First published Mon Jul 8, 2002; substantive revision Fri Dec 13, 2019

The question of the nature and plausibility of realism arises with respect to a large number of subject matters, including ethics, aesthetics, causation, modality, science, mathematics, semantics, and the everyday world of macroscopic material objects and their properties. Although it would be possible to accept (or reject) realism across the board, it is more common for philosophers to be selectively realist or non-realist about various topics: thus it would be perfectly possible to be a realist about the everyday world of macroscopic objects and their properties, but a non-realist about aesthetic and moral value. In addition, it is misleading to think that there is a straightforward and clear-cut choice between being a realist and a non-realist about a particular subject matter. Rather, one can be more-or-less realist about a particular subject matter. Also, there are many different forms that realism and non-realism can take.

The question of the nature and plausibility of realism is so controversial that no brief account of it will satisfy all those with a stake in the debates between realists and non-realists. This article offers a broad brush characterization of realism, and then fills out some of the detail by looking at a few canonical examples of opposition to realism. The discussion of forms of opposition to realism is far from exhaustive and is designed only to illustrate a few paradigm examples of the form such opposition can take. Note that the point of this discussion is not to attack realism, but rather to give a sense of the options available for those who wish to oppose realism in a given case, and of the problems faced by those main forms of opposition to realism.

There are two general aspects to realism, illustrated by looking at realism about the everyday world of macroscopic objects and their properties. First, there is a claim about existence. Tables, rocks, the moon, and so on, all exist, as do the following facts: the table’s being square, the rock’s being made of granite, and the moon’s being spherical and yellow. The second aspect of realism about the everyday world of macroscopic objects and their properties concerns independence. The fact that the moon exists and is spherical is independent of anything anyone happens to say or think about the matter. Likewise, although there is a clear sense in which the table’s being square is dependent on us (it was designed and constructed by human beings after all), this is not the type of dependence that the realist wishes to deny. The realist wishes to claim that apart from the mundane sort of empirical dependence of objects and their properties familiar to us from everyday life, there is no further (philosophically interesting) sense in which everyday objects and their properties can be said to be dependent on anyone’s linguistic practices, conceptual schemes, or whatever.

In general, where the distinctive objects of a subject-matter are a, b, c, … , and the distinctive properties are F-ness, G-ness, H-ness and so on, realism about that subject matter will typically take the form of a claim like the following:

Generic Realism:
a, b, and c and so on exist, and the fact that they exist and have properties such as F-ness, G-ness, and H-ness is (apart from mundane empirical dependencies of the sort sometimes encountered in everyday life) independent of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices, conceptual schemes, and so on.

Non-realism can take many forms, depending on whether or not it is the existence or independence dimension of realism that is questioned or rejected. The forms of non-realism can vary dramatically from subject-matter to subject-matter, but error-theories, non-cognitivism, instrumentalism, nominalism,relativism, certain styles of reductionism, and eliminativism typically reject realism by rejecting the existence dimension, while idealism, subjectivism, and anti-realism typically concede the existence dimension but reject the independence dimension. Philosophers who subscribe to quietism deny that there can be such a thing as substantial metaphysical debate between realists and their non-realist opponents (because they either deny that there are substantial questions about existence or deny that there are substantial questions about independence).

1. Preliminaries

Three preliminary comments are needed. Firstly, there has been a great deal of debate in recent philosophy about the relationship between realism, construed as a metaphysical doctrine, and doctrines in the theory of meaning and philosophy of language concerning the nature of truth and its role in accounts of linguistic understanding (see Dummett 1978 and Devitt 1991a for radically different views on the issue). Independent of the issue about the relationship between metaphysics and the theory of meaning, the well-known disquotational properties of the truth-predicate allow claims about objects, properties, and facts to be framed as claims about the truth of sentences. Since:

‘The moon is spherical’ is true if and only if the moon is spherical,

the claim that the moon exists and is spherical independently of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices and conceptual schemes, can be framed as the claim that the sentences ‘The moon exists’ and ‘The moon is spherical’ are true independently of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices, conceptual schemes and so on. As Devitt points out (1991b: 46) availing oneself of this way of talking does not entail that one sees the metaphysical issue of realism as ‘really’ a semantic issue about the nature of truth (if it did, any question about any subject matter would turn out to be ‘really’ a semantic issue).

Secondly, although in introducing the notion of realism above mention is made of objects, properties, and facts, no theoretical weight is attached to the notion of a ‘fact’, or the notions of ‘object’ and ‘property’. To say that it is a fact that the moon is spherical is just to say that the object, the moon, instantiates the property of being spherical, which is just to say that the moon is spherical. There are substantial metaphysical issues about the nature of facts, objects, and properties, and the relationships between them (see Mellor and Oliver 1997 and Lowe 2002, part IV), but these are not of concern here.

Thirdly, as stated above, Generic Realism about the mental or the intentional would strictly speaking appear to be ruled out ab initio, since clearly Jones’ believing that Cardiff is in Wales is not independent of facts about belief: trivially, it is dependent on the fact that Jones believes that Cardiff is in Wales. However, such trivial dependencies are not what are at issue in debates between realists and non-realists about the mental and the intentional. A non-realist who objected to the independence dimension of realism about the mental would claim that Jones’ believing that Cardiff is in Wales depends in some non-trivial sense on facts about beliefs, etc.

2. Views Opposing the Existence Dimension (I): Error-Theory and Arithmetic

There are at least two distinct ways in which a non-realist can reject the existence dimension of realism about a particular subject matter. The first of these rejects the existence dimension by rejecting the claim that the distinctive objects of that subject-matter exist, while the second admits that those objects exist but denies that they instantiate any of the properties distinctive of that subject-matter. Non-realism of the first kind can be illustrated via Hartry Field’s error-theoretic account of arithmetic, and non-realism of the second kind via J.L. Mackie’s error-theoretic account of morals. This will show how realism about a subject-matter can be questioned on both epistemological and metaphysical grounds.

According to a platonist about arithmetic, the truth of the sentence ‘7 is prime’ entails the existence of an abstract object, the number 7. This object is abstract because it has no spatial or temporal location, and is causally inert. A platonic realist about arithmetic will say that the number 7 exists and instantiates the property of being prime independently of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices, conceptual schemes, and so on. A certain kind of nominalist rejects the existence claim which the platonic realist makes: there are no abstract objects, so sentences such as ‘7 is prime’ are false (hence the name ‘error-theory’). Platonists divide on their account of the epistemology of arithmetic: some claim that our knowledge of arithmetical fact proceeds by way of some quasi-perceptual encounter with the abstract realm (Gödel 1983), while others have attempted to resuscitate a qualified form of Frege’s logicist project of grounding knowledge of arithmetical fact in knowledge of logic (Wright 1983, Hale 1987, Hale and Wright 2001).

The main arguments against platonic realism turn on the idea that the platonist position precludes a satisfactory epistemology of arithmetic. For the classic exposition of the doubt that platonism can square its claims to accommodate knowledge of arithmetical truth with its conception of the subject matter of arithmetic as causally inert, see Benacerraf (1973). Benacerraf argued that platonism faces difficulties in squaring its conception of the subject-matter of arithmetic with a general causal constraint on knowledge (roughly, that a subject can be said to know that P only if she stands in some causal relation to the subject matter of P). In response, platonists have attacked the idea that a plausible causal constraint on ascriptions of knowledge can be formulated (Wright 1983 Ch.2, Hale 1987 Ch.4). In response, Hartry Field, on the side of the anti-platonists, has developed a new variant of Benacerraf’s epistemological challenge which does not depend for its force on maintaining a generalised causal constraint on ascriptions of knowledge. Rather, Field argues that ‘we should view with suspicion any claim to know facts about a certain domain if we believe it impossible to explain the reliability of our beliefs about that domain’ (Field 1989: 232–3). Field’s challenge to the platonist is to offer an account of what such a platonist should regard as a datum—i.e. that when ‘p’ is replaced by a mathematical sentence, the following schema holds in most instances:

If mathematicians accept ‘p’ then p. (1989: 230)

Field’s point is not simply, echoing Benacerraf, that no causal account of reliability will be available to the platonist, and therefore to the platonic realist. Rather, Field suggests that not only has the platonic realist no recourse to any explanation of reliability that is causal in character, but that she has no recourse to any explanation that is non-causal in character either.

(T)here seems prima facie to be a difficulty in principle in explaining the regularity. The problem arises in part from the fact that mathematical entities as the [platonic realist] conceives them, do not causally interact with mathematicians, or indeed with anything else. This means we cannot explain the mathematicians beliefs and utterances on the basis of the mathematical facts being causally involved in the production of those beliefs and utterances; or on the basis of the beliefs or utterances causally producing the mathematical facts; or on the basis of some common cause producing both. Perhaps then some sort of non-causal explanation of the correlation is possible? Perhaps; but it is very hard to see what this supposed non-causal explanation could be. Recall that on the usual platonist picture [i.e. platonic realism], mathematical objects are supposed to be mind- and language-independent; they are supposed to bear no spatiotemporal relations to anything, etc. The problem is that the claims that the [platonic realist] makes about mathematical objects appears to rule out any reasonable strategy for explaining the systematic correlation in question. (1989: 230–1)

This suggests the following dilemma for the platonic realist:

  1. Platonic realism is committed to the existence of acausal objects and to the claim that these objects, and facts about them, are independent of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices, conceptual schemes, and so on (in short to the claim that these objects, and facts about them, are language- and mind-independent).
  2. Any causal explanation of reliability is incompatible with the acausality of mathematical objects.
  3. Any non-causal explanation of reliability is incompatible with the language- and mind-independence of mathematical objects.
  4. Any explanation of reliability must be causal or non-causal.
  5. There is no explanation of reliability that is compatible with both the acausality and language- and mind-independence of mathematical objects.


  6. There is no explanation of reliability that is compatible with platonic realism.

Whether there is a version of platonic realism with the resources to see off Field’s epistemological challenge is very much a live issue (see Hale 1994, Divers and Miller 1999. For replies to Divers and Miller see Sosa 2002, Shapiro 2007 and Piazza 2011, Paseau 2012).

Field’s alternative proposal to platonic realism (1980, 1989) is that although mathematical sentences such as ‘7 is prime’ are false, the utility of mathematical theories can be explained otherwise than in terms of their truth. For Field, the utility of mathematical theories resides not in their truth but in their conservativeness, where a mathematical theory S is conservative if and only if for any nominalistically respectable statement A (i.e. a statement whose truth does not imply the existence of abstract objects) and any body of such statements N, A is not a consequence of the conjunction of N and S unless A is a consequence of N alone (Field 1989: 125). In short, mathematics is useful, not because it allows you to derive conclusions that you couldn’t have derived from nominalistically respectable premises alone, but rather because it makes the derivation of those (nominalistically respectable) conclusions easier than it might otherwise have been. Whether or not Field’s particular brand of error-theory about arithmetic is plausible is a topic of some debate, which unfortunately cannot be pursued further here (see Hale and Wright 2001).

3. Views Opposing the Existence Dimension (II): Error-Theory and Morality

According to Field’s error-theory of arithmetic, the objects distinctive of arithmetic do not exist, and it is this which leads to the rejection of the existence dimension of arithmetical realism, at least as platonistically conceived (for a non-platonistic view of arithmetic which is at least potentially realist, see Benacerraf 1965; for incisive discussion, see Wright 1983, Ch.3). J. L. Mackie, on the other hand, proposes an error-theoretic account of morals, not because there are no objects or entities that could form the subject matter of ethics (it is no part of Mackie’s brief to deny the existence of persons and their actions and so on), but because it is implausible to suppose that the sorts of properties that moral properties would have to be are ever instantiated in the world (Mackie 1977, Ch.1). Like Field on arithmetic, then, Mackie’s central claim about the atomic, declarative sentences of ethics (such as ‘Napoleon was evil’) is that they are systematically and uniformly false. How might one argue for such a radical-sounding thesis? The clearest way to view Mackie’s argument for the error-theory is as a conjunction of a conceptual claim with an ontological claim (following Smith 1994, pp. 63–66). The conceptual claim is that moral facts are objective and categorically prescriptive facts, or, equivalently, that our concept of a moral property is a concept of an objective and categorically prescriptive quality (what Mackie means by this is explained below). The ontological claim is simply that there are no objective and categorically prescriptive facts, that objective and categorically prescriptive properties are nowhere instantiated. The conclusion is that there is nothing in the world answering to our moral concepts, no facts or properties which render the judgements formed via those moral concepts true. Our moral (atomic) moral judgements are systematically false. We can thus construe the argument for the error-theory as follows:

  1. Conceptual Claim: Moral facts are objective and categorically prescriptive facts.
  2. If there are moral facts, then there are objective and categorically prescriptive facts (Definitional consequence of the Conceptual Claim)
  3. If there are true, atomic, declarative moral sentences, then there are objective and categorically prescriptive facts.
  4. Ontological Claim: there are no objectively and categorically prescriptive facts.


  1. There are no moral facts.


  1. Conclusion: There are no true, atomic, declarative moral sentences.

The conclusion of this argument clearly follows from its premises, so the question facing those who wish to defend at least the existence dimension of realism in the case of morals is whether the premises are true. (Note that strictly speaking what the argument purports to establish is that there are no moral facts as-we-conceive-of-them. Thus, it may be possible to block the argument by advocating a revisionary approach to our moral concepts; or by deploying a Ramsey-Carnap-Lewis conception of theoretical terms and arguing that there are moral facts, just ones that do not answer to our concept but which (coming closer than other candidates) would best deserve the “moral fact” label (see Smith 1994), section 2.10 for a good explanation of the application of the Ramsey-Lewis-Carnap conception in the moral case).

Mackie’s conceptual claim in effect amounts to the claim that our concept of a moral requirement is the concept of an objectively, categorically prescriptive requirement. What does this mean? To say that moral requirements are prescriptive is to say that they tell us how we ought to act, to say that they give us reasons for acting. Thus, to say that something is morally good is to say that we ought to pursue it, that we have reason to pursue it. To say that something is morally bad is to say that we ought not to pursue it, that we have reason not to pursue it. To say that moral requirements are categorically prescriptive is to say that these reasons are categorical in the sense of Kant’s categorical imperatives. The reasons for action that moral requirements furnish are not contingent upon the possession of any desires or wants on the part of the agent to whom they are addressed: I cannot release myself from the requirement imposed by the claim that torturing the innocent is wrong by citing some desire or inclination that I have. This contrasts, for example, with the requirement imposed by the claim that perpetual lateness at work is likely to result in one losing one’s job: I can release myself from the requirement imposed by this claim by citing my desire to lose my job (perhaps because I find it unfulfilling, or whatever). Reasons for action which are contingent in this way on desires and inclinations are furnished by what Kant called hypothetical imperatives.

So our concept of a moral requirement is a concept of a categorically prescriptive requirement. But Mackie claims further that our concept of a moral requirement is a concept of an objective and categorically prescriptive requirement. What does it mean to say that a requirement is objective? Mackie says a lot of different-sounding things about this, and the following (as outlined in Miller 2013a) is by no means a comprehensive list (references are to Ch. 1 of Mackie 1977). To call a requirement objective is to say that it can be an object of knowledge (24, 31, 33), that it can be true or false (26, 33), that it can be perceived (31, 33), that it can be recognised (42), that it is prior to and independent of our preferences and choices (30, 43), that it is a source of authority external to our preferences and choices (32, 34, 43), that it is part of the fabric of the world (12), that it backs up and validates some of our preferences and choices (22), that it is capable of being simply true (30) or valid as a matter of general logic (30), that it is not constituted by our choosing or deciding to think in a certain way (30), that it is extra-mental (23), that it is something of which we can be aware (38), that it is something that can be introspected (39), that it is something that can figure as a premise in an explanatory hypothesis or inference (39), and so on. Mackie plainly does not take these to be individually necessary: facts about subatomic particles, for example, may qualify as objective in virtue of figuring in explanatory hypotheses even though they cannot be objects of perceptual acquaintance. But his intention is plain enough: these are the sorts of conditions whose satisfaction by a fact renders it objective as opposed to subjective. Mackie’s conceptual claim about morality is thus that our concept of a moral requirement is a concept of a fact which is objective in at least some of the senses just listed, while his ontological claim will be that the world does not contain any facts which are both candidates for being moral facts and yet which play even some of the roles distinctive of objective facts.

How plausible is Mackie’s conceptual claim? This issue cannot be discussed in detail here, except to note that while it seems plausible to claim that if our concept of a moral fact is a concept of a reason for action then that concept must be a concept of a categorical reason for action, it is not so clear why we have to say that our concept of a moral fact is a concept of a reason for action at all. If we deny this, we can concede the conditional claim whilst resisting Mackie’s conceptual claim. One way to do this would be to question the assumption, implicit in the exposition of Mackie’s argument for the conceptual claim above, that an ‘ought’-statement that binds an agent A provides that agent with a reason for action. For an example of a version of moral realism that attempts to block Mackie’s conceptual claim in this way, see Railton (1986). For defence of Mackie’s conceptual claim, see Smith (1994), Ch.3 and Joyce (2001). For exposition and critical discussion, see Miller (2013a), Ch.9.

What is Mackie’s argument for his ontological claim? This is set out in his ‘argument from queerness’ (Mackie has another argument, the ‘argument from relativity’ (or ‘argument from disagreement’) (1977: 36–38), but this argument cannot be discussed here for reasons of space. For a useful discussion, see Brink (1984)).The argument from queerness has both metaphysical and epistemological components. The metaphysical problem with objective values concerns ‘the metaphysical peculiarity of the supposed objective values, in that they would have to be intrinsically action-guiding and motivating’ (49). The epistemological problem concerns ‘the difficulty of accounting for our knowledge of value entities or features and of their links with the features on which they would be consequential’ (49). Let’s look at each type of worry more closely in turn.

Expounding the metaphysical part of the argument from queerness, Mackie writes: “If there were objective values, then they would be entities or relations of a very strange sort, utterly different from anything else in the universe.” (38) What is so strange about them? Mackie says that Plato’s Forms (and for that matter, Moore’s non-natural qualities) give us a ‘dramatic picture’ of what objective values would be, if there were any:

The Form of the Good is such that knowledge of it provides the knower with both a direction and an overriding motive; something’s being good both tells the person who knows this to pursue it and makes him pursue it. An objective good would be sought by anyone who was acquainted with it, not because of any contingent fact that this person, or every person, is so constituted that he desires this end, but just because the end has to-be-pursuedness somehow built into it. Similarly, if there were objective principles of right and wrong, any wrong (possible) course of action would have not-to-be-doneness somehow built into it. Or we should have something like Clarke’s necessary relations of fitness between situations and actions, so that a situation would have a demand for such-and-such an action somehow built into it (40).

The obtaining of a moral state of affairs would be the obtaining of a situation ‘with a demand for such and such an action somehow built into it’; the states of affairs which we find in the world do not have such demands built into them, they are ‘normatively inert’, as it were. Thus, the world contains no moral states of affairs, situations which consist in the instantiation of a moral quality.

Mackie now backs up this metaphysical argument with an epistemological argument:

If we were aware [of objective values], it would have to be by some special faculty of moral perception or intuition, utterly different from our ways of knowing everything else. These points were recognised by Moore when he spoke of non-natural qualities, and by the intuitionists in their talk about a faculty of moral intuition. Intuitionism has long been out of favour, and it is indeed easy to point out its implausibilities. What is not so often stressed, but is more important, is that the central thesis of intuitionism is one to which any objectivist view of values is in the end committed: intuitionism merely makes unpalatably plain what other forms of objectivism wrap up (38).

In short, our ordinary conceptions of how we might come into cognitive contact with states of affairs, and thereby acquire knowledge of them, cannot cope with the idea that the states of affairs are objective values. So we are forced to expand that ordinary conception to include forms of moral perception and intuition. But these are completely unexplanatory: they are really just placeholders for our capacity to form correct moral judgements (the reader should here hear an echo of the complaints Benacerraf and Field raise against arithmetical platonism).

Evaluating the argument from queerness is well outwith the scope of the present entry. While Railton’s version of moral realism attempts to block Mackie’s overall argument by conceding his ontological claim whilst rejecting his conceptual claim, other versions of moral realism agree with Mackie’s conceptual claim but reject his ontological claim. Examples of the latter version, and attempts to provide the owed response to the argument from queerness, can be found in Smith (1994), Ch.6, and McDowell (1998), Chs 4–10.“Companions in Guilt” style responses attempt to undermine Mackie’s argument by suggesting that if it were sound, it would undermine much more than moral realism. For an example of such a strategy, see Cuneo (2007). For a general discussion, see Lillehammer (2010).

There are two main ways in which one might respond to Mackie’s argument for the error-theory: directly, via contesting one of its premises or inferences, or indirectly, pointing to some internal tension within the error-theory itself. Some possible direct responses have already been mentioned, responses which reject either the conceptual or ontological claims that feature as premises in Mackie’s argument for the error-theory. An indirect argument against the error-theory has been developed in recent writings by Crispin Wright (this argument is intended to apply also to Field’s error-theory of arithmetic).

Mackie claims that the error-theory of moral judgement is a second-order theory, which does not necessarily have implications for the first order practice of making moral judgements (1977: 16). Wright’s argument against the error-theory begins by suggesting otherwise:

The great discomfort with [Mackie’s] view is that, unless more is said, it simply relegates moral discourse to bad faith. Whatever we may once have thought, as soon as philosophy has taught us that the world is unsuited to confer truth on any of our claims about what is right, or wrong, or obligatory, etc., the reasonable response ought surely to be to forgo the right to making any such claims …. If it is of the essence of moral judgement to aim at the truth, and if philosophy teaches us that there is no moral truth to hit, how are we supposed to take ourselves seriously in thinking the way we do about any issue which we regard as of major moral importance? (1996: 2; see also 1992: 9).

Wright realises that the error-theorist is likely to have a story to tell about the point of moral discourse, about “some norm of appraisal besides truth, at which its statements can be seen as aimed, and which they can satisfy.” (1996: 2) And Mackie has such a story: the point of moral discourse is—to simplify—to secure the benefits of social co-operation (1973: chapter 5 passim; note that this is the analogue in Mackie’s theory of Field’s notion of the conservativeness of mathematical theories). Suppose we can extract from this story some subsidiary norm distinct from truth, which governs the practice of forming moral judgements. Then, for example, ‘Honesty is good’ and ‘Dishonesty is good’, although both false, will not be on a par in point of their contribution to the satisfaction of the subsidiary norm: if accepted widely enough, the former will presumably facilitate the satisfaction of the subsidiary norm, while the latter, if accepted widely enough, will frustrate it. Wright questions whether Mackie’s moral sceptic can plausibly combine such a story about the benefits of the practice of moral judgement with the central negative claim of the error-theory:

[I]f, among the welter of falsehoods which we enunciate in moral discourse, there is a good distinction to be drawn between those which are acceptable in the light of some such subsidiary norm and those which are not—a distinction which actually informs ordinary discussion and criticism of moral claims—then why insist on construing truth for moral discourse in terms which motivate a charge of global error, rather than explicate it in terms of the satisfaction of the putative subsidiary norm, whatever it is? The question may have a good answer. The error-theorist may be able to argue that the superstition that he finds in ordinary moral thought goes too deep to permit of any construction of moral truth which avoids it to be acceptable as an account of moral truth. But I do not know of promising argument in that direction (1996: 3; see also 1992: 10).

Wright thus argues that even if we concede to the error-theorist that his original scepticism about moral truth is well-founded, the error-theorist’s own positive proposal will be inherently unstable. In recent years, inspired by error-theory, philosophers have developed forms of moral fictionalism, according to which moral claims either are or ought to be “useful fictions”. See Kalderon 2005 and Joyce 2001 for examples. For a book-length treatment of moral error-theory, see Olson 2014.

The error-theories proposed by Mackie and Field are non-eliminativist error-theories, and should be contrasted with the kind of eliminativist error-theory proposed by e.g. Paul Churchland concerning folk-psychological propositional attitudes (see Churchland 1981). Churchland argues that our everyday talk of propositional attitudes such as beliefs, desires and intentions should eventually be abandoned given developments in neuroscience. Mackie and Field make no analogous claims concerning morality and arithmetic: no claim, that is, to the effect that they will one day be in principle replaceable by philosophically hygienic counterparts. For some discussion of the contrast between eliminativist and non-eliminativist error theories, see Miller (2015).

4. Reductionism and Non-Reductionism

Although some commentators (e.g. Pettit 1991) require that a realistic view of a subject matter be non-reductionist about the distinctive objects, properties, and facts of that subject matter, the reductionist/non-reductionist issue is really orthogonal to the various debates about realism. There are a number of reasons for this, with the reasons varying depending on the type of reduction proposed.

Suppose, first of all, that one wished to deny the existence claim which is a component of platonic realism about arithmetic. One way to do this would be to propose an analytic reduction of talk seemingly involving abstract entities to talk concerning only concrete entities. This can be illustrated by considering a language the truth of whose sentences seemingly entails the existence of a type of abstract object, directions. Suppose there is a first order language L, containing a range of proper names ‘a’, ‘b’, ‘c’, and so on, where these denote straight lines conceived as concrete inscriptions. There are also predicates and relations defined on straight lines, including ‘ … is parallel to …’. ‘D( )’ is a singular term forming operator on lines, so that inserting the name of a concrete line, as in ‘D(a)’, produces a singular term standing for an abstract object, the direction of a. A number of contextual definitions are now introduced:

  1. D(a) = D(b)’ is true if and only if a is parallel to b.
  2. ‘ΠD(x)’ is true if and only if ‘Fx’ is true, where ‘… is parallel to …’ is a congruence for ‘F( )’.

(To say that ‘… is parallel to …’ is a congruence for ‘F( )’ is to say that if a is parallel to b and Fa, then it follows that Fb).

  1. ‘(∃xx’ is true if and only if ‘(∃x)Fx’ is true, where ‘Π’ and ‘F’ are as in (B).

According to a platonic realist, directions exist and have a nature which is independent of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices, conceptual schemes, and so on. But doesn’t the availability of (A), (B), and (C) undermine the existence claim at the heart of platonic realism? After all, (A), (B), and (C) allow us to paraphrase any sentence whose truth appears to entail the existence of abstract objects into a sentence whose truth involves only the existence of concrete inscriptions. Doesn’t this show that an analytic reduction can aid someone wishing to question the existence claim involved in a particular form of realism? There is a powerful argument, first developed by William Alston (1958), and convincingly resuscitated by Crispin Wright (1983, Ch.1), that suggests not. The analytic reductionist who wishes to wield the contextual definitions against the existence claim at the heart of platonic realism takes them to show that the apparent reference to abstract objects on the left-hand sides of the definitions is merely apparent: in fact, the truth of the relevant sentences entails only the existence of a range of concrete inscriptions. But the platonic realist can retort: what the contextual definitions show is that the apparent lack of reference to abstract objects on the right-hand sides is merely apparent. In fact, the platonic realist can say, the truth of the sentences figuring on the right-hand sides implicitly involves reference to abstract objects. If there is no way to break this deadlock the existence of the analytic reductive paraphrases will leave the existence claim at the heart of the relevant form of realism untouched. So the issue of this style of reductionism appears to be orthogonal to debates between realists and non-realists.

Can the same be said about non-analytic styles of reductionism? Again, there is no straightforward connection between the issue of reductionism and the issue of realism. The problem is that, to borrow some terminology and examples from Railton 1989, some reductions will be vindicative whilst others will be eliminativist. For example, the reduction of water to H20 is vindicative: it vindicates our belief that there is such a thing as water, rather than overturning it. On the other hand:

… the reduction of ‘polywater’—a peculiar form of water thought to have been observed in laboratories in the 1960s—to ordinary-water-containing-some-impurities-from-improperly-washed-glassware contributed to the conclusion that there really is no such substance as polywater (1989: 161).

Thus, a non-analytic reduction may or may not have implications for the existence dimension of a realistic view of a particular subject matter. And even if the existence dimension is vindicated, there is still the further question whether the objects and properties vindicated are independent of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices, and so on. Again, there is no straightforward relationship between the issue of reductionism and the issue of realism.

5. Views Opposing the Existence Dimension (III): Expressivism about Morals

We saw above that for the subject-matter in question the error-theorist agrees with the realist that the truth of the atomic, declarative sentences of that area requires the existence of the relevant type of objects, or the instantiation of the relevant sorts of properties. Although the realist and the error-theorist agree on this much, they of course disagree on the question of whether the relevant type of objects exist, or on whether the relevant sorts of properties are instantiated: the error-theorist claims that they don’t, so that the atomic, declarative sentences of the area are systematically and uniformly false, the realist claims that at least in some instances the relevant objects exist or the relevant properties are instantiated, so that the atomic, declarative sentences of the area are at least in some instances true. We also saw that an error-theory about a particular area could be motivated by epistemological worries (Field) or by a combination of epistemological and metaphysical worries (Mackie).

Another way in which the existence dimension of realism can be resisted is via expressivism. Whereas the realist and the error-theorist agree that the sentences of the relevant area are truth-apt, apt to be assessed in terms of truth and falsity, the realist and the expressivist (alternatively non-cognitivist, projectivist) disagree about the truth-aptness of those sentences. It is a fact about English that sentences in the declarative mood (‘The beer is in the fridge’) are conventionally used for making assertions, and assertions are true or false depending on whether or not the fact that is asserted to obtain actually obtains. But there are other grammatical moods that are conventionally associated with different types of speech-act. For example, sentences in the imperatival mood (‘Put the beer in the fridge’) are conventionally used for giving orders, and sentences in the interrogative mood (‘Is the beer in the fridge?’) are conventionally used for asking questions. Note that we would not ordinarily think of orders or questions as even apt for assessment in terms of truth and falsity: they are not truth-apt. Now the conventions mentioned here are not exceptionless: for example, one can use sentences in the declarative mood (‘My favourite drink is Belhaven 60 shilling’) to give an order (for some Belhaven 60 shilling), one can use sentences in the interrogative mood (‘Is the Pope a Catholic?’) to make an assertion (of whatever fact was the subject of the discussion), and so on. The expressivist about a particular area will claim that the realist is misled by the syntax of the sentences of that area into thinking that they are truth-apt: she will say that this is a case where the conventional association of the declarative mood with assertoric force breaks down. In the moral case the expressivist can claim that ‘Stealing is wrong’ is no more truth-apt than ‘Put the beer in the fridge’: it is just that the lack of truth-aptness of the latter is worn on its sleeve, while the lack of truth-aptness of the former is veiled by its surface syntax.(There are some very important issues concerning the relationship between minimalism about truth-aptitude and expressivism that we cannot go into here. See Divers and Miller (1995)and Miller (2013b) for some pointers. There are also some important differences between e.g. Ayer’s emotivism and more modern forms of expressivism (such as those developed by Blackburn and Gibbard) that we gloss over here. For a useful account, see Schroeder 2009).

So, if moral sentences are not conventionally used for the making of assertions, what are they conventionally used for? According to one classical form of expressivism, emotivism, they are conventionally used for the expression of emotion, feeling, or sentiment. Thus, A.J. Ayer writes:

If I say to someone, ‘You acted wrongly in stealing that money’, I am not stating anything more than if I had simply said, ‘You stole that money’. In adding that this action is wrong, I am not making any further statement about it. I am simply evincing my moral disapproval about it. It is as if I had said, ‘You stole that money’, in a peculiar tone of horror, or written with the addition of some special exclamation marks. The tone, or the exclamation marks, adds nothing to the literal meaning of the sentence. It merely serves to show that the expression of it is attended by certain feelings in the speaker (Ayer 1946: 107, emphases added).

It follows from this that:

If I now generalise my previous statement and say, ‘Stealing money is wrong,’ I produce a sentence which has no factual meaning—that is, expresses no proposition that can be either true or false (1946: 107).

Emotivism faces many problems, discussion of which is not possible here (for a survey, see Miller 2003a Ch.3). One problem that has been the bugbear of all expressivist versions of non-realism, the ‘Frege-Geach Problem’, is so-called because the classic modern formulation is by Peter Geach (1965), who attributes the original point to Frege.

According to emotivism, when I sincerely utter the sentence ‘Murder is wrong’ I am not expressing a belief or making an assertion, but rather expressing some non-cognitive sentiment or feeling, incapable of being true or false. Thus, the emotivist claims that in contexts where ‘is wrong’ is being applied to an action-type it is being used to express a sentiment or feeling of disapproval towards actions of that type. But what about contexts in which it is not being applied to an action type? An example of such a sentence would be ‘If murder is wrong, then getting little brother to murder people is wrong’. In the antecedent of this ‘is wrong’ is clearly not being applied to anything (compare: in uttering ‘If snow is black then it is not white’ I am not applying ‘is black’ to snow). So what account can the emotivist give of the use of ‘Murder is wrong’ within ‘unasserted contexts’, such as the antecedent of the conditional above? Since it is not there used to express disapproval of murder, the account of its semantic function must be different from that given for the apparently straightforward assertion expressed by ‘Murder is wrong’. But now there is a problem in accounting for the following valid inference:

  1. Murder is wrong.
  2. If Murder is wrong, then getting your little brother to murder people is wrong.


  1. Getting your little brother to murder people is wrong.

If the semantic function of ‘is wrong’ as it occurs within an asserted context in (1) is different from its semantic function as it occurs within an unasserted context in (2), isn’t someone arguing in this way simply guilty of equivocation? In order for the argument to be valid, the occurrence of ‘Murder is wrong’ in (1) has to mean the same thing as the occurrence of ‘Murder is wrong’ in (2). But if ‘is wrong’ has a different semantic function in (1) and (2), then it certainly doesn’t mean the same thing in (1) and (2), and so neither do the sentences in which it appears. So the above argument is apparently no more valid than:

  1. My beer has a head on it.
  2. If my beer has a head on it, then it must have eyes and ears.


  1. My beer must have eyes and ears.

This argument is obviously invalid, because it relies on an equivocation on two senses of ‘head’, in (4) and (5) respectively.

It is perhaps worth stressing why the Frege-Geach problem doesn’t afflict ethical theories which see ‘Murder is wrong’ as truth-apt, and sincere utterances of ‘Murder is wrong’ as capable of expressing straightforwardly truth-assessable beliefs. According to theories like these, moral modus ponens arguments such as the argument above from (1) and (2) to (3) are just like non-moral cases of modus ponens such as

  1. Smith is in Glasgow;
  2. If Smith is in Glasgow then Smith is in Scotland;


  1. Smith is in Scotland.

Why is this non-moral case of modus ponens not similarly invalid in virtue of the fact that ‘Smith is in Glasgow’ is asserted in (7), but not in (8)? The answer is of course that the state of affairs asserted to obtain by ‘Smith is in Glasgow’ in (7) is the same as that whose obtaining is merely entertained in the antecedent of (8). In (7) ‘Smith is in Glasgow’ is used to assert that a state of affairs obtains (Smith’s being in Glasgow), and in (8) it is asserted that if that state of affairs obtains, so does another (Smith’s being in Scotland). Throughout, the semantic function of the sentences concerned is given in terms of the states of affairs asserted to obtain in simple assertoric contexts. And it is difficult to see how an emotivist can say anything analogous to this with respect to the argument from (1) and (2) to (3): it is difficult to see how the semantic function of ‘Murder is wrong’ in the antecedent of (2) could be given in terms of the sentiment it allegedly expresses in (1).

The Frege-Geach challenge to the emotivist is thus to answer the following question: how can you give an emotivist account of the occurrence of moral sentences in ‘unasserted contexts’—such as the antecedents of conditionals—without jeopardising the intuitively valid patterns of inference in which those sentences figure? Philosophers wishing to develop an expressivistic alternative to moral realism have expended a great deal of energy and ingenuity in devising responses to this challenge. See in particular Blackburn’s development of ‘quasi-realism’, in his (1984) Chs 5 and 6, (1993) Ch.10, (1998) Ch.3 and Gibbard’s ‘norm-expressivism’, in his (1990) Ch.5, and further refined in his (2003). For criticism see Hale (1993) and (2002), and Kölbel (2002) Ch.4. For an overview, see Schroeder (2008) and Miller (2013a), Chs 4 and 5. For very useful surveys of recent work on expressivism, see Schroeder (2009) and Sinclair (2009).

6. Views Opposing the Independence Dimension (I): Semantic Realism

Examples of challenges to the existence dimension of realism have been described in previous sections. In this section some forms of non-realism that are neither error-theoretic nor expressivist will be briefly introduced. The forms of non-realism view the sentences of the relevant area as (against the expressivist) truth-apt, and (against the error-theorist) at least sometimes true. The existence dimension of realism is thus left intact. What is challenged is the independence dimension of realism, the claim that the objects distinctive of the area exist, or that the properties distinctive of the area are instantiated, independently of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices, conceptual schemes, and so on.

Classically, opposition to the independence dimension of realism about the everyday world of macroscopic objects took the form of idealism, the view that the objects of the everyday world of macroscopic objects are in some sense mental. As Berkeley famously claimed, tables, chairs, cats, the moons of Jupiter and so on, are nothing but ideas in the minds of spirits:

All the choir of heaven and furniture of the earth, in a word all those bodies which compose the mighty frame of the world, have not any subsistence without a mind (Berkeley 1710: §6).

Idealism has long been out of favour in contemporary philosophy (though see Goldschmidt & Pearce 2017 for some recent discussion), but those who doubt the independence dimension of realism have sought more sophisticated ways of opposing it. One such philosopher, Michael Dummett, has suggested that in some cases it may be appropriate to reject the independence dimension of realism via the rejection of semantic realism about the area in question (see Dummett 1978 and 1993). This section contains a brief explanation of semantic realism, as characterised by Dummett, Dummett’s views on the relationship between semantic realism and realism construed as a metaphysical thesis, and an outline of some of the arguments in the philosophy of language that Dummett has suggested might be wielded against semantic realism.

It is easiest to characterise semantic realism for a mathematical domain. It is a feature of arithmetic that there are some arithmetical sentences for which the following holds true: we know of no method that will guarantee us a proof of the sentence, and we know of no method that will guarantee us a disproof or a counterexample either. One such is Goldbach’s Conjecture:

(G) Every even number is the sum of two primes.

It is possible that we may come across a proof, or a counterexample, but the key point is that we do not know a method, or methods, the application of which is guaranteed to yield one or the other. A semantic realist, in Dummett’s sense, is one who holds that our understanding of a sentence like (G) consists in knowledge of its truth-condition, where the notion of truth involved is potentially recognition-transcendent or bivalent. To say that the notion of truth involved is potentially recognition-transcendent is to say that (G) may be true (or false) even though there is no guarantee that we will be able, in principle, to recognise that that is so. To say that the notion of truth involved is bivalent is to accept the unrestricted applicability of the law of bivalence, that every meaningful sentence is determinately either true or false. Thus the semantic realist is prepared to assert that (G) is determinately either true or false, regardless of the fact that we have no guaranteed method of ascertaining which. (Note that the precise relationship between the characterisation in terms of bivalence and that in terms of potentially recognition-transcendent truth is a delicate matter that will not concern us here. See the Introduction to Wright 1993 for some excellent discussion. It is also important to note that in introducing the idea that a speaker’s understanding of a sentence consists in her knowledge of its truth-condition, Dummett is packing more into the notion of truth than the disquotational properties made use of in §1 above. See Dummett’s essay ‘Truth’, in his 1978).

Dummett makes two main claims about semantic realism. First, there is what Devitt (1991a) has termed the metaphor thesis: This denies that we can even have a literal, austerely metaphysical characterisation of realism of the sort attempted above with Generic Realism. Dummett writes, of the attempt to give an austere metaphysical characterisation of realism about mathematics (platonic realism) and what stands opposed to it (intuitionism):

How [are] we to decide this dispute over the ontological status of mathematical objects[?] As I have remarked, we have here two metaphors: the platonist compares the mathematician with the astronomer, the geographer or the explorer, the intuitionist compares him with the sculptor or the imaginative writer; and neither comparison seems very apt. The disagreement evidently relates to the amount of freedom that the mathematician has. Put this way, however, both seem partly right and partly wrong: the mathematician has great freedom in devising the concepts he introduces and in delineating the structure he chooses to study, but he cannot prove just whatever he decides it would be attractive to prove. How are we to make the disagreement into a definite one, and how can we then resolve it? (1978: xxv).

According to the constitution thesis, the literal content of realism consists in the content of semantic realism. Thus, the literal content of realism about the external world is constituted by the claim that our understanding of at least some sentences concerning the external world consists in our grasp of their potentially recognition-transcendent truth-conditions. The spurious ‘debate’ in metaphysics between realism and non-realism can thus become a genuine debate within the theory of meaning: should we characterise speakers’ understanding in terms of grasp of potentially recognition-transcendent truth-conditions? As Dummett puts it:

The dispute [between realism and its opponents] concerns the notion of truth appropriate for statements of the disputed class; and this means that it is a dispute concerning the kind of meaning which these statements have (1978: 146).

Few have been convinced by either the metaphor thesis or the constitution thesis. Consider Generic Realism in the case of the world of everyday macroscopic objects and properties:

(GR1) Tables, rocks, mountains, seas, and so on exist, and the fact that they exist and have properties such as mass, size, shape, colour, and so on, is (apart from mundane empirical dependencies of the sort sometimes encountered in everyday life) independent of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices, conceptual schemes, and so on.

Dummett may well call for some non-metaphorical characterisation of the independence claim which this involves, but it is relatively easy to provide one such characterisation by utilising Dummett’s own notion of recognition-transcendence:

(GR2) Tables, rocks, mountains, seas, and so on exist, and the fact that they exist and have properties such as mass, size, shape,colour, and so on, is (apart from mundane empirical dependencies of the sort sometimes encountered in everyday life) independent of anyone’s beliefs, linguistic practices, conceptual schemes, and so on. Tables, rocks, mountains, seas, and so on exist, and in general there is no guarantee that we will be able, even in principle, to recognise the fact that they exist and have properties such as mass, size, shape, colour, and so on.

On the face of it, there is nothing metaphorical in (GR2) or, at least if there is, some argument from Dummett to that effect is required. This throws some doubt on the metaphor thesis. Moreover there is nothing distinctively semantic about (GR2), and this throws some doubt on the constitution thesis. Whereas for Dummett, the essential realist thesis is the meaning-theoretic claim that our understanding of a sentence like (G) consists in knowledge of its potentially recognition-transcendent truth-condition, for Devitt:

What has truth to do with Realism? On the face of it, nothing at all. Indeed, Realism says nothing semantic at all beyond … making the negative point that our semantic capacities do not constitute the world. (1991a: 39)

Devitt’s main criticism of the constitution thesis is this: the literal content of realism about the external world is not given by semantic realism, since semantic realism is consistent with an idealist metaphysics of the external world. He writes:

Does [semantic realism] entail Realism? It does not. Realism … requires the objective independent existence of common-sense physical entities. Semantic Realism concerns physical statements and has no such requirement: it says nothing about the nature of the reality that makes those statements true or false, except that it is [at least in part potentially beyond the reach of our best investigative efforts]. An idealist who believed in the … existence of a purely mental realm of sense-data could subscribe to [semantic realism]. He could believe that physical statements are true or false according as they do or do not correspond to the realm of sense-data, whatever anyone’s opinion on the matter: we have no ‘incorrigible knowledge’ of sense-data. … In sum, mere talk of truth will not yield any particular ontology. (1983: 77)

Suppose that Dummett’s metaphor and constitution theses are both implausible. Would it follow that the arguments Dummett develops against semantic realism have no relevance to debates about the plausibility of realism about everyday macroscopic objects (say), construed as a purely metaphysical thesis as in (GR2)? It can be argued that Dummett’s arguments can retain their relevance to a metaphysical debate even if the metaphor and constitution theses are false, and, indeed, even if Dummett’s view (1973: 669) that the theory of meaning is the foundation of all philosophy is rejected. For a full development of this line of argument, see Miller 2003a and 2006.

Dummett’s main line of argument against semantic realism is the manifestation argument. Here is the argument (See Dummett 1978 and the summary in Miller 2018, chapter 9):

Suppose that we are considering region of discourse D. Then:

  1. We understand the sentences of D.

Suppose, for reductio, that

  1. The sentences of D have recognition-transcendent truth-conditions.

Now, given

  1. To understand a sentence is to know its truth-conditions (Frege 1892, cf. Miller 2018 chapters 1 and 2).

We can conclude

  1. We know the (recognition-transcendent) truth-conditions of the sentences of D.

We then add the following premise, which stems from the Wittgensteinian insight that understanding does not consist in the possession of an inner state, but rather in the possession of some practical ability (see Wittgenstein 1958):

  1. To understand a sentence is to manifest the practical abilities that constitute our understanding of that sentence

For example, in the case of a simple language consisting of demonstratives and taste predicates (such as “bitter” and “sweet”), applied to foodstuffs within reach of the speaker, a speaker’s understanding consists in his ability to determine whether “this is bitter” is true, by putting the relevant foodstuff in his mouth and tasting it (Wright 1993).

It now follows that:

  1. To know the truth-conditions of a sentence is to manifest the practical abilities that constitute our understanding of that sentence.


  1. Our knowledge of the (recognition-transcendent) truth-conditions of the sentences of D is manifested in our exercise of the practical abilities that constitute our understanding of the sentences of D.


  1. Knowledge of recognition-transcendent truth-conditions is never manifested in the exercise of practical abilities

It follows that

  1. Knowledge of the (recognition-transcendent) truth-conditions of the sentences of D is never manifested in the exercise of practical abilities.


  1. We cannot exercise practical abilities that constitute our understanding of D.


  1. (11) We do not understand the sentences of D.

This yields a contradiction with (1), whence, by reductio, we reject (2) to obtain:

  1. The sentences of D do not have recognition-transcendent truth-conditions, so that semantic realism about the subject matter of D must be rejected.

The key claim here is (8). So far as an account of speakers’ understanding goes, the ascription of knowledge of recognition-transcendent truth-conditions is simply redundant: there is no good reason for ascribing it. Consider one of the sentences introduced earlier as a candidate for possessing recognition-transcendent truth-conditions ‘Every even number greater than two is the sum of two primes’. The semantic realist views our understanding of sentences like this as consisting in our knowledge of a potentially recognition-transcendent truth-condition. But:

How can that account be viewed as a description of any practical ability of use? No doubt someone who understands such a statement can be expected to have many relevant practical abilities. He will be able to appraise evidence for or against it, should any be available, or to recognize that no information in his possession bears on it. He will be able to recognize at least some of its logical consequences, and to identify beliefs from which commitment to it would follow. And he will, presumably, show himself sensitive to conditions under which it is appropriate to ascribe propositional attitudes embedding the statement to himself and to others, and sensitive to the explanatory significance of such ascriptions. In short: in these and perhaps other important respects, he will show himself competent to use the sentence. But the headings under which his practical abilities fall so far involve no mention of evidence-transcendent truth-conditions (Wright 1993: 17).

This establishes (8), and the conclusion (12) follows straightforwardly.

A detailed assessment of the plausibility of Dummett’s arguments is impossible here. For a full response to the manifestation argument, see Miller 2002. See also Byrne 2005. For Dummett’s other argument, the acquisition argument, see Miller 2003b. Wright develops a couple of additional arguments against semantic realism. For these—the argument from rule-following and the argument from normativity—see the Introduction to Wright 1993. For an excellent survey of the literature on Dummett’s arguments against semantic realism, see Hale 2017. For an excellent book-length introduction to Dummett’s philosophy, see Weiss 2002. For a robust defence of keeping issues in metaphysics sharply separate from issues about language, see Dyke (2008)

7. Views Opposing the Independence Dimension (II): More Forms of Anti-Realism

Suppose that one wished to develop a non-realist alternative to, say, moral realism. Suppose also that one is persuaded of the unattractiveness of both error-theoretic and expressivist forms of non-realism. That is to say, one accepts that moral sentences are truth-apt, and, at least in some cases, true. Then the only option available would be to deny the independence dimension of moral realism. But so far we have only seen one way of doing this: by admitting that the relevant sentences are truth-apt, sometimes true, and possessed of truth-conditions which are not potentially recognition-transcendent. But this seems weak: it seems implausible to suggest that a moral realist must be committed to the potential recognition-transcendence of moral truth. It therefore seems implausible to suggest that a non-expressivistic and non-error-theoretic form of opposition to realism must be committed to simply denying the potential recognition-transcendence of moral truth, since many who style themselves moral realists will deny this too. As Wright puts it:

There are, no doubt, kinds of moral realism which do have the consequence that moral reality may transcend all possibility of detection. But it is surely not essential to any view worth regarding as realist about morals that it incorporate a commitment to that idea. (1992: 9)

So, if the debate between a realist and a non-realist about the independence dimension doesn’t concern the plausibility of semantic realism as characterised by Dummett, what does it concern? (Henceforth a non-error-theoretic, non-expressivist style of non-realist is referred to as an anti-realist). Wright attempts to develop some points of contention, (or ‘realism-relevant cruces’ as he calls them) over which a realist and anti-realist could disagree. Wright’s development of this idea is subtle and sophisticated and only a crude exposition of a couple of his realism-relevant cruces can be given here.

The first of Wright’s realism-relevant cruces to be considered here concerns the capacity of states of affairs to figure ineliminably in the explanation of features of our experience. The idea that the explanatory efficacy of the states of affairs in some area has something to do with the plausibility of a realist view of that area is familiar from the debates in meta-ethics between philosophers such as Nicholas Sturgeon (1988), who believe that irreducibly moral states of affairs do figure ineliminably in the best explanation of certain aspects of experience, and opponents such as Gilbert Harman (1977), who believe that moral states of affairs have no such explanatory role. This suggests a ‘best explanation test’ which, crudely put, states that realism about a subject matter can be secured if its distinctive states of affairs figure ineliminably in the best explanation of aspects of experience. One could then be a non-expressivist, non-error-theoretic, anti-realist about a particular subject matter by denying that the distinctive states of affairs of that subject matter do have a genuine role in best explanations of aspects of our experience. And the debate between this style of anti-realist and his realist opponent could proceed independently of any questions concerning the capacity of sentences in the relevant area to have potentially recognition-transcendent truth values.

For reasons that needn’t detain us here, Wright suggests that this ‘best explanation test’ should be superseded by questions concerning what he calls width of cosmological role (1992, Ch.5). The states of affairs in a given area have narrow cosmological role if it is a priori that they do not contribute to the explanation of things other than our beliefs about that subject-matter (or other than via explaining our beliefs about that subject matter). This will be an anti-realist position. One style of realist about that subject matter will say that its states of affairs have wide cosmological role: they do contribute to the explanation of things other than our beliefs about the subject matter in question (or other than via explaining our beliefs about that subject matter). It is relatively easy to see why width of cosmological role could be a bone of contention between realist and anti-realist views of a given subject matter: it is precisely the width of cosmological role of a class of states of affairs—their capacity to explain things other than, or other than via, our beliefs, in which their independence from our beliefs, linguistic practices, and so on, consists. Again, the debate between someone attributing a narrow cosmological role to a class of states of affairs and someone attributing a wide cosmological role could proceed independently of any questions concerning the capacity of sentences in the relevant area to have potentially recognition-transcendent truth values.

Wright thinks that it is arguable that moral discourse does not satisfy width-of-cosmological role. Whereas a physical fact—such as a pond’s being frozen over—can contribute to the explanation of cognitive effects (someone’s believing that the pond is frozen over), effects on sentient, but non-conceptual creatures (the tendency of goldfish to cluster towards the bottom of the pond), effects on us as physically interactive agents (someone’s slipping on the ice), and effects on inanimate matter (the tendency of a thermometer to read zero when placed on the surface), moral facts can only to contribute to the explanation of the first sort of effect:

[I]t is hard to think of anything which is true of sentient but non-conceptual creatures, or of mobile organisms, or of inanimate matter, which is true because a … moral fact obtains and in whose explanation it is unnecessary to advert to anyone’s appreciation of that moral fact (1996: 16).

Thus, we have a version of anti-realism about morals that is non-expressivist and non-error-theoretic and can be framed independently of considerations about the potential of moral sentences to have recognition-transcendent truth-values: moral sentences are truth-apt, sometimes true, and moral states of affairs have narrow cosmological role.

The second of Wright’s realism-relevant cruces concerns judgement-dependence. Suppose that we are considering a region of discourse D in which P is a typical property. Consider the opinions formed by the participants in that discourse under cognitively ideal conditions: call such opinions best opinions, and the cognitively ideal conditions the C-conditions. Suppose that the best opinions covary with the facts about the instantiation of P. Then there are two ways in which we can explain this covariance. First, we might take best opinions to be playing at most a tracking role: best opinions are just extremely good at tracking independently constituted truth-conferring states of affairs. In this case, best opinion plays only an extension-reflecting role, merely reflecting the independently determined extensions of the relevant properties. Alternatively, rather than viewing best opinion as merely tracking the facts about the extensions of the relevant properties, we can view them as themselves determining those extensions. Best opinions, on this sort of view, do not just track independently constituted states of affairs which determine the extensions of the properties that form the subject matter of D: rather, they determine those extensions and so to play an extension-determining role. When we have this latter sort of explanation of the covariance of best opinion and fact, we’ll say that the truth about the instantiation of the relevant properties is judgement-dependent; when we have only the former sort of explanation, we’ll say that the truth about their instantiation is judgement-independent.

How do we determine whether the truth about the instantiation of the typical properties that form the subject matter of a region of discourse are judgement-dependent? Wright’s discussion proceeds by reference to what he terms provisional equations. These have the following form:

(PE) ∀x[C → (A suitable subject s judges that PxPx)]

where ‘C’ denotes the conditions (the C-conditions) which are cognitively ideal for forming the judgement that x is P. The property P is then said to be judgement-dependent if and only if the provisional equation meets the following four conditions:

The A Prioricity Condition: The provisional equation must be a priori true: there must be a priori covariance of best opinions and truth. (Justification: ‘the truth, if it is true, that the extensions of [a class of concept] are constrained by idealised human response—best opinion—ought to be available purely by analytic reflection on those concepts, and hence available as knowledge a priori’ (Wright 1992: 117)). This is because the thesis of judgement-dependence is the claim that, for the region of discourse concerned, best opinion is the conceptual ground of truth).

The Substantiality Condition The C-conditions must be specifiable non-trivially: they cannot simply be described as conditions under which the subject has ‘whatever it takes’ to form the right opinion concerning the subject matter at hand.(Justification: without this condition, the truth about any property will turn out to be judgement-dependent, since for any property Q it is going to be an a priori truth that our judgements about whether x is Q, formed under conditions which have ‘whatever it takes’ to ensure their correctness, will covary with the facts about the instantiation of Q-ness. We thus require this condition on pain of losing the distinction between judgement-dependent and judgement-independent truth altogether).

The Independence Condition: The question as to whether the C-conditions obtain in a given instance must be logically independent of the class of truths for which we are attempting to give an extension-determining account: what makes an opinion best must not presuppose some logically prior determination of the extensions putatively determined by best opinions. (Justification: if we have to assume certain facts about the extension of P in the determination of the conditions under which opinions about P are best, then we cannot view best opinions as themselves constituting those facts, since whether a given opinion is best would then presuppose some logically prior determination of the very facts the judgement-dependent account wishes to view as constituted by best opinions).

The Extremal Condition: There must be no better way of accounting for the a priori covariance: no better account, other than according best opinion an extension-determining role, of which the satisfaction of the foregoing three conditions is a consequence. (Justification: without this condition, the satisfaction of the foregoing conditions would be consistent with the thought that certain states of affairs are judgement-independent even though infallibly detectable, “states of affairs in whose determination facts about the deliverances of best opinions are in no way implicated although there is, a priori, no possibility of their misrepresentation” (Wright 1992: 123).)

When all of the above conditions can be shown to be satisfied, we can accord best opinion an extension-determining role, and describe the truth about the subject matter as judgement-dependent. If these conditions cannot collectively be satisfied, best opinion can be assigned, at best, a merely extension-reflecting role.

Two points are worth making. First, it is again relatively easy to see why the question of judgement-dependence can mark a bone of contention between realism and anti-realism. If a subject matter is judgement-dependent we have a concrete sense in which the independence dimension of realism fails for that subject matter: there is a sense in which that subject matter is not entirely independent of our beliefs, linguistic practices, and so on. Second, the debate about the judgement-dependence of a subject matter is, on the face of it at least, independent of the debate about the possibility of recognition-transcendent truth in that area.

Wright argues (1989) that facts about colours and intentions are judgement-dependent, so that we can formulate a version of anti-realism about colours (intentions) that views ascriptions of colours (intentions) as truth-apt and sometimes true, and truth in those areas as judgement-dependent. In contrast to this, Wright argues (1988) that morals cannot plausibly be viewed as judgement-dependent, so that a thesis of judgement-dependence is not a suitable vehicle for the expression of a non-expressivistic, non-error-theoretic, version of anti-realism about morality.

For discussion of further allegedly realism-relevant cruces, such as cognitive command, see Wright 1992 and 2003. For critical discussion of Wright on cognitive command, see Shapiro and Taschek 1996. See also Miller 2004 and the papers in section III of Coliva (ed.) 2012.It is the availability of these various realism-relevant cruces that makes it possible to be more-or-less realist about a given area: at one end of the spectrum there will be areas that fall on the realist side of all of the cruces and at the opposite end areas that fall on the non-realist side of all of the cruces, but in between there will be a range of intermediate cases in which some-but-not-all of the cruces are satisfied on the realist side.

8. Views which Undermine the Debate: Quietism

Some of the ways in which non-realist theses about a particular subject matter can be formulated and motivated have been described above. Quietism is the view that significant metaphysical debate between realism and non-realism is impossible. Gideon Rosen nicely articulates the basic quietist thought:

We sense that there is a heady metaphysical thesis at stake in these debates over realism— … But after a point, when every attempt to say just what the issue is has come up empty, we have no real choice but to conclude that despite all the wonderful,suggestive imagery, there is ultimately nothing in the neighborhood to discuss (1994: 279).

Quietism about the ‘debate’ between realists and their opponents can take a number of forms. One form might claim that the idea of a significant debate is generated by unsupported or unsupportable philosophical theses about the relationship of the experiencing and minded subject to their world, and that once these theses are exorcised the ‘debate’ will gradually wither away. This form of quietism is often associated with the work of the later Wittgenstein, and receives perhaps its most forceful development in the work of John McDowell (see in particular McDowell 1994 and 2009). Other forms of quietism may proceed in a more piecemeal fashion, taking constraints such as Wright’s realism-relevant Cruces and arguing on a case-by-case basis that their satisfaction or non-satisfaction is of no metaphysical consequence. This is in fact the strategy pursued in Rosen 1994. He makes the following points regarding the two realism-relevant Cruces considered in the previous section.

Suppose that:

(F) It is a priori that: x is funny if and only if we would judge x funny under conditions of full information about xs relevant extra-comedic features

and suppose that (F) satisfies (in addition to a prioricity) the various other constraints that Wright imposes on his provisional equations ((F) is actually not of the form of a provisional equation, but this is not relevant to our purposes here). Rosen questions whether this would be enough to establish that the facts about the funny are in some metaphysically interesting sense ‘less real’ or ‘less objective’ than facts (such as, arguably, facts about shape) for which a suitable equation cannot be constructed.

In a nutshell, Rosen’s argument proceeds by inviting us to assume the perspective of an anthropologist who is studying us and who ‘has gotten to the point where he can reliably determine which jokes we will judge funny under conditions of full relevant information’ (1994: 302). Rosen writes:

[T]he important point is that from [the anthropologist’s] point of view, the facts about the distribution of [the property denoted by our use of ‘funny’] are ‘mind-dependent’ only in the sense that they supervene directly on facts about our minds. But again, this has no tendency to undermine their objectivity … [since] we have been given no reason to think that the facts about what a certain group of people would think after a certain sort of investigation are anything but robustly objective (1994: composed from 300 and 302).

How plausible is this attempt to deflate the significance of the discovery that the subject matter of a particular area is, in Wright’s sense, judgement-dependent? Argument—as opposed to the trading of intuitions—at this level is difficult, but Rosen’s claim here is very implausible. Suppose we found out that facts about the distribution of gases on the moons of Jupiter supervened directly on facts about our minds. Would the threat we then felt to the objectivity of facts about the distribution of gases on the moons of Jupiter be at all assuaged by the reflection that facts about the mental might themselves be susceptible to realistic treatment? It seems doubtful. Fodor’s Psychosemantics would not offer much solace to realists in the world described in Berkeley’s Principles. Rosen’s claim derives some of its plausibility from the fact that he uses examples, such as the funny and the constitutional, where our pre-theoretical attachment to a realist view is very weak: it may be that the judgement-dependence of the funny doesn’t undermine our sense of the objectivity of humour simply because the level of objectivity we pretheoretically expect of comedy is quite low. So although there is no knock-down argument to Rosen’s claim, it is much more counterintuitive than he might be willing to admit.

Rosen also questions whether there is any intuitive connection between considerations of width of cosmological role and issues of realism and non-realism. Rosen doubts in particular that there is any tight connection between facts of a certain class having only narrow cosmological role and mind-dependence in any sense relevant to the plausibility of realism. He writes:

It is possible to imagine a subtle physical property Q which, though intuitively thoroughly objective, is nonetheless nomically connected in the first instance only with brain state B—where this happens to be the belief that things are Q. This peculiar discovery would not undermine our confidence that Q was an objective feature of things, as it should if [a feature of objects is less than fully objective if it has narrow cosmological role] (1994: 312).

However it seems that, at least in the first instance, Wright has a relatively quick response to this point at his disposal. Waiving the point that in any case the width of cosmological role constraint applies to classes of properties and facts, he can point out that in the example constructed by Rosen the narrowness of Q’s cosmological role is an a posteriori matter. Whereas what we want is that the narrowness of cosmological role is an a priori matter: one does not need to conduct an empirical investigation to convince oneself that facts about the funny fail to have wide cosmological role.

Wright thus has the beginnings of answers to Rosen’s quietist attack on his use of the notions of judgement-dependence and width of cosmological role. It is not possible to deal fully with these arguments here, let alone with the other quietist arguments in Rosen’s paper, or the arguments of other quietists such as McDowell, beyond giving a flavour of how quietism might be motivated and how those active in the debates between realists and their opponents might start to respond. For a further discussion of quietism by Wright, see Wright 2007.

9. Concluding Remarks and Apologies

This discussion of realism and of the forms that non-realist opposition may take is far from exhaustive, and aims only to give the reader a sense of what to expect if they delve deeper into the issues. In particular, nothing has been mentioned about the work of Hilary Putnam, his characterisation of ‘metaphysical realism’, and his so-called ‘model-theoretic’ argument against it. Putnam’s writings are extensive, but one could begin with Putnam 1981 and 1983. For critical discussion, see Hale and Wright 2017 and Wright 2001; see also the entries on scientific realism and challenges to metaphysical realism. Nor have issues about the metaphysics of modality and possible worlds been discussed. The locus classicus in this area is Lewis 1986. For commentary, see Divers 2002 and Melia 2003; see also the entries on David Lewis’s metaphysics and the epistemology of modality. And the very important topic of scientific realism has not been touched upon. For an introductory treatment and suggestions for further reading, see Bird 1998 Ch. 4; see also, the entries on scientific realism and structural realism. Finally, it has not been possible to include any discussion of realism about intentionality and meaning (but see the entries on intentionality and theories of meaning.) The locus classicus in recent philosophy is Kripke 1982. For a robustly realistic view of the intentional, see Fodor 1987. For a collection of some of the central secondary literature, see Miller and Wright 2002, and for a robust defence of Kripke’s interpretation of Wittgenstein, see Kusch (2006). For an entertaining defence of metaphysical realism, see Musgrave 2001 (exercise for the reader: do any of the forms of opposition to realism described in this entry rely on what Musgrave calls word-magic?). For an alternative approach to mapping the debates about realism involving conceptions of independence more distinctively metaphysical than those focussed on here, see Fine (2001) and the entry on metaphysical grounding. For good introductory book length treatments of realism, see Kirk 1999 and Brock and Mares 2006. Greenough and Lynch (2006) is a useful collection of papers by many of the leading lights in the various debates about realism.


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I’m grateful to successive cohorts of students in my Meaning and Metaphysics class at the University of Otago. Thanks, too, to SEP reviewers and editors. I should also note that I relied on parts of Miller 2013a and Miller 2018.

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Alexander Miller <>

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