, the following;

- For all outcomes \(x, y, z \in X\), if \(x\binbot y\), then \(x\otimes z \binbot y\otimes z\) and \(z\otimes x \binbot z\otimes y\),
- For each pair of states \(\alpha , \beta \in \Omega(\mathcal{A}_5)\), there exists at least one state \(\omega\) on \(\mathcal{B}\) such that \(\omega(x\otimes y) = \alpha(x)\beta(y)\), for all outcomes \(x, y \in X\).

Foulis and Randall show that no such embedding exists for which \(\mathcal{B}\) is orthocoherent. Indeed, suppose we have a test space \(\mathcal{B}\) and an embedding satisfying conditions (a) and (b). Consider the set of outcomes

\[S = \{a \otimes b, b \otimes e, c \otimes c, d \otimes a, e \otimes d\}.\]By (a), this set is pairwise orthogonal. Now let \(\alpha\) be the state on \(\mathcal{A}_5\) taking the value 1/2 on outcomes \(a, b, c, d\) and \(e\), and the value 0 on \(x, y, z, w\) and \(v\). By condition (b), there exists state \(\omega\) on \(\mathcal{B}\) such that

\[\omega(s \otimes t) = \alpha(s) \alpha(t)\]for all outcomes \(s, t\) in \(X\). But this state takes the constant value 1/4 on the set \(S\), whence, it sums over this set to \(5/4 \gt 1\). Hence, \(S\) is not an event, and \(\mathcal{B}\) is not orthocoherent.

It is important to emphasize here that the test space
\(\mathcal{A}_5\) has a perfectly unproblematic quantum-mechanical
interpretation, as it can be realized as a set of orthonormal bases in
a 3-dimensional Hilbert space \(\mathbf{H}\). However, the
*state* \(\omega\) figuring in the Foulis-Randall example
cannot arise quantum-mechanically (much less classically). (Indeed,
this follows from the example itself: the canonical mapping
\(\mathbf{H} \times \mathbf{H} \rightarrow \mathbf{H} \otimes
\mathbf{H}\) provides a mapping satisfying the conditions (a) and (b)
above. Since \(\mathbf{L}(\mathbf{H} \otimes \mathbf{H})\) is
orthocoherent, the set S corresponds to a pairwise orthogonal family
of projections, over which a quantum-mechanical state would have to
sum to no more than 1.)

### 7.2 Aerts’ Theorem

Another result having a somewhat similar force is that of Aerts
[1981]. If \(L_1\) and \(L_2\) are two Piron lattices, Aerts
constructs in a rather natural way a lattice \(L\) representing two
*separated* systems, each modeled by one of the given lattices.
Here “separated” means that each pure state of the larger
system \(L\) is entirely determined by the states of the two component
systems \(L_1\) and \(L_2\). Aerts then shows that \(L\) is again a
Piron lattice iff at least one of the two factors \(L_1\) and \(L_2\)
is classical. (This result has recently been strengthened by Ischi
[2000] in several ways.)

### 7.3 Ramifications

The thrust of these no-go results is that straightforward
constructions of plausible models for composite systems destroy
regularity conditions (ortho-coherence in the case of the
Foulis-Randall result, orthomodularity and the covering law in that of
Aerts’ result) that have widely been used to underwrite
reconstructions of the usual quantum-mechanical formalism. This puts
in doubt whether any of these conditions can be regarded as having the
universality that the most optimistic version of Mackey’s
programme asks for. Of course, this does not rule out the possibility
that these conditions may yet be motivated in the case of especially
*simple* physical systems.

In some quarters, the fact that the most traditional models of quantum
logics lack a reasonable tensor product have have been seen as
heralding the collapse of the entire quantum-logical enterprise. This
reaction is premature. The Foulis-Randall example, for instance, shows
that there can be no general tensor product that behaves properly on
*all* orthomodular lattices or orthomodular posets (that is,
orthocoherent orthoalgebras), *and* on *all* states
thereon. This does not rule out the existence of a satisfactory tensor
product for classes of structures *larger* than that of
orthomodular posets, or *smaller* than that of orthomodular
lattices, or for classes of orthomodular lattices or posets with
restricted state spaces. And indeed, as Foulis and Randall showed in
Foulis and Randall [1981a], the class of unital
orthoalgebras—that is, orthoalgebras in which every proposition
has probability 1 in some state—*does* support a
canonical tensor product satisfying their conditions (a) and (b).

Moving in the opposite direction, one can take it as an axiomatic requirement that a satisfactory physical theory be closed under some reasonable device for coupling separated systems. This suggests taking classes of systems, i.e., physical theories, as distinct from individual systems, as the focus of attention. And in fact, this is exactly the trend in much current work on the foundations of quantum mechanics.

A particularly fruitful approach of this kind, due to Abramsky and Coecke [2009] takes a physical theory to be represented by a symmetric monoidal category—roughly, a category equipped with a naturally symmetric and associative tensor product. Subject to some further constraints (e.g., compact closure), such categories exhibit formal properties strikingly reminiscent of quantum mechanics. Interestingly, it has recently been shown by Harding [2009] that, in every strongly compact closed category with biproducts, every object is associated with an orthomodular poset Proj\((A)\) of “weak projections”, and that Proj\((A \otimes B)\) behaves in many respects as a sensible tensor product for Proj\((A)\) and Proj\((B)\).

This recent emphasis on systems in interaction is part of a more
general shift of attention away from the static structure of states
and observables and towards the *processes* in which physical
systems can participate. This trend is evident not only in the
category-theoretic formulation of Abramsky and Coecke (see also Coecke
[2011]), but also in several recent axiomatic treatments of quantum
theory. For example, Chiribella-D’Ariano-Perinotti ([2011]) and
Rau ([2011]), working in a generalized probabilistic framework, make
use of postulates relating measurements to dynamics. In a different
direction, Baltag and Smets ([2005]) enrich a Piron-style
lattice-theoretic framework with an explicitly dynamical element,
arriving at a quantum analogue of propositional dynamical logic.

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## Other Internet Resources

- Cabello, Adan, 2012, “Specker’s fundamental principle of quantum mechanics”, unpublished paper, arXiv:1212.1756
- Henson, Joe, 2012, “Quantum contextuality from a simple principle?”, unpublished manuscript, arXiv:1210.5978