Notes to Challenges to Metaphysical Realism

1. That is to say that the meanings of the quantifiers do not change across different logical categories: to say that numbers as well as material objects exist is not to invoke two different senses of the predicate exist. As van Inwagen puts it: The meaning of a quantifier does not change when one applies it to objects in different logical categories or any kind of categories you like. Note we have omitted the units of measurement van Inwagen uses in his argument to simplify the presentation.

2. See Fodor and Lepore 2002 for discussion of the centrality of compositionality for language understanding.

3. Vann McGee [2015, p. 398] argues that Quine (and, by implication, Dummett) is right to insist on the publicity of meaning if natural languages are to be communally shared:

Giving up linguistic behaviourism is more than just relinquishing a psychological theory that is no longer in fashion. It means giving up the idea that meaning in public language is public property, something shared by a community of speakers. We can’t share one another’s mental states, so if meanings are shared by a community, mental states can’t determine meaning. If knowing the meaning of a word only requires a disposition to produce appropriate verbal behaviours, then a child can learn the meaning of a word by watching what her elders do, and her elders can tell when she’s learnt it correctly by watching what the child does. But how can the parents praise the child for using her words correctly if correct usage requires not just correct behaviour but a correct concomitant mental state?

4. The ability to tell whether pronouns have anaphoric readings is a recognitional ability if anything is. Chomsky believes that it is precisely such recognitional abilities which a theory of language acquisition has to explain. Dummett, on the other hand, wishes to explain semantic understanding by means of recognitional abilities. Chomsky’s puzzlement is evident from his defence of his position against Dummett’s animadversions:

Thus, according to the theory that Dummett finds problematic or unintelligible, a person has knowledge of the principles of binding theory, and from these and others discussed, it follows that … in 9(i) I wonder who [the men expected to see them], the pronoun them may be referentially dependent on the men, whereas in 9(ii) [The men expected to see them], it may not. That this is so is conscious knowledge, among the numerous consequences of principles of UG, which are surely not accessible to consciousness. … We do not, of course, have a clear account, or any account at all, of why certain elements of our knowledge are accessible to consciousness whereas others are not, or of how knowledge, conscious or not, is manifested in our behaviour. [1986: 270]

5. Even more surprisingly, 2 day old chicks exposed to occluded objects for the first time do so as well [Spelke 2003]. Chicks who in their first day of life had imprinted on a centre-occluded object were placed in an unfamiliar cage on their second day and presented with a choice between two versions of the object placed at opposite ends of the cage. In one version, the visible ends were connected; in the other these ends were separated by a visible gap matching the occluder they’d seen the day before. “Chicks selectively approached the connected object, providing evidence that they, like human infants, had perceived the imprinted object to continue behind its occluder” [Spelke 2003, p.283].]

6. For similar reasons, David Chalmers argues that the Brain-in-a-Vat hypothesis is not a sceptical hypothesis but a metaphysical hypothesis [Chalmers 2010] which could be true.

7. On this view ‘elephant’ may partially refer to elephants according to one acceptable reference assignment and may partially refer to elephant-stages or undetached elephant parts according to other such assignments, but not refer, even partially, to quolls or quarks. In this spirit, Hartry Field has argued that an objective referential indeterminacy he calls ‘correlative indeterminacy’ could exist quite undetected in linguistic practices such as ours that assume determinacy of reference for terms [Field 1998]:

If ‘entropy’ partially refers to \(E_1\) and \(E_2\), then we can say that relative to an assignment of \(E_1\) to ‘entropy’, ‘refers’ refers to a relation that holds between ‘entropy’ and only one thing, viz. \(E_1\); and analogously for \(E_2\). In this way we can get the result that even if ‘entropy’ partially refers to many things (and hence does not determinately refer to anything), still the sentence “‘Entropy’ refers to entropy and nothing else” comes out true. (Indeed, determinately true: true on every acceptable combination of the partial referents of ‘entropy’ and ‘refers’). The advocate of indeterminacy can still ‘speak with the vulgar’. [loc. cit., p. 254]

8. Discussing this issue in connection with set theory, Timothy Bays writes [Bays 2001]:

When a philosopher claims that the intended models of set theory should be transitive, she is describing the structures which are to count as models for her axioms; she isn’t just adding new sentences to be interpreted at Putnam’s favorite models. Similarly, when she claims that intended models should satisfy second-order ZFC, she is explaining which semantics (and, more specifically, which satisfaction relation) her axioms should be interpreted under; she isn’t just adding new axioms to be interpreted under a (first-order) semantics of Putnam’s choosing.

9. Putnam [Putnam 2015] eventually came to reject the Model-Theoretic Argument. Quoting his former self (the author of ‘Realism and Reason’) who had written [Putnam, H. 1978: 125]:

The most important consequence of metaphysical realism is that truth is supposed to be radically nonepistemic — we might be ‘brains in a vat’ and so the theory that is ‘ideal’ from the point of view of operational utility, inner beauty and elegance, ‘plausibility’, simplicity, ‘conservatism,’ etc. might be false. … It is this feature that distinguishes metaphysical realism … And it is this feature that I shall attack.

Putnam [ibid. 2015, pp.315–316] commented:

The thesis that a theory ‘ideal as far as we can tell’ might actually be false simply amounts to the claim that a statement that we are epistemically entitled to accept as part of our best theory of the world might be false, and there might be no way of verifying that it is false. And I agree with Maudlin that there are such statements.… Truth is not the same thing as warranted assertibility under ideal conditions. ‘Realism and Reason’ was wrong.

What might have led to this about-face? It is hard to know for sure but one source of dissatisfaction with the idea of truth as idealized assertibility for Putnam appears to have been statements about the past. Witness his reply to Gary Ebbs in Philosophical Topics 20: The Philosophy of Hilary Putnam, C. Hill ed. no.1, 1992:

I have repeatedly argued that any theory of truth that makes the truth or falsity of a historical claim depend on whether that claim can be decided in the future is radically misguided.

10. Michael Dummett had argued tirelessly for a meaning-theoretic foundation for metaphysics. His pleas went largely unheeded. Philosophical consensus until quite recently, certainly amongst realists, was that metaphysical questions concerned the nature of reality whereas meaning-theoretic questions concerned our representations of reality. It is interesting, then, to witness the revival of a Dummettian view with metaontology now widely thought to require if not a meaning-theoretic foundation, a semantics for the quantifiers.

11. Thus, David Chalmers [2009, p.77] defines ontological realism to be the view that ontological facts are objective:

The meta-ontologist may ask: “is there an objective fact of the matter about whether the mereological sum of two distinct entities exists?” The ontological realist says yes, and the ontological anti-realist says no.

Ontological realists, in Chalmers’ sense, include nominalists who deny numbers and other abstract objects exist since they certainly agree there is an objective fact to the matter as to whether numbers exist — they don’t. Chalmers comments:

Note that ontological anti-realism about numbers should be distinguished from the sort of anti-realism about numbers that denies that numbers exist — somewhat confusingly, this form of anti-realism about numbers is a form of ontological realism about numbers! [ibid p.17]

In our terminology, Chalmers ‘ontological realists’ are ontological factualists. Nominalists, in our terms, although ontological factualists to the extent that they believe there is a fact to the matter as to whether numbers exist, are ontological anti-realist (about numbers) since they deny that numbers do exist.

12. Sider is surely right about this if what is at issue is ontological realism. What could it mean for the world to be an amorphous lump on which our conceptual frameworks impose a structure if not that the world has no mind-independent ontological properties of its own? However, Hirsch although skeptical about ontology can still justifiably claim to be a metaphysical realist if he believes that while certain ontological properties may be mind-dependent the ultimate constituents of the world are not. The idea that a pluralist conception of our descriptions of the world is consistent with metaphysical realism was promoted by Putnam [1987: 19]

Now the classic metaphysical realist way of dealing with such problems is well known (DK: Putnam is discussing a version of the Ernie/Max interchange about whether there are 3 or 7 objects in a certain situation). It is to say that there is a single world (think of this as a piece of dough) which we can slice into pieces in different ways. But this ‘cookie cutter’ metaphor founders on the question, ‘What are the parts of this dough?’

The ‘cookie cutter’ metaphor does founder on that question. But to think of the world or worldly contexts as pieces of dough that can be sliced in different ways is to abandon realism in favour of projectivist anti-realism. Metaphysical realists are committed to thinking of the world as having an intrinsic structure that awaits discovery. It is the conceptual pluralists (such as Putnam and Hirsch) who reject this picture in favour of the ‘cookie-cutter’ model if anyone does. Putnam’s argument effectively undercuts the ground for believing in conceptual pluralism.

In an earlier work, Putnam linked the realist’s failure to understand conceptual relativity to a failure to appreciate variation in the ‘logical primitives’ [Putnam 1987:17]:

… it is no accident that metaphysical realism cannot really recognize the phenomenon of conceptual relativity—for that phenomenon turns on the fact that the logical primitives themselves, and in particular the notions of object and existence, have a multitude of different uses rather than one absolute meaning.

13. The idea of Quantifier Variance was first mooted by Putnam [2004:37]

The symbol ‘\(\exists x\)’ and its ordinary language counterparts, the expression ‘there are’, ‘there exist’, … do not have a single absolutely precise use but a whole family of uses.

Hirsch’s formulation [Hirsch, E. 2002:68] focuses on ontology:

The world can be correctly described using a variety of concepts of the ‘existence of something’.

Discussing his mereological example, Putnam claimed [2004:38]:

There is nothing in the logic of existential and universal quantification to tell us whether we should say that mereological sums exist or don’t exist; nor is there some other science that answers this question. I suggest we can decide to say either.

Sider [2009, p. 397] concedes the reality of Quantifier Variance to Hirsch and believes that it poses the greatest threat to his ontological realism. He responds by extending Lewis’s idea of natural properties (e.g. the colour green as opposed to the ‘disjunctive’, hence unnatural, colour grue) which Lewis thought supplied eligible meanings for predicates, to logical terms, including the quantifiers. His idea is that there is a distinguished quantifier meaning in a language adequate for theorizing about ontology such that this meaning and this meaning alone is apt for describing the structure of the world.

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Drew Khlentzos <>

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