Challenges to Metaphysical Realism

First published Thu Jan 11, 2001; substantive revision Mon Jan 25, 2021

According to metaphysical realism, the world is as it is independent of how humans or other inquiring agents take it to be. The objects the world contains, together with their properties and the relations they enter into, fix the world’s nature and these objects [together with the properties they have and the relations they enter into] exist independently of our ability to discover they do. Unless this is so, metaphysical realists argue, none of our beliefs about our world could be objectively true since true beliefs tell us how things are and beliefs are objective when true or false independently of what anyone might think.

Many philosophers believe metaphysical realism is just plain common sense. Others believe it to be a direct implication of modern science, which paints humans as fallible creatures adrift in an inhospitable world not of their making. Nonetheless, metaphysical realism is controversial. Besides the analytic question of what it means to assert that objects exist independently of the mind, metaphysical realism also raises epistemological problems: how can we obtain knowledge of a mind-independent world? There are also prior semantic problems, such as how links are set up between our beliefs and the mind-independent states of affairs they allegedly represent. This is the Representation Problem.

Anti-realists deny the world is mind-independent. Believing the epistemological and semantic problems to be insoluble, they conclude realism must be false. The first anti-realist arguments based on explicitly semantic considerations were advanced by Michael Dummett and Hilary Putnam. These are:

1. Dummett’s Manifestation Argument: the cognitive and linguistic behaviour of an agent provides no evidence that realist mind/world links exist;
2. Dummett’s Language Acquisition Argument: if such links were to exist language learning would be impossible;
3. Putnam’s Brain-in-a-Vat Argument: realism entails both that we could be massively deluded (‘brains in a vat’) and that if we were we could not even form the belief that we were;
4. Putnam’s Conceptual Relativity Argument: it is senseless to ask what the world contains independently of how we conceive of it, since the objects that exist depend on the conceptual scheme used to classify them;
5. Putnam’s Model-Theoretic Argument: realists must either hold that an ideal theory passing every conceivable test could be false or that perfectly determinate terms like ‘cat’ are massively indeterminate, and both alternatives are absurd.

We’ll proceed by first defining metaphysical realism, illustrating its distinctive mind-independence claim with some examples and distinguishing it from other doctrines with which it is often confused, in particular factualism. We’ll then outline the Representation Problem in the course of presenting the anti-realist challenges to metaphysical realism that are based on it. We discuss metaphysical realist responses to these challenges, indicating how the debates have proceeded, suggesting various alternatives and countenancing anti-realist replies. We finish with a brief review of recent realist/anti-realist debates in meta-ontology.

1. What is Metaphysical Realism?

Metaphysical realism is the thesis that the objects, properties and relations the world contains, collectively: the structure of the world [Sider 2011], exists independently of our thoughts about it or our perceptions of it. Anti-realists either doubt or deny the existence of the structure the metaphysical realist believes in or else doubt or deny its independence from our conceptions of it. Realists about numbers, for example, hold that numbers exist mind-independently. This view is opposed by Nominalists who deny the existence of abstract objects and Intuitionists who agree numbers exist, but as mental constructions, denying their mind-independence. Some realists about laws of nature, to take an empirical example, hold that laws are relations between universals [Armstrong 1983], others that laws are ontologically primitive entities [Maudlin 2007]. Anti-realists about laws of nature, on the other hand, either deny there are any laws at all [Cartwright 1983; van Fraassen 1989] or else discern a dependence on human concepts in the nature of these laws, interpreting them as expressing certain expectations we have about regularities that we unconsciously project onto the world [Blackburn 1986].

Metaphysical realism is not the same as scientific realism. That the world’s constituents exist mind-independently does not entail that its constituents are as science portrays them. One could adopt an instrumentalist attitude toward the theoretical entities posited by science, continuing to believe that whatever entities the world actually does contain exist independently of our conceptions and perceptions of them. For the same reason, metaphysical realists need not accept that the entities and structures ontologists posit exist mind-independently.

Henceforth, we shall often just use the term ‘realism’ to mean metaphysical realism. Opposition to realism can take many forms so there is no single theoretical view denoted by the term ‘anti-realism’. In particular, anti-realism is not Idealism, even though Idealism is its most recognised form. One approach, popular in Continental Philosophy, rejects realism on the grounds that words can only acquire their meaning intra-linguistically, through their semantic relations with other words, where these relations are grounded in our linguistic and cultural practices, rather than through referential relations to the world outside of language. This view, Anti-Representationalism as it is sometimes called, has gained traction in analytic philosophy also [See Price 2009].

Within the ranks of Analytic Philosophy, Verificationists and Pragmatists also reject realism, though for different reasons. We shall mainly focus in this entry on the types of criticism voiced by these two groups of Analytic philosophers with Michael Dummett advocating a certain kind of Verificationism and Hilary Putnam a certain kind of Pragmatism. While accepting Representationalism, both Dummett and Putnam rejected realism by deploying semantic considerations in arguments designed to show that realism is untenable. The main goal of this entry is to outline these ‘semantic’ challenges to realism and to review realist responses to them.

The characterization of realism in terms of mind-independence above is not universally accepted. Some object that mind-independence is obscure [e.g. Chalmers 2009; for relevant discussion, see the entry ontological dependence]. Others maintain that realism is committed, in addition, to a distinctive (and tendentious) conception of truth [Putnam 1981, 1985, 1992; Wright 1993; Button 2013; Taylor 2006] or, more radically, that realism just is a thesis about the nature of truth—that truth can transcend the possibility of verification, ruling statements for which we can gather no evidence one way or the other to be determinately either true or false. An example would be “Julius Caesar’s heart skipped a beat as he crossed the Rubicon.” Thus the realist on this view is one who believes the law of bivalence (every statement is either true or false) holds for all meaningful (non-vague) statements [Dummett 1978, 1991, 1993].

In the same vein, Crispin Wright [1992a, 2003] presents a nuanced alethic analysis according to which discourses may be more or less realist depending on which distinctive ‘marks of truth’ they satisfy.

These semantic formulations of metaphysical realism are unacceptable to realists who are deflationists about truth, denying that truth is a substantive notion that can be used to characterise alternative metaphysical views [see the entry on the deflationary theory of truth]. Realists collectively complain, with some justice, that the anti-realist arguments are really arguments against the correspondence (or other substantive) theory of truth rather than realism [Devitt 1983, 1991; Millikan 1986]. This is an important reason for preferring an ontological construal of realism rather than a semantic one.

There is, in fact, an obvious worry about using the notion of mind-independence to characterise realism: it appears to consign mental states and events to irreality. Surely your savouring the taste of espresso, say, is dependent on your mind if anything is? Moreover, just as certainly the nature and content of the experience of tasting espresso depends upon one’s beliefs and expectations. Indeed, but this is not what the ‘mind-independence’ characterisation of realism means to exclude. Rather, it is the existence of conscious events that is deemed to be independent of the particular opinions or theories we might hold about their existence —given conscious events do exist, were our descendants to uniformly dismiss them as illusory, they would be mistaken. The ‘mind-independence’ at issue is epistemic rather than ontological.

On this understanding of realism, it is an error to identify realism with factualism, the view that sentences in some discourse or theory are to be construed literally as fact-stating ones. The anti-realist views discussed below are factualist about discourse describing certain contentious domains. Adopting a non-factualist or error-theoretic interpretation of some domain of discourse commits one to anti-realism about its entities. Factualism is thus a necessary condition for realism. But it is not sufficient. Verificationists such as Dummett reject the idea that something might exist without our being able to recognize its existence. They can be factualists about entities such as numbers and quarks while anti-realists about their nature since they deny any entities can exist mind-independently.

To elaborate the notion of mind-independent existence, consider Peter van Inwagen’s argument for the existence of numbers [van Inwagen 2016], which he describes as “a typical neo-Quinean argument”. The argument rests on two Quinean theses, van Inwagen relays. Firstly, that there is only one kind of variable, a variable that occupies nominal position, the range of which is unrestricted. Secondly, that the meanings of the quantifiers are univocal.[1]

Given these two background assumptions, the argument he gives is this:

1. There are objects that have both mass and volume.
2. The average density of an object that has both mass and volume is the ratio of its mass to its volume.
3. So, there is at least one thing that is a ratio.
4. Anything that is a ratio is a number.
5. Hence, there are numbers.

(3) follows from (1) and (2), with the conclusion (5) deducible from (1), (2) and (4). Moreover, both (2) and (4) are, if not analytically true, simple mathematical truths. (1), on the other hand, is an empirical fact, van Inwagen notes. The argument is clearly valid and the three premises that support the conclusion are all highly plausible. Should we not just accept that numbers exist? Many philosophers think so but some philosophers demur. Amongst the latter are those who think that the meaning of ‘there exists’ varies from context to context [Hilary Putnam and Eli Hirsch are two prominent advocates whose ideas we review]. There are others who think that the existential quantifier carries no ontological import [Azzouni, J. 1997]. If one accepts Quine’s two assumptions about the existential quantifier, however, and regards the argument as sound, hasn’t one thereby accepted realism about numbers?

No. For, while the argument establishes the existence of numbers, if it is indeed sound, it leaves their nature unspecified. Hence, it does not prove that numbers exist independently of human (or other) minds. Moreover, since the inferences are intuitionistically valid, anti-realists can accept it. The argument gives Intuitionists who believe numbers are mental constructs just as much as Platonists who believe they are eternal abstract objects a reason to believe numbers exist.

2. Mind-Independent Existence

Why do some find the notion of mind-independent existence inadequate for the task of formulating metaphysical realism? The most common complaint is that the notion is either obscure, or, more strongly, incoherent or cognitively meaningless. An eloquent spokesman for this strong view was Rudolf Carnap: “My friends and I have maintained the following theses,” Carnap announces [Carnap 1963, p.868]:

(1) The statement asserting the reality of the external world (realism) as well as its negation in various forms, e.g. solipsism and several forms of idealism, in the traditional controversy are pseudo-statements, i.e., devoid of cognitive content. (2) The same holds for the statements about the reality or irreality of other minds (3) and for the statements of the reality or irreality of abstract entities (realism of universals or Platonism, vs. nominalism).

In spite of his finding these disputes meaningless, Carnap indicates how he thinks we could reconstruct them (sic.) so as to make some sense of them: if we were to “replace the ontological theses about the reality or irreality of certain entities, theses which we regard as pseudo-theses, by proposals or decisions concerning the use of certain languages. Thus realism is replaced by the practical decision to use the reistic language”.

Carnap does not have in mind a factualist reformulation of metaphysical realism here—his “reistic” language is strictly limited to the description of “intersubjectively observable, spatio-temporally localized things or events”.

What matters here is not Carnap’s sense of a commensurability between a metaphysical thesis about reality and a practical decision to speak only about observable things, but rather that he thinks he can explain how the illusion of meaningfulness arises for the metaphysical theses he declares “devoid of cognitive content”. His explanation has to do with a distinction between two types of questions — internal and external questions:

An existential statement which asserts that there are entities of a specified kind can be formulated as a simple existential statement in a language containing variables for these entities. I have called existential statements of this kind, formulated within a given language, internal existential statements. [Carnap 1963, p. 871]

Whereas internal questions about the existence of physical objects are to be answered by observations that confirm or disconfirm sentences asserting their existence, existential statements about abstract objects are analytic, Carnap contends:

Just because internal statements are usually analytic and trivial, we may presume that the theses involved in the traditional philosophical controversies are not meant as internal statements, but rather as external existential statements; they purport to assert the existence of entities of the kind in question not merely within a given language, but, so to speak, before a language has been constructed. [1963, p. 871]

Having dismissed all external existential questions as devoid of cognitive content, Carnap decides that both realism which asserts the ontological reality of abstract entities and nominalism which asserts their irreality are “pseudo-statements if they claim to be theoretical statements” (ibid).

Where Carnap could make no sense of the notion of mind-independent reality, Albert Einstein had no such difficulty. For, together with Podolsky and Rosen, Einstein famously proposed a test for elements of reality in their EPR paper [Einstein, Podolsky and Rosen 1935: 777–8]:

If, without in any way disturbing a system, we can predict with certainty (i.e. with probability equal to unity) the value of a physical quantity, then there exists an element of physical reality corresponding to this physical quantity.

Tim Maudlin [2014, p.7] explains the significance of the EPR criterion thus:

Suppose … I can without in any way disturbing a system predict with certainty the value of a physical quantity … then the relevant element of reality obtained … independently of the determination being made. Because, as we have said, the means of determination did not (by hypothesis) disturb the system.

Realists might wish to endorse the EPR criterion as an idealized test for the mind-independent reality of (macro-)physical quantities — even if we rarely (if at all) are able to “predict with certainty” the outcome of an experiment, we can, some would argue, approach near-certainty in a significant class of cases without disturbing the system. Carnapian anti-realists, however, will deny the EPR criterion validates any external notion of mind-independent existence, regarding it instead as a means of settling internal existence questions about physical quantities.

3. The Anti-Realist Challenges to Metaphysical Realism

3.1 Language Use and Understanding

The first anti-realist challenge to consider focuses on the use we make of our words and sentences. The challenge is simply this: what aspect of our linguistic use could provide the necessary evidence for the realist’s correlation between sentences and mind-independent states of affairs? Which aspects of our semantic behaviour manifest our grasp of these correlations, assuming they do hold?

For your representations of the world to be reliable, there must be a correlation between these representations and the states of affairs they portray. So the cosmologist who utters the statement “the entropy of the Big Bang was remarkably low” has uttered a truth if and only if the entropy of the Big Bang was remarkably low.

A natural question to ask is how the correlation between the statement and the mind-independent state of affairs which makes it true is supposed to be set up. One suggestive answer is that the link is effected by the use speakers make of their words, the statements they endorse and the statements they dissent from, the rationalizations they provide for their actions and so forth; cognitively, it will be the functional role of mental symbols in thought, perception and language learning etc. that effects these links.

However, when we look at how speakers actually do use their sentences, anti-realists argue, we see them responding not to states of affairs that they cannot in general detect but rather to agreed upon conditions for asserting these sentences. Scientists assert “the entropy of the Big Bang was remarkably low” because they all concur that the conditions justifying this assertion have been met.

What prompts us to use our sentences in the way that we do are the public justification conditions associated with those sentences, justification conditions forged in linguistic practices which imbue these sentences with meaning.

The realist believes we are able to mentally represent mind-independent states of affairs. But what of cases where everything that we know about the world leaves it unsettled whether the relevant state of affairs obtains? Did Socrates sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock or did he not? How could we possibly find out? Yet realists hold that the sentence “Socrates sneezed in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock” will be true if Socrates did sneeze then and false if he did not and that this is a significant semantic fact.

The Manifestation challenge to realism is to isolate some feature of the use agents make of their words, or their mental symbols, which forges the link between mind-independent states of affairs and the thoughts and sentences that represent them. Nothing in the thinker’s linguistic behaviour, according to the anti-realist, provides evidence that this link has been forged—linguistic use is keyed to public assertibility conditions, not undetectable truth-conditions. In those cases, such as the Socrates one, where we cannot find out whether the truth-condition is satisfied or not, it is simply gratuitous to believe that there is anything we can think or say or do which could provide evidence that the link has been set up in the first place. So the anti-realist claims [Dummett 1978, 1991, 1993; Tennant 1987, 1997; Wright 1993].

Why should we expect the evidence to be behavioural rather than, say, neurophysiological? The reason anti-realists give is that the meanings of our words and (derivatively for them) the contents of our thoughts are essentially communicable and thus must be open for all speakers and thinkers to see [Dummett 1978, 1993].

3.2 Language Acquisition

The second challenge to be considered concerns our acquisition of language. The challenge to realism is to explain how a child could come to know the meanings of certain sentences within his/her language: the ones which the realist contends have undetectable truth-makers associated with them. How could the child learn the meanings of such sentences if these meanings are determined by states of affairs not even competent speakers can detect?

Consider the sentence (S) once more:

• (S) Socrates sneezed in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock.

Realists say (S) is either true or false even though we may (and almost certainly will) never know which it is. The state of affairs which satisfies (S)’s truth-condition when it is true, its ‘truthmaker’, and the state of affairs which satisfies the truth-condition of the negation of (S) when (S) is false are supposed to be able to hold even though competent speakers cannot detect whether they do. How could the child ever learn about this undetectable relation?

Suppose God (or nature) had linked our mental representations to just the right states of affairs in the way required by the realist. If so, this is a semantically significant fact. Anyone learning their native language would have to grasp these correspondences between sentences and states of affairs. How can they do this if even the competent speakers whom they seek to emulate cannot detect when these correspondences hold? In short, competence in one’s language would be impossible to acquire if realism were true [Dummett 1978, 1993; Wright 1993]. This is the Language Acquisition challenge.

This challenge is exacerbated by the anti-realist’s assumption that since the linguistic meaning of an expression $$E$$ is determined solely by competent speakers’ use of $$E$$ the child’s task in all cases is to infer the meaning of $$E$$ from its use. Thus Dummett [1978 pp. 216–217], in discussing the meaning of mathematical statements, proposes a thesis he argues holds for the meanings of every kind of statement:

The meaning of a mathematical statement determines and is exhaustively determined by its use. The meaning of a mathematical statement cannot be, or contain as an ingredient, anything which is not manifest in the use made of it, lying solely in the mind of the individual who apprehends that meaning: if two individual agree completely about the use to be made of the statement, then they agree about its meaning. The reason is that the meaning of a statement consists solely in its role as an instrument of communication between individuals, just as the powers of a chess-piece consist solely in its role in the game according to the rules.

W.V.O. Quine is even more insistent on the public nature of linguistic meaning. Displaying his unshakable faith in Skinnerian models of language-learning he writes [1992, pp. 37–38]:

In psychology one may or may not be a behaviourist, but in linguistics one has no choice … There is nothing in linguistic meaning beyond what is to be gleaned from overt behaviour in observable circumstances.

According to Hilary Putnam, the metaphysical realist subscribes not just to the belief in a mind-independent world but also to the thesis that truth consists in a correspondence relation between words (or mental symbols) and things in that mind-independent world. Call this thesis correspondence truth (after Devitt 1991). More importantly, metaphysical realists aver that an ideal theory of the world could be radically false, Putnam contends: ‘radical’ in the sense that all (or almost all) of the theory’s theses could fail to hold. Such a global failure would result if we were to be ‘brains-in-a-vat’ our brains manipulated by mad scientists (or machines, as in the movie The Matrix) so as to dream of an external world that we mistake for reality. Call this thesis radical skepticism.

It is widely believed that states of affairs that are truly mind-independent do engender radical skepticism. The skeptic contends that for all we could tell we could be brains in a vat—brains kept alive in a bath of nutrients by mad alien scientists. All our thoughts, all our experience, all that passed for science would be systematically mistaken if we were. We’d have no bodies although we thought we did, the world would contain no physical objects, yet it would seem to us that it did, there’d be no Earth, no Sun, no vast universe, only the brain’s deluded representations of such. At least this could be the case if our representations derived even part of their content from links with mind-independent objects and states of affairs. Since realism implies that such an absurd possibility could hold without our being able to detect it, it has to be rejected, according to anti-realists.

A much stronger anti-realist argument due to Putnam uses the brain-in-a-vat hypothesis to show that realism is internally incoherent rather than, as before, simply false. A crucial assumption of the argument is semantic externalism, the thesis that the reference of our words and mental symbols is partially determined by contingent relations between thinkers and the world. This is a semantic assumption many realists independently endorse.

Given semantic externalism, the argument proceeds by claiming that if we were brains in a vat we could not possibly have the thought that we were. For, if we were so envatted, we could not possibly mean by ‘brain’ and ‘vat’ what unenvatted folk mean by these words since our words would be connected only to neural impulses or images in our brains where the unenvatteds’ words are connected to real-life brains and real-life vats. Similarly, the thought we pondered whenever we posed the question “am I a brain in a vat?” could not possibly be the thought unenvatted folk pose when they ask themselves the same-sounding question in English. But realism entails that we could indeed be brains in a vat. As we have just shown that were we to be so, we could not even entertain this as a possibility, Putnam concludes that realism is incoherent [Putnam 1981]. For this argument to work, however, Putnam must be assuming a rather restrictive form of modal rationalism: we could be brains in a vat only if in the circumstance that we were envatted, we could conceive that we were envatted.

3.4 Models and Reality

Putnam’s Model-Theoretic Argument is the most technical of the arguments we have so far considered although we shall not reproduce all the technicalities here. The central ideas can be conveyed informally, although some technical concepts will be mentioned where necessary. The argument purports to show that the Representation Problem—to explain how our mental symbols and words get hooked up to mind-independent objects and how our sentences and thoughts target mind-independent states of affairs—is insoluble.

According to the Model-Theoretic Argument, there are simply too many ways in which our mental symbols can be mapped onto items in the world. The consequence of this is a dilemma for the realist. The first horn of the dilemma is that s/he must accept that what our symbols refer to is massively indeterminate. The second horn is that s/he must insist that even an ideal theory, whose terms and predicates can demonstrably be mapped veridically onto objects and properties in the world might still be false, i.e., that such a mapping might not be the right one, the one ‘intended’.

Neither alternative can be defended, according to anti-realists. Concerning the first alternative, massive indeterminacy for perfectly determinate terms is absurd. As for the second, for realists to contend that even an ideal theory could be false is to resort to unmotivated dogmatism, since on their own admission we cannot tell which mapping the world has set up for us. Such dogmatism leaves the realist with no answer to a skepticism which undermines any capacity to reliably represent the world, anti-realists maintain.

Now, in logic theories are treated as sets of sentences and the objects (if any) that sentences talk about appear as elements of the domain of set-theoretic entities called structures. Associated with these structures are interpretation functions that map individual constants onto individual objects of the domain and n-place predicates onto n-tuples of elements in the domain. When a structure makes all the sentences of a given theory true it is called a model of the theory. By demonstrating that there is a model of T we show theory T is consistent. If T turns out to be true in its intended model, then T is true simpliciter.

For an informal illustration of the basic ideas of model theory, see the supplementary document, Model Theory: Core Ideas.

Let us call structures whose domains consist of numbers ‘numeric’ structures. The nub of Putnam’s Model-Theoretic Argument against realism is that the realist cannot distinguish the intended model for his/her total theory of the world from non-standard interlopers such as permuted models or ones derived from numeric models, even when total theory is a rationally optimal one that consists, as it must do, of an infinite set of sentences and the realist is permitted to impose the most exacting constraints to distinguish between models. This is a very surprising result if true! How does Putnam arrive at it?

Putnam actually uses a number of different arguments to establish the conclusion above. Of prime concern to realists, as Taylor (2006) emphasises, is the argument based on Gödel’s Completeness Theorem, GCT. For, following Lewis [Lewis, 1984], realists might concede to Putnam that they cannot single out the intended model or distinguish it from various ersatz models, but argue that this is not necessary since it suffices that an intended model exists, even if we cannot specify it. This response does not answer the GCT argument, however. For this argument purports to prove directly that an ideal theory of the world could not be false, a conclusion flatly inconsistent with realism. See the supplementary document The Model-Theoretic Argument and the Completeness Theorem for an outline of this argument.

Putnam has another argument, the Permutation Argument:

Suppose that the realist is able to somehow specify the intended model. Call this intended model $$W''$$. Then nothing the realist can do can possibly distinguish $$W''$$ from a permuted variant $$W^*$$ which can be specified following Putnam 1994b, 356–357:

We define properties of being a cat* and being a mat* such that:
1. In the actual world cherries are cats* and trees are mats*.
2. In every possible world the two sentences “A cat is on a mat” and “A cat* is on a mat*” have precisely the same truth value.

Instead of considering two sentences “A cat is on a mat” and “A cat* is on a mat*” now consider only the one “A cat is on a mat”, allowing its interpretation to change by first adopting the standard interpretation for it and then adopting the non-standard interpretation in which the set of cats* are assigned to ‘cat’ in every possible world and the set of mats* are assigned to ‘mat’ in every possible world. The result will be the truth-value of “A cat is on a mat” will not change and will be exactly the same as before in every possible world. Similar non-standard reference assignments could be constructed for all the predicates of a language. [See Putnam 1985, 1994b.] However, unlike the GCT argument, the Permutation Argument is susceptible to the Lewis-styled reply above.

3.5 Conceptual Schemes and Pluralism

According to conceptual pluralists, there can no more be an answer to the question “What is the structure of the world?” outside of some scheme for classifying entities than there can be an answer to the question of whether two events $$A$$ and $$B$$ are simultaneous outside of some inertial frame for dating those events. The objects that exist are the objects some conceptual scheme says exists—‘mesons exist’ really means ‘mesons exist relative to the conceptual scheme of current physics’.

Realists think there is a unitary sense of ‘object’, ‘property’ etc., for which the question “what objects and properties does the world contain?” makes sense. Any answer which succeeded in listing all the objects, properties, events etc. which the world contains would comprise a privileged description of that totality [Putnam 1981]. Anti-realists reject this. For them ‘object’, ‘property’ etc., shift their senses as we move from one conceptual scheme to another. Some anti-realists argue that there cannot be a totality of all the objects the world contains since the notion of ‘object’ is indefinitely extensible and so, trivially, there cannot be a privileged description of any such totality. [For discussions of indefinite extensibility see Dummett 1978, 1991; Linnebo 2018; Warren 2017].

How does the anti-realist defend conceptual relativity? One way is by arguing that there can be two complete theories of the world which are descriptively equivalent yet logically incompatible from the realist’s point of view. For example, theories of space-time can be formulated in one of two mathematically equivalent ways: as an ontology of points, with spatiotemporal regions being defined as sets of points; or as an ontology of regions, with points being defined as convergent sets of regions. Such theories are descriptively equivalent since mathematically equivalent and yet are logically incompatible from the realist’s point of view, anti-realists contend [Putnam 1985, 1990].

4. Realist Responses

4.1 Language Use and Understanding

We now turn to some realist responses to these challenges. The Manifestation and Language Acquisition arguments allege there is nothing in an agent’s cognitive or linguistic behaviour that could provide evidence that s/he had grasped what it is for a sentence to be true in the realist’s sense of ‘true’. How can you manifest a grasp of a notion which can apply or fail to apply without you being able to tell which? How could you ever learn to use such a concept?

One possible realist response is that the concept of truth is actually very simple, and it is spurious to demand that one always be able to determine whether a concept applies. As to the first part, it is often argued that all there is to the notion of truth is what is given by the formula “‘$$p$$’ is true if and only if $$p$$”. The function of the truth-predicate is to disquote sentences in the sense of undoing the effects of quotation—thus all that one is saying in calling the sentence “Yeti are vicious” true is that Yeti are vicious.

It is not clear that this response really addresses the anti-realist’s worry, however. It may well be that there is a simple algorithm for learning the meaning of ‘true’ and that, consequently, there is no special difficulty in learning to apply the concept. But that by itself does not tell us whether the predicate ‘true’ applies to cases where we cannot ascertain that it does. All the algorithm tells us, in effect, is that if it is legitimate to assert $$p$$ it is legitimate to assert that ‘$$p$$’ is true. So are we entitled to assert ‘either Socrates did or did not sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock’ or are we not? Presumably that will depend on what we mean by the sentence, whether we mean to be adverting to two states of affairs neither of which we have any prospect of ever confirming.

Anti-realists follow verificationists in rejecting the intelligibility of such states of affairs and tend to base their rules for assertion on intuitionistic logic, which rejects the universal applicability of the Law of Bivalence (the principle that every statement is either true or false). This law is thought to be a foundational semantic principle for classical logic. However, some question whether classical logic requires bivalence [e.g. Sandqvist 2009]. Others dispute the idea that acceptance or rejection of bivalence has any metaphysical (rather than meaning-theoretic) consequences [Edgington, 1981; McDowell 1976; Pagin 1998; Gaiffman 1996]. There is, in addition, a question as to whether the anti-realist’s preferred substitute for realist truth-conditions in verification-conditions (or proof-conditions) satisfies the requirement of exhaustive manifestability [Pagin 2009].

A more direct realist response to the Manifestation challenge points to the prevalence in our linguistic practices of realist-inspired beliefs to which we give expression in what we say and do [McDowell 1976]. We assert things like “either there were an odd or an even number of dinosaurs on this planet independently of what anyone believes” and all our actions and other assertions confirm that we really do believe this. Furthermore, the overwhelming acceptance of classical logic by mathematicians and scientists and their rejection of intuitionistic logic for the purposes of mainstream science provides very good evidence for the coherence and usefulness of a realist understanding of truth [Edgington 1981; Burgess 1984; Hellman 1989, 1992].

Anti-realists reject this reply. They argue that all we make manifest by asserting things like “either there were an odd or an even number of dinosaurs on this planet independently of what anyone believes” is our pervasive misunderstanding of the notion of truth. They apply the same diagnosis to the realist’s belief in the mind-independence of entities in the world and to counterfactuals which express this belief. We overgeneralize the notion of truth, believing that it applies in cases where it does not, they contend [Tennant 1987, 1997; Wright 1993].

An apparent consequence of their view is that reality is indeterminate in surprising ways—we have no grounds for asserting that Socrates did sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock and no grounds for asserting that he did not and no prospect of ever finding out which. Does this mean that for anti-realists the world contains no such fact as the fact that Socrates did one or the other of these two things? Not necessarily. For anti-realists who subscribe to intuitionistic principles of reasoning, the most that can be said is that there is no present warrant to assert $$S \lor \neg S$$: that Socrates either did or did not sneeze in his sleep the night before he took the hemlock.

Perhaps anti-realists are right. But if so, they need to explain how a practice based on a pervasive illusion can be as successful as modern science. Anti-realists perturbed by the manifestability of realist truth are revisionists about parts of our linguistic practice, and the consequence of this revisionist stance is that mathematics and science require extensive and non-trivial revision. The debate about whether classical logic should (or can) be rejected on meaning-theoretic grounds is ongoing: Burgess 1984, Hellman 1989, Michael 1999 and Read 2000 are critical of Dummett’s case for rejecting classical logic, whereas Cogburn 2005, Cozzo 1994, Prawitz 1977, 1987, 1994 and Tennant 1997 are, in varying degrees, supportive.

4.2 Language Acquisition

The challenge to realism posed by language acquisition is to explain how a child (or novice) could come to know the meanings of certain sentences within his/her language: the ones the realist contends have undetectable truth-makers associated with them. How could the child learn the meanings of such sentences if these meanings are determined by states of affairs not even competent speakers can detect?

A straightforward realist reply is that knowledge of the meanings of sentences with undetectable truth-conditions is acquired in the same way as knowledge of the meanings of sentences with recognisable truth-conditions: namely, compositionally by acquiring knowledge of the lexicon and the relevant compositional principles [Pagin 2009].[2] Anti-realists respond by contesting the interpretation of the compositional principles that generate sentences with undetectable truth-conditions — where realists assert $$S \lor \neg S$$ is true ($$S$$ being the Socrates sentence), anti-realists maintain there is no ground for asserting this disjunction [e.g. Tennant 1987].

Some realists reject the publicity of meaning principle as it applies to language learning. While many accept that the meaning of a word is determined by its use in a given language, not all do [e.g. Chomsky 1986; Fodor and Lepore 2002]. Realists who think of semantic understanding as a mental state reject the idea that a speaker’s understanding of meaning is exhaustively manifest in its use as an instrument of communication rather than in its internal use in expressing thought. If Dummett’s manifestation requirement is a demand for a behaviouristic reduction of semantic knowledge, they argue, it should be rejected [Burgess 1984; Chomsky 1986]. However, some sympathetic to the demand for full manifestability of semantic knowledge reject the behaviouristic construal and instead justify it on conceptual grounds [e.g. Shieh 1998, McGee 2015].[3]

The Acquisition Challenge is a vexed one for realists because Dummett shares little common ground with the many (realist) philosophers, linguists and cognitive scientists who believe language acquisition is effected by a dedicated language module [Fodor 1975, 1983, 2008; Chomsky 1986, 2006; Crain 2012; Pinker 1994] or even with those who disavow modularity but agree that semantic knowledge is partly unconscious. Thus, Dummett rejected Chomsky’s thesis that speakers have unconscious knowledge of the rules of Universal Grammar on the Wittgensteinian grounds that it was, at best “an explanatory hypothesis, not a systematisation of facts open to view.” [Dummett 1981]. Dummett apparently took this “systemisation of facts” to be satisfied by an account that pairs knowledge of meaning with recognitional abilities.[4]

It is worth noting that evidence from developmental psychology indicates some meaning is pre-linguistic and that some pre-linguistic meaning or conceptual content relate to situations that are not detectable by the child. For example, psychologists have discovered systems of core knowledge activated in infancy that govern the representation of, inter alia concrete objects and human agents [see Spelke 2003; Spelke and Kinzler 2007]. An interesting finding from preferential gaze experiments suggests 4 month old infants represent occluded objects as continuing behind their barriers.[5]

While these findings do not by themselves show that the meanings of mental symbols is not determined by public use, they do provide evidence that ‘verification-transcendent’ conceptual content is laid down in the earliest stages of cognitive development.

The Brains-in-a-Vat argument purports to show that, given semantic externalism, realism is incoherent on the grounds that it is both committed to the genuine possibility of our being brains in a vat and yet entails something that anti-realists judge to be inconsistent with this: namely, that were we to be so envatted we could not possibly have the thought that we were.

Realists have three obvious responses.

1. Deny realism entails that we could be brains in a vat.
2. Deny semantic externalism.
3. Deny there is any inconsistency between our being brains in a vat and our inability to think that we were brains in a vat were we to be so.

As for (i), one might question the coherence of the idea of our being brains in a vat on the grounds that the skeptical hypothesis uses terms which derive their meaning from successful theory to pose a problem which, if intelligible, would rob those very terms of meaning.

What of option (ii)—denying semantic externalism? Is this really a live prospect for realists? Semantic externalism no longer commands the consensus amongst realists that it did when Putnam formulated his Brains-in-a-Vat argument. David Lewis, a prominent realist, rejected externalism in favour of a sophisticated semantic internalism based on a ‘Two-Dimensional’ analysis of modality proposed by Stalnaker [Lewis 1994]. Frank Jackson [Jackson 2000] contributed to the development of internalist 2D semantics and used it to formulate a version of materialism grounded on conceptual analysis that provides a useful model of a physicalistic realist’s metaphysics.

Other realists reject externalism because they think that the Representation Problem is just a pseudo-problem. When we say things like “‘cat’ refers to cats” or “‘quark’ refers to quarks” we are simply registering our dispositions to call everything we consider sufficiently cat-like/quark-like, ‘cat’/’quark’ [Horwich, 1990; Resnick, 1990].

According to these semantic deflationists, it is just a confusion to ask how the link was set up between our use of the term ‘the Big Bang’ and the event of that name which occurred some fourteen billion years ago. Yet, if all there is to the story are our linguistic dispositions and the conditions to which they are presently attuned, the case has effectively been ceded to the anti-realist who denies it is possible to set up a correlation between our utterances or thoughts and mind-independent states of affairs.

Perhaps the most effective realist rejoinder is (iii). We shall return to this response after we have reviewed Putnam’s Brains-in-a-Vat Argument, BIVA.

How does Putnam prove we can know we are not brains in a vat? To understand Putnam’s argument, we need to first recall the ‘Twin-Earth’ considerations used to support Semantic Externalism: on Twin-Earth things are exactly as they are here on Earth except for one difference—whereas for Earthly humans water has the chemical composition H2O, for our döppelgangers on Twin-Earth, twumans, water is instead composed of some substance unknown to us on Earth, XYZ. Now when you and your twuman counterpart say (or think) “‘Water’ refers to water” both of you utter (or think) truths. But which truth you both think or utter differs. For humans “‘Water’ refers to water” expresses the truth that the term ‘water’ in English refers to that substance whose chemical composition is H2O. For our twuman Twin-Earth counterparts, however, their sentence “‘Water’ refers to water” expresses the truth that their term ‘water’ in Twenglish refers to that substance whose chemical composition is XYZ.

With these points about Externalism in mind, consider Putnam’s BIVA [we follow the formulation section 7 of the entry skepticism and content externalism]. Let us call whatever it is that an envatted brain’s symbol ‘tree’ refers to, if it refers at all, $$v$$-trees. Then the BIVA is:

• (1) If I’m a BIV then it is not the case that if my word ‘tree’ refers it refers to trees.
• (2) If my word ‘tree’ refers it refers to trees.
• (3) So, I am not a BIV.

Now (1) seems correct: if I am a brain-in-a-vat then, given externalism, my symbol ‘tree’ cannot refer to trees since there aren’t any trees in the vat-world—a BIV’s ‘tree’ symbol refers to $$v$$-trees, not trees. But what reason do we have to believe (2)? If we are BIVs won’t our ‘tree’ symbols refer to v-trees rather than trees? Crispin Wright [1992b] argues that all language-users, whether humans or brains-in-a-vat, can be certain of (2) since they can know they use language meaningfully and thus can know that their language disquotes. Graeme Forbes [1995] questions Wright’s argument.

Discussion of the brains-in-a-vat hypothesis has been extensive. Early contributions by Brueckner 1986, 1992; David 1991; Ebbs 1992; Forbes 1995 reconstruct Putnam’s argument and assess it from a realist perspective. Important defences of the BIVA are provided by Wright 1992b; Tymoczko 1989; Button 2013, 2015. Some recent discussions bring Bayesian [Huemer 2016] or psychological [Jackson 2015] considerations to bear on Putnam’s BIV hypothesis. A valuable collection of essays is Goldberg 2015.

Even if it were to turn out that the BIVA is not sound, Putnam’s challenge to the realist remains unanswered. This was to show how realism could be coherent if it is committed both to:

• (I) The real possibility that we are brains-in-a-vat

and to the consequence that:

• (II) Were we to be BIVs we could not have the thought that we were.

While it is usually not remarked upon, there is no logical incoherence in accepting both (I) and (II)—as the figure below illustrates. There is thus no logical incoherence in believing both that it is possible that one is a BIV and that if one is a BIV one could never come to know this.

Nick Bostrom has recently argued it is quite likely that we humans are actually virtual humans: computer simulations of flesh and blood creatures. Bostrom reasons that if our mental lives can be simulated then it is highly probable that our distant descendants (more intelligent or at least more technologically advanced ‘post-human’ successors) will eventually create such a simulation in which case it is more likely that we are the unwitting denizens of a simulated world than the flesh and blood inhabitants of the real world we take ourselves to be. At least this will be so unless the chances that creatures of our intelligence are doomed to become extinct before reaching the technological sophistication to create simulations are overwhelmingly large or else almost no such technologically capable civilizations have any interest in simulating minds like ours in the first place [Bostrom, N., 2003].

Bostrom’s position owes nothing to skepticism, he is concerned solely with the question of whether virtual humans are empirically possible and, if so, how likely it is that we might be such beings. His argument, if sound, makes it look very doubtful that we can know a priori that we are not brains-in-a-vat, when BIVs are understood to be virtual humans in a simulation.[6] If Bostrom is correct, Putnam’s attempt to prove we cannot be BIVs must be flawed. However, the Simulation Argument is nothing if not controversial: it has provoked interest from cosmologists as well as philosophers [For discussion of the Simulation Hypothesis see Bostrom, 2005; Brueckner 2008; Chalmers 2010; Weatherson 2003].

4.4 Models and Reality

If metaphysical realism is to be tenable, it must be possible for even the best theories to be mistaken. Or so metaphysical realists have thought. Whence, such realists reject the Model-Theoretic Argument MTA which purports to show that this is not possible. Here is an informal sketch of the MTA due to van Fraassen [1997]:

Let $$T$$ be a theory that contains all the sentences we insist are true, and that has all other qualities we desire in an ideal theory. Suppose moreover that there are infinitely many things, and that $$T$$ says so. Then there exist functions (interpretations) which assign to each term in $$T$$’s vocabulary an extension, and which satisfy $$T$$. So we conclude, to quote Putnam, “$$T$$ comes out true, true of the world, provided we just interpret ‘true’ as TRUE(SAT)”.

Here ‘TRUE(SAT)’ means “true relative to a mapping of the terms of the language of $$T$$ onto (sets of) items in the world”.

But why should we interpret ‘true’ as TRUE(SAT)? Because truth is truth in an intended model and, Putnam argues, amongst all the models of $$T$$ that make all its theses come out true there is guaranteed to be at least one that passes all conceivable constraints we can reasonably impose on a model in order for it to be an intended model of $$T$$.

Realists have responded to the argument by rejecting the claim that a model $$M$$ of the hypothetical ideal theory $$T$$ passes every theoretical constraint simply because all of the theory’s theses come out true in it. For there is no guarantee, they claim, that terms stand in the right relation of reference to the objects to which $$M$$ links them. To be sure, if we impose another theoretical constraint, say:

Right Reference Constraint (RRC): Term $$t$$ refers to object $$x$$ if and only if $$Rtx$$ where $$R$$ is the right relation of reference,

then $$M$$ (or some model based on it) can interpret this RRC constraint in such a way as to make it come out true.

But there is a difference between a model’s making some description of a constraint come out true and its actually conforming to that constraint, metaphysical realists insist [Devitt 1983, 1991; Lewis 1983, 1984].

For their part, anti-realists have taken the metaphysical realist’s insistence on a Right Reference Constraint to be ‘just more theory’—what it is for a model to conform to a constraint is for us to be justified in asserting that it does. Unfortunately, this has led to something of a stand-off. Metaphysical realists think that anti-realists are refusing to acknowledge a clear and important distinction. Anti-realists think realists are simply falling back on dogmatism at a crucial point in the argument.

On the face of it, the Permutation Argument presents a genuine challenge to any realist who believes in determinate reference. But it does not refute metaphysical realism unless such realism is committed to determinate reference in the first place and it is not at all obvious that this is so.

Realist responses to this argument vary widely. At one extreme are the ‘determinatists’, those who believe that Nature has set up significant, determinate referential connections between our mental symbols and items in the world. They contend that all the argument shows is that the distribution of truth-values across possible worlds is not sufficient to determine reference [van Cleve 1992].

At another extreme are ‘indeterminatists’, realists who concede the conclusion, agreeing that it demonstrates that word-world reference is massively indeterminate or ‘inscrutable’. The locus classicus for inscrutability of reference is Quine 1964 [See also Quine 1969, 1992; Davidson 1979].

Some infer from this that reference could not possibly consist in correspondences between mental symbols and objects in the world. For them all that makes ‘elephant’ refer to elephants is that our language contains the word ‘elephant’. This is Deflationism about reference. Vann McGee presents a strong case for inscrutability on a deflationary view of reference, one that is grounded in a “… peculiarly egocentric conception of semantics—questions of others’ meanings are settled by asking what I mean by the words of my language” [McGee 2015].

In between these two extremes are those prepared to concede the argument establishes the real possibility of a significant and surprising indeterminacy in the reference of our mental symbols but who take it to be an open question whether other constraints can be found which pare down the range of reference assignments to just the intuitively acceptable ones.[7]

The simplest and most direct response to the MTA questions its validity. Thus Devitt and Lewis claim that Putnam’s alternative model $$M$$ has not been shown to satisfy every theoretical constraint merely by making some description of each theoretical constraint true.

Skolem’s Paradox in set theory seems to present a striking illustration of Lewis’s distinction. The Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem states that every consistent, countable set of first-order formulae has a denumerable model, in fact a model in the set of integers $$\mathbb{Z}$$. Now in ZF one can prove the existence of sets with a non-denumerable number of elements such as the set $$\mathbb{R}$$ of real numbers. Yet the ZF axioms comprise a consistent, countable set of first-order formulae and thus by the Löwenheim-Skolem Theorem has a model in $$\mathbb{Z}$$. So ZF’s theorem $$\phi$$ stating that $$\mathbb{R}$$ is non-denumerable will come out true in a denumerable model $$\mu$$ of ZF.

How can this be? One explanation is that $$\mu$$ makes $$\phi$$ true only at the cost of re-interpreting the term ‘non-denumerable’ so that it no longer means non-denumerable. Thus $$\mu$$ is not the intended model $$M^*$$ of ZF. It looks as if the metaphysical realist has a clear illustration of Lewis’s distinction at hand in set theory.

Unfortunately for the realist, this is not the only explanation. In fact, Putnam used this very example in an early formulation of the MTA. Just because there are different models that satisfy $$\phi$$ in some of which $$\mathbb{R}$$ is non-denumerable but in others of which (such as $$\mu$$) $$\mathbb{R}$$ is denumerable, Putnam argued, it is impossible to pin down the intended interpretation of ‘set’ via first-order axioms. Moreover, well before Putnam, Skolem and his followers had taken the moral of Skolem’s Paradox to be that set-theoretic notions are indeterminate [For further discussion, see the entry on Skolem’s paradox].

The question of how to interpret Skolem’s Paradox merely raises anew the question of what it is for a theory such as the hypothesized ideal theory $$T$$ to satisfy a right reference constraint, (RRC).

Putnam [1985] regards it as simply question-begging for a realist to assume her notion of an intended model is determinate: i.e. that terms such as ‘satisfaction’ or ‘correspondence’ refer to those relations to which she wishes them to refer. That her term ‘refers’ refers to her desired reference relation is ‘just more theory’. Realists have responded that Putnam is wilfully re-interpreting their semantic terms as he sees fit.[8]

Is there some independent way to validate Lewis’s distinction? Michael Resnick thinks so [Resnick 1987]. Putnam maintained that $$M$$, the model he constructs of the ideal theory $$T$$, is an intended model because it passes every operational and theoretical constraint we could reasonably impose. It passes every theoretical constraint, he argues, simply because it makes every thesis of $$T$$ true. But unless the Reflection Principle (RP) below holds, Resnick argues, this inference is just a non-sequitur:

• (RP) To any condition $$f$$ that a model of a theory satisfies, there corresponds a condition $$C$$ expressible in the theory that that theory satisfies.

However, this principle is false. The simplest counterexample to it, Resnick points out, is Tarskian truth. Suppose we impose on $$T$$’s model $$M$$ a condition $$f^*$$ that $$M$$ makes all of $$T$$’s theses come out true. Then, unless $$T$$ is either inconsistent or too weak to express elementary arithmetic no truth predicate will be definable in $$T$$. Whence there will be no condition $$C$$ expressible in $$T$$ corresponding to this condition $$f^*$$ on $$T$$’s model(s) $$M$$.

Resnick concludes (ibid):

Any true interpretation of $$T$$ whatsoever—even one which does not satisfy $$C$$—will make true every thesis of $$T$$, including T’s assertion that $$C$$ is satisfied. Which suffices to block the ‘just more theory’ gambit.

The philosophical consensus appears to be that Lewis and Resnick are right. Apart from the authors already discussed, important criticisms of the MTA were advanced in Hale and Wright 1997, van Cleve 1992 and Bays 2008. However, some very sophisticated anti-realist attempts to buttress the Model-Theoretic Argument against Lewis-styled criticisms have appeared. Igor Douven reconstructs Putnam’s argument, defending it against standard objections [Douven 1999]. Barry Taylor presents a detailed explication and defence of Putnam’s Just More Theory reply [Taylor 2006], as does Tim Button [Button 2013]. Whether these newer formulations of the MTA succeed in answering the Lewis/Resnick objection is an open question.[9]

4.5 Conceptual Schemes and Pluralism

To the extent it makes the existence of all things relative to the classificatory skills of minds, conceptual relativism appears highly counter-intuitive to realists. Whilst it may seem plausible to some that moral values or perhaps even colours might disappear with the extinction of sentient life on Earth, it is not at all plausible to think that trees, rocks and microbes would follow in their train.

This is not how Putnam understands his idea of conceptual relativity, however, which thesis he distinguishes from conceptual relativism. As he sees things, we accept a theory which licenses us to assert “Electrons exist” and also licenses us to assert “if humans were to disappear from this planet, electrons need not follow in their train” since the theory assures us that the existence of electrons in no way causally depends on the existence of humans. For the anti-realist our well-founded practices of assertion ground at one and the same time our conception of the world and our conception of humanity’s place within it.

Realists might still worry that whether there are to be any electrons in the anti-realist’s ontology apparently depends upon the conceptual schemes humans happen to chance upon and Putnam himself encourages this interpretation: “‘objects’ do not exist independently of conceptual schemes” [Putnam 1981]. The relativity of existence to conceptual scheme is, in this respect, quite unlike the relativity of simultaneity to frame of reference.

Still, anti-realists maintain that there are actual instances of conceptual schemes that explain the same phenomena equally well, schemes which, they aver, realists must judge to be logically incompatible. The earlier example of competing theories of space-time was a case in point. On one theory, $$T_1$$, space-time consists of unextended spatiotemporal points and regions of space-time are sets of these points. According to the second theory, $$T_2$$, space-time consists of extended spatiotemporal regions and points are logical constructions—convergent sets of regions. Realists will judge that only one of the two theories can be true if they really are logically incompatible. Anti-realists respond that the two theories $$T_1$$ and $$T_2$$ cannot differ in truth-value since they are descriptively equivalent.

Anti-realists regard two theories as descriptively equivalent if each theory can be interpreted in the other and both theories explain the same phenomena. Is there nothing more to the notion of descriptive equivalence than this? Realists might not accept that there isn’t.

Consider our two competing theories of space-time $$T_1$$ and $$T_2$$ again. Are $$T_1$$ and $$T_2$$ descriptively equivalent? At the stroke of midnight Cinderella’s carriage changes into a pumpkin—it is a carriage up to midnight, a pumpkin thereafter. According to the region-based theory $$T_2$$ which takes temporal intervals as its primitives, that’s all there is to it. But if there are temporal points, instants, as $$T_1$$ affirms, there is a further issue left undecided by this story—viz, at the moment of midnight is the carriage still a carriage or is it a pumpkin?

So does the region-based theory fail to recognize certain facts or are these putative facts merely artefacts of the punctate theory’s descriptive resources, reflecting nothing in reality? We cannot declare the two theories $$T_1$$ and $$T_2$$ descriptively equivalent until we resolve this question at least.

In fact, there is no reason why realists cannot agree with anti-realists in regarding the conflict between a punctate geometry and a region-based geometry as merely apparent. Thomas William Barrett and Hans Halvorson argue that the two theories “ … are simply convenient ways of expressing the geometric facts that are more fully expressed by a comprehensive theory” that quantifies over both points and lines. $$T_1$$ and $$T_2$$ cannot be incompatible according to Barrett and Halvorson because they are in essence the same theory [Barrett and Halvorson 2017]. However, the geometric case is a rather special one.

Consider another Putnam-styled case [Putnam 2004]. Ernie looks into his bag and sees there are 3 coins and nothing else and announces “There are exactly 3 objects in my bag.” Maxi looks into Ernie’s bag and shakes her head “No Ernie there are 7 objects in your bag!” she corrects him. The Carnapian pluralist feels she can defuse the conflict and accommodate both points of view by maintaining that whilst 3 objects exist-in-$$E$$ (where $$E$$ is Ernie’s everyday framework), 7 objects exist-in-$$M$$ (with $$M$$ Maxi’s mereological framework). But even if Maxi can endorse both of these claims (since the mereological objects include Ernie’s 3 coins), it is not at all certain Ernie can do so. If Ernie is unpersuaded that mereological fusions of objects are themselves objects, then Maxi’s putative truthmaker for her framework-relative existence claim “7 objects exist-in-$$M$$” will be unconvincing to him.

For this case, the pluralist’s suggestion that 3 objects exist-in-$$E$$ but 7 objects exist-in-$$M$$ is not clearly warranted. There are simpler explanations: one is that by ‘object’ Ernie means ordinary object, by ‘object’ Maxi means mereological object. Nothing deeper than that is required to explain their disagreement. Rather than existence or truth that is relativized, the meanings of their terms differ. On this account, pluralists have mistaken a plurality of meanings for a plurality of modes of being. However, other explanations are also possible: for instance, it may be that Ernie and Maxi do mean the same thing by ‘object’ but hold incompatible theories about what counts as an object. More importantly, as a reviewer noted, the debate need not turn on the notion of an object: it can proceed with quantifiers, for example. The disagreement then would arise from divergent interpretations of those quantifiers.

Putnam’s pluralism has provoked very different reactions from realists. Some argue that conceptual pluralism is consistent with realism [Lynch 1998; Horgan and Timmons 2002; Sosa 2003], others take Putnam’s pluralism to amount to the claim that ontological expressions are either indeterminate or that alternative ontologies are equally good, both alternatives being problematic [Eklund 2008]. Realists cannot make sense of the Carnapian idea that existence and truth are relative to a conceptual scheme [Brueckner 1998]. Peter van Inwagen provides a trenchant criticism of Putnam’s claims [van Inwagen 2002]:

I cannot grant that ‘Carnap’s’ [DK: Ernie’s] and ‘The Polish logician’s’ [DK: Maxi’s] descriptions are equally good or equivalent descriptions of the population of a world [DK: e.g. the contents of Ernie’s bag]—not at least if Carnap’s description is ‘a world that contains three mereological simples and nothing else’. I cannot grant that they could be ‘equally good or equivalent descriptions of the population of a world’ since they are straightforwardly incompatible.

Recently, however, some impressive neo-Carnapian defences of conceptual pluralism have been proposed that bring new considerations to bear on these debates. We briefly review some of these in section 5.

5. Realism and Anti-Realism in Meta-Ontology

Debates in meta-ontology (analytic ontology) over the last twenty years have sparked renewed interest in realism. They have also seen a marked shift in how realism, i.e. ontological realism, is understood. “The central question of metaontology”, Theodore Sider, a prominent ontological realist, contends, “is that of whether there are many equally good quantifier meanings, or whether there is a single best quantifier meaning.” [Sider 2009, p.397]. Where Sider argues for a single best quantifier meaning, Eli Hirsch believes there are a multiplicity of possible quantifier meanings that are equally good, a thesis he calls Quantifier Variance. This meaning-theoretic focus is something new.[10]

It is no surprise, then, to find that the positions marked out as ‘realist’ and ‘anti-realist’ by those engaged in ontological disputes do not always coincide with realism and anti-realism as we have explained these metaphysical views.[11]

A more significant division is between metaontologists who accept a robust conception of ontology, and deflationists about ontology who don’t. Sider defends robust ontology [Sider 2009, 385–386]:

“ontological deflationists”… have said … when some particles are arranged tablewise, there is no “substantive” question of whether there also exists a table composed of those particles. There are simply different — and equally good — ways to talk. I, on the other hand, accept a very strong realism about ontology. I think that questions about the existence of composite objects are substantive, just as substantive as the question of whether there are extra-terrestrials.

Neo-Carnapians such as Putnam, Eli Hirsch, David Chalmers, Amie Thomasson, and Huw Price are ontological deflationists who embrace conceptual pluralism about ontological matters. Hirsch, however, thinks conceptual pluralism is perfectly consistent with realism [Hirsch, E. 2002]. Matti Eklund understands Hirsch to mean that he considers the world to be an amorphous lump [Eklund, M., 2008] (citing Michael Dummett), a ‘lump’ that alternative and equally feasible conceptual schemes serve to make intelligible. For Sider, in contrast, rejecting an intrinsic structure to the world is to reject realism.[12]

Competing views about temporal persistence do not seem to be semantic in nature. While Perdurantists believe that things persist through time by virtue of having temporal parts that perdure, Endurantists reject the notion of temporal parts as incoherent —things persist by enduring: they are wholly present whenever they exist. As observed in the entry on temporal parts:

This looks like a straightforward ontological disagreement, a dispute about what exists.

Eli Hirsch is not convinced, however:

I claim that the dispute between Endurantists and Perdurantists is verbal … each party ought to agree the other party speaks a truth in his own language. [Hirsch 2011, 229]

How can this be? Endurantists think perdurantists are guilty of spatializing time when they talk about temporal parts; perdurantists think enduring objects cannot explain change. How can there be a rapprochement of the sort Hirsch has in mind?

Hirsch’s novel and intriguing idea is that what makes the endurantist/perdurantist temporal parts debate and the nihilist/universalist mereological debate merely verbal ones is the fact that the protagonists in these debates mean different things by their quantifiers, in particular their existential quantifiers, in their ontological assertions. While both protagonists speak a common language, here English, in which certain ontological claims such as ‘there are tables’ happen to come out true, this is a superficial socio-linguistic fact about English that might not have been so: we and they could just as easily have spoken English* (an ontological nihilist language) in which the sentence ‘there are tables’ came out false. Protagonists in these ontological disputes are, unwittingly, engaged in a ‘merely verbal’ debate and are thus talking past each other.[13]

How does the deflationist tell that an ontological dispute is a ‘merely verbal’ one? Hirsch thinks that when we interpret the words of another, we assign truth-conditions to their sentences by matching those sentences with sets of possible worlds, guided by the metasemantic maxim that the speaker’s assertion of those sentences should come out true. The maxim applies to ontological disputes such as the Ernie/Maxi dispute about mereology — there are possible languages in which both speakers’ assertions come out true. Hirsch contends: “speakers of either language should allow that speakers of the other language assert sentences that have the same characters (DK: functions from contexts of utterance to truth-conditions) and the same truth-values as they themselves assert.” [Hirsch 2009, p.242].

In this way Ernie should attribute the same set of possible worlds (intensions) to Maxi’s sentence ‘There are seven objects in your bag’ as he associates with his own sentence ‘There are three objects in my bag’ and Ernie should interpret Maxi as uttering a truth in so doing. Ernie and Maxi are asserting the very same proposition but are using different words to express it. They are, as a result, simply talking past each other.

Hirsch’s doctrine of quantifier variance QV dominates current metaontological debate. Some have questioned whether interpreters on one side of an ontological dispute can admit that the language of those on the other side is possible. For to do so each interpreter must be able to provide a Tarskian semantics for the other’s language. But an Endurantist won’t be able to do this for the Perdurantist’s sentence such as ‘Alicet is a temporal part of Alice’ since the predicate ‘is a temporal part of’ has an empty extension in the Endurantist’s language [Hawthorne 2006; Eklund 2009]. Others suspect QV is an internally unstable position: how can an Endurantist speaking her language E allow that a sentence like ‘Alicet is a temporal part of Alice’ is a true sentence of the Perdurantist’s language P without admitting that there are temporal parts [e.g. Hale and Wright 2009; Dorr 2014]? Warren 2015 provides a convincing QV response to this ‘Collapse’ argument. An important resource, containing papers by some of the authors cited, is the collection of essays anthologised in Chalmers et al 2009 [For background on mereology see the entry mereology and for discussion of whether there are composite objects, see the entry material constitution and the entry ordinary objects].

The meaning-theoretic focus on Quantifier Variance in metaontology represents a fascinating development. The implications for ontological realism are as yet undecided.

6. Summary

We have considered a number of challenges to realism, the thesis that the objects and properties that the world contains, its nature and structure, exist independently of our conception or perception of them. Historically, these challenges came from two camps: (1) neo-verificationists led by Dummett who assimilate belief in mind-independent world to a belief in a verification-transcendent conception of truth which they profess to find unintelligible, and (2) pragmatists and pluralists led by Putnam who also question the intelligibility of the realist’s mind-independent world but for reasons independent of any commitment to verificationism. While neo-verificationism today claims few adherents, within the ranks of analytic ontologists, pluralism and Carnap’s version of it in particular, has enjoyed something of a revival. Today, the most active and engaging debates about realism are meta-ontological ones that involve neo-Carnapian pluralists and their ontological realist opponents.

Both the historical debate between realists and their anti-realist opponents and the meta-ontological debate are still very much open. If realists could provide a plausible theory about how correspondences between mental symbols and the items in the world to which they refer might be set up, many of these challenges could be met. Alternatively, if they could explain how, consistently with our knowledge of a mind-independent world, no such correspondences are required to begin with, many of the anti-realist objections would fall away as irrelevant. In the absence of such explanations it is still entirely reasonable for realists to believe that the correspondences are in place, however, and there can, indeed, be very good evidence for believing this. Ignorance of Nature’s reference-fixing mechanism is no reason for denying it exists.

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