Respect has great importance in everyday life. As children we are taught (one hopes) to respect our parents and teachers, school rules and traffic laws, family and cultural traditions, other people’s feelings and rights, our country’s flag and leaders, the truth and people’s differing opinions. And we come to value respect for such things; when we’re older, we may shake our heads (or fists) at people who seem not to have learned to respect them. We develop great respect for people we consider exemplary and lose respect for those we discover to be clay-footed; we may also come to believe that, at some level, all people are worthy of respect. We may learn that jobs and relationships become unbearable if we receive no respect in them; in certain social milieus we may learn the price of disrespect if we violate the street law: “Diss me, and you die.” Calls to respect this or that are increasingly part of public life: environmentalists exhort us to respect nature, foes of abortion and capital punishment insist on respect for human life, members of racial and ethnic minorities and those discriminated against because of their gender, sexual orientation, age, religious beliefs, or economic status demand respect both as social and moral equals and for their cultural differences. And it is widely acknowledged that public debates about such demands should take place under terms of mutual respect. We may learn both that our lives together go better when we respect the things that deserve to be respected and that we should respect some things independently of considerations of how our lives would go.
We may also learn that how our lives go depends every bit as much on whether we respect ourselves. The value of self-respect may be something we can take for granted, or we may discover how very important it is when our self-respect is threatened, or we lose it and have to work to regain it, or we have to struggle to develop or maintain it in a hostile environment. Some people find that finally being able to respect themselves is what matters most about finally standing on their own two feet, kicking a disgusting habit, or defending something they value; others, sadly, discover that life is no longer worth living if self-respect is irretrievably lost. It is part of everyday wisdom that respect and self-respect are deeply connected, that it is difficult both to respect others if we don’t respect ourselves and to respect ourselves if others don’t respect us. It is increasingly part of political wisdom both that unjust social institutions can devastatingly damage self-respect and that robust and resilient self-respect can be a potent force in struggles against injustice.
The ubiquity and significance of respect and self-respect in everyday life largely explains why philosophers, particularly in moral and political philosophy, have been interested in these two concepts. They turn up in a multiplicity of philosophical contexts, including discussions of justice and equality, injustice and oppression, autonomy and agency, moral and political rights and duties, moral motivation and moral development, cultural diversity and toleration, punishment and political violence, and a host of applied ethics contexts. Although a wide variety of things are said to deserve respect, contemporary philosophical interest in respect has overwhelmingly been focused on respect for persons, the idea that all persons should be treated with respect simply because they are persons. This focus owes much to the 18th century German philosopher, Immanuel Kant, who argued that all and only persons and the moral law they autonomously legislate are appropriate objects of the morally most significant attitude of respect. Although honor, esteem, and prudential regard played important roles in moral and political theories before him, Kant was the first major Western philosopher to put respect for persons, including oneself, at the very center of moral theory, and his insistence that persons are ends in themselves with an absolute dignity who must always be respected has become a core ideal of modern humanism and political liberalism. In recent years many people have argued that moral respect ought also to be extended to things other than persons, such as nonhuman living beings and the natural environment.
Despite the widespread acknowledgment of the importance of respect and self-respect in moral and political life and theory, there is no settled agreement in either everyday thinking or philosophical discussion about such issues as how to understand the concepts, what the appropriate objects of respect are, what is involved in respecting various objects, and what the scope is of any moral requirements regarding respect and self-respect. This entry will survey these and related issues.
- 1. The Concept of Respect
- 2. Respect for Persons
- 3. Respect for Nature and Nonhuman Beings
- 4. Self-Respect
- 5. Conclusion
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1. The Concept of Respect
Philosophers have approached the concept of respect with a variety of questions. (1) One set concerns the nature of respect, including (a) What sort of thing is respect? Philosophers have variously identified it as a mode of behavior, a form of treatment, a kind of valuing, a type of attention, a motive, an attitude, a feeling, a tribute, a principle, a duty, an entitlement, a moral virtue, an epistemic virtue: are any of these categories more central than others? (b) Are there different kinds of respect? If so, is any more basic than others? (c) Are there different levels or degrees of respect? (d) What are the distinctive elements of respect, or a specific kind of respect? What beliefs, attitudes, emotions, and motives does (a specific kind of) respect involve, and what ways of acting and forbearing to act express or constitute or are regulated by it? (e) To what other attitudes, actions, valuings, duties, etc., is respect (or a specific kind) similar, and with what does it contrast? In particular, how is respect similar to, different from, or connected with esteem, honor, love, awe, reverence, recognition, toleration, dignity, contempt, indifference, discounting, denigration, and so on? (2) A second set of questions concerns objects of respect, including (a)What sorts of things can be reasonably be said to warrant respect? (b) What are the bases or grounds for respect, i.e., the features of or facts about objects in virtue of which it is reasonable and perhaps obligatory to respect them? (c) Must every appropriate object always be respected? Can respect be forfeited, can lost respect be regained? (3) A third set of questions focuses on moral dimensions of respect, including (a) Are there moral requirements to respect certain types of objects, and, if so, what are the scope and grounds of such requirements? (b) Why is respect morally important? What, if anything, does it add to morality over and above the conduct, attitudes, and character traits required or encouraged by various moral principles or virtues? (c) What does respect entail morally for how we should treat one another in everyday interactions, for issues in specific contexts such as health care and the workplace, and for fraught issues such as abortion, racial and gender justice, and global inequality?
1.1 Elements of respect
It is widely acknowledged that there are different forms or kinds of respect. This complicates the answering of these questions, since answers concerning one form or kind of respect can diverge significantly from those about another. Much philosophical work has gone into explicating differences and links among the various kinds.
One general distinction concerns respect simply as behavior and respect as an attitude or feeling that may or may not be expressed in or signified by behavior. When we speak of drivers respecting the speed limit, hostile forces respecting a cease fire agreement, or the Covid-19 virus not respecting national borders, we can be referring simply to behavior which avoids violation of or interference with some boundary, limit, or rule, without any reference to attitudes, feelings, intentions, or dispositions, and even, as in the case of viruses, without imputing agency (Bird 2004). In such cases the behavior is regarded as constitutive of respecting. Where respect is conceived of as a duty or an entitlement, a certain kind of behavior or treatment may be all that is owed. Similarly, respect as a tribute could be just a certain mode of behavior, such as bowing or standing in silence. In other cases, however, we take respect to be or to express or signify an attitude or feeling, as when we speak of having respect for someone or of certain behaviors as showing respect or disrespect. Here, actions and modes of treatment count as respect insofar as they either manifest an attitude of respect or are of the sort through which the attitude is characteristically expressed; a principle of respect is one that necessarily must be adopted by someone with the attitude of respect or that prescribes the attitude or actions that express it (Frankena 1986; Downie and Telfer 1969); a moral virtue of respect involves having the attitude as a settled aspect of one’s way of being toward appropriate objects. Most discussions of respect for persons take attitude to be central. In what follows, I will focus chiefly on respect as attitude. There are, again, several different attitudes to which the term “respect” refers. Before looking at differences, however, it is useful first to note some elements common among varieties.
An attitude of respect is, most generally, a relation between a subject and an object in which the subject responds to the object from a certain perspective in some appropriate way. Respect necessarily has an object: respect is always directed toward, paid to, felt about, shown for some object. While a very wide variety of things can be appropriate objects of one kind of respect or another, the subject of respect (the respecter) is typically a person, that is, a conscious rational being capable of recognizing objects, intentionally responding to them, having and expressing values with regard to them, and being accountable for disrespecting or failing to respect them. Respect and disrespect can also be expressed or instantiated by or through things that are not persons, such as guidelines, rules, laws, and principles, systems, and institutional organizations and operations. So, we can say that laws that prohibit torture express respect for persons while the institution of slavery is profoundly disrespectful of human beings.
Ordinary discourse about respect as a responsive relation identifies several key elements, including attention, deference, judgment, valuing, and behavior. First, as its derivation from the Latin respicere, (to look back at, look again) suggests, respect is a form of regard: a mode of attention to and acknowledgment of an object as something to be taken seriously. Respecting something contrasts with being oblivious or indifferent to it, ignoring or quickly dismissing it, neglecting or disregarding it, or carelessly or intentionally misidentifying it. Respect is also perspectival: we can respect something from a moral perspective, or from prudential, evaluative, social, or institutional perspectives. From different perspectives, we might attend to different aspects of the object in respecting it or respect it in different ways. For example, one might regard another human individual as a rights-bearer, a judge, a superlative singer, a trustworthy person, or a threat to one’s security, and the respect one accords her in each case will be different. It is in virtue of this aspect of careful attention that respect is sometimes thought of as an epistemic virtue.
As responsive, respect is as much object-based as subject-generated; certain objects call for, claim, elicit, deserve, are owed respect. We respect something not because we want to but because we recognize that we have to respect it (Wood 1999); respect involves “a deontic experience”—the experience that one must pay attention and respond appropriately (Birch 1993). It thus is motivational: it is the recognition of something “as directly determining our will without reference to what is wanted by our inclinations” (Rawls 2000, 153). In this way respect differs from, for example, liking and fearing, which have their sources in the subject’s interests or desires. When we respect something, we heed its call, accord it its due, acknowledge its claim. Thus, respect involves deference, in the most basic sense of yielding to the object’s demands.
The idea that the object “drives” respect, as it were, is involved in the view that respect is an unmediated emotional response (Buss 1999b). But respect is typically treated as also an expression of the agency of the respecter: respect is deliberate, a matter of directed rather than grabbed attention, of reflective consideration and judgment. On this view, respect is reason-governed: we cannot respect a particular object for just any old reason or no reason at all. Rather, we respect something for the reason that it has, in our judgment, some respect-warranting characteristic, that makes it the kind of object that calls for that kind of response (Cranor 1975; Pettit 2021). And these reasons are both objective, in the sense that their weight or stringency does not depend on the respecter’s interests, goals, or desires, and categorical, in the sense that acting against these reasons, other things equal, is wrong (Raz 2001). Respect is thus both subjective and objective. It is subjective in that the subject’s response is constructed from her understanding of the object and its characteristics and her judgments about the legitimacy of its call and how fittingly to address the call. The objectivity of respect means that an individual’s respect for an object can be inappropriate or unwarranted, for the object may not have the features she takes it to have, or the features she takes to be respect-warranting might not be, or her idea of how properly to treat the object might be mistaken. Moreover, the logic of respect is the logic of objectivity and universality, in several ways. In respecting an object, we respond to it as something whose significance is independent of us, not determined by our feelings or interests. Our reasons for respecting something are, logically, reasons for other people to respect it (or at least to endorse our respect for it from a common point of view). Respect is thus, unlike erotic or filial love, an impersonal response to the object. And if F is a respect-warranting feature of object O, then respecting O on account of F commits us, other things equal, to respecting other things with feature F.
There are many different kinds of objects that can reasonably be respected and many different reasons why they warrant respect. Thus, warranted responses can take different forms. Some things are dangerous or powerful; respecting them can involve fear, awe, self-protection, or submission. Other things have authority over us and the respect they are due includes acknowledgment of their authority and perhaps obedience to their authoritative commands. Other forms of respect are modes of valuing, appreciating the object as having worth or importance that is independent of, perhaps even at variance with, our desires or commitments. Thus, we can respect things we don’t like or agree with, such as our enemies or someone else’s opinion. Valuing respect is kin to esteem, admiration, veneration, reverence, and honor, while regarding something as utterly worthless or insignificant or disdaining or having contempt for it is incompatible with respecting it. Respect also aims to value its object appropriately, so it contrasts with degradation and discounting. The kinds of valuing that respect involves also contrast with other forms of valuing such as promoting or using (Anderson 1993, Pettit 1989). Indeed, regarding a person merely as useful (treating her as just a sexual object, an ATM machine, a research subject) is commonly identified as a central form of disrespect for persons, and many people decry the killing of endangered wild animals for their tusks or hides as disrespectful of nature.
Finally, attitudes of respect typically have a behavioral component. In respecting an object, we often consider it to be making legitimate claims on our conduct as well as our thoughts and feelings and so we are disposed to behave appropriately. Appropriate behavior includes refraining from certain treatment of the object or acting only in particular ways in connection with it, ways that are regarded as fitting, deserved by, or owed to the object. And there are very many ways to respect things: keeping our distance from them, helping them, praising or emulating them, obeying or abiding by them, not violating or interfering with them, destroying them only in some ways, protecting or being careful with them, talking about them in ways that reflect their worth or status, mourning them, nurturing them. One can behave in respectful ways, however, without having respect for the object, as when a teen who disdains adults behaves respectfully toward her friend’s parents in a scheme to get the car, manipulating rather than respecting them. To be a form or expression of respect, behavior has to be motivated by one’s acknowledgment of the object as rightly calling for that behavior. On the other hand, certain kinds of feelings would not count as respect if they did not find expression in behavior or involved no dispositions to behave in appropriate ways, and if they did not spring from perceptions or judgments that the object is worthy of or calls for such behavior.
The attitudes of respect, then, have cognitive dimensions (beliefs, acknowledgments, judgments, commitments), affective dimensions (emotions, feelings, ways of experiencing things), and conative dimensions (motivations, dispositions to act and forbear from acting); some forms also have valuational dimensions. One last dimension is normative: the attitudes and actions of respect are governed by norms that set standards of success or failure in responding to respect-worthy-objects. Some norms are moral, grounded in moral principles or morally important characteristics of respect-worthy objects and both endorsable by and authoritative for all moral agents. Other norms are social, arising from dimensions of social life, grounded in socially significant characteristics of objectives, and authoritative or applicable (only) for participants in that form of sociality.
1.2 Kinds of Respect
That it is the nature of the object that determines its respect-worthiness, and that there are different kinds of objects calling for correspondingly different responses, have led many philosophers to argue that there are different kinds of respect. In what follows, three sets of distinctions will be discussed.
Speculating on the historical development of the idea that all persons as such deserve respect, and using terms found in Kant’s writings on Achtung (the German word usually translated as “respect”), Feinberg (1975) identifies three concepts for which “respect” has been the name. (1) Respekt, is the “uneasy and watchful attitude that has ‘the element of fear’ in it” (1975, 1). Its objects are dangerous or powerful things. It is respekt that woodworkers are encouraged to have for power tools, a new sailor might be admonished to have for the sea, and a child might have for an abusive parent. Respekt contrasts with contemptuous disregard; it is shown in conduct that is cautious, self-protective, other-placating. (2) The second concept, observantia, is the moralized analogue of respekt. It involves regarding the object as making a rightful claim on our conduct, as deserving moral consideration in its own right, independently of considerations of personal well-being. It is observantia, Feinberg maintains, that historically was extended first to classes of non-dangerous but otherwise worthy people and then to all persons as such, regardless of merit or ability. Observantia encompasses both the respect said to be owed to all humans equally and the forms of polite respect and deference that acknowledge different social positions. On Kant’s account, observantia is the kind of respect we have an inviolable moral duty to give every person, both by acknowledging their claim to moral equality with us and by never treating persons as if they have little or no worth compared with ourselves (Kant 1797, 6:499). (3) Reverentia, the third concept, is the special feeling of profound awe and respect we involuntarily experience in the presence of something extraordinary or sublime, a feeling that both humbles and uplifts us. On Kant’s account, the moral law and people who exemplify it in morally worthy actions elicit reverentia from us, for we experience the law or its exemplification as “something that always trumps our inclinations in determining our wills” (Feinberg 1975, 2). Feinberg sees different forms of power as underlying the three kinds of respect; in each case, respect is the acknowledgment of the power of something other than ourselves to demand, command, or make claims on our attention, consideration, and deference. (See further discussion of Kant’s account in section 2.2.)
Hudson (1980) draws a four-fold distinction among kinds of respect, according to the bases in the objects. Consider the following examples: (a) respecting a colleague highly as a scholar and having a lot of respect for someone with “guts”; (b) a mountain climber’s respect for the elements and a tennis player’s respect for her opponent’s strong backhand; (c) respecting the terms of an agreement and respecting a person’s rights; and (d) showing respect for a judge by rising when she enters the courtroom and respecting a worn-out flag by burning it rather than tossing it in the trash. The respect in (a), evaluative respect, is similar to other favorable attitudes such as esteem and admiration; it is earned or deserved (or not) depending on whether and to the degree that the object is judged to meet certain standards. Obstacle respect, in (b), is a matter of regarding the object as something that, if not taken proper account of in one’s decisions about how to act, could prevent one from achieving one’s ends. The objects of (c) directive respect are directives: things such as requests, rules, advice, laws, or rights claims that may be taken as guides to action. One respects a directive when one’s actions intentionally comply with it. The objects of (d) institutional respect are social institutions or practices, positions or roles in an institution or practice, and persons or things that occupy positions in or represent the institution. Institutional respect is constituted by behavior that conforms to rules that prescribe certain conduct as respectful. These four forms of respect differ in several ways. Each identifies a quite different kind of feature of objects as the basis of respect. Each is expressed in action in quite different ways, although evaluative respect need not be expressed at all. Evaluative respect centrally involves having a favorable attitude toward the object, while the other forms do not. Directive respect does not admit of degrees (one either obeys the rule or doesn’t), but the others do (we can have more evaluative respect for one person than another). Hudson uses this distinction to argue that respect for persons is not a unique kind of respect but should be conceived rather as involving some combination or other of these four.
To Hudson’s four-fold classification, Dillon (1992a) adds a fifth form, care respect, which draws on feminist ethics of care. Care respect, which is exemplified in an environmentalist’s deep respect for nature, involves both regarding the object as having profound and perhaps unique value and so cherishing it, and perceiving it as fragile or calling for special care and so acting or forbearing to act out of felt benevolent concern for it.
Darwall (1977) distinguishes two kinds of respect: recognition respect and appraisal respect. Recognition respect is the disposition to give appropriate weight or consideration in one’s practical deliberations to some fact about the object and to regulate one’s conduct by constraints derived from that fact. (Frankena 1986 and Cranor 1982, 1983 refer to this as “consideration respect.”) A wide variety of objects can be objects of recognition respect, including laws, dangerous things, someone’s feelings, social institutions, nature, the selves individuals present in different contexts, people occupying certain social roles or positions, and persons as such. Appraisal respect, by contrast, is an attitude of positive appraisal, the “thinking highly of” kind of respect that we might have a great deal of for some individuals, little of for others, or lose for those whose clay feet or dirty laundry becomes apparent. Appraisal respect involves a grading assessment of a person in light of some qualitative standards that they can meet or not to greater and lesser degrees. It differs from the more widely grounded esteem and admiration in that it is concerned specifically with the moral quality of people’s character or conduct, or with other characteristics that are relevant to their moral quality as agents.
The recognition/appraisal distinction has been quite influential and is widely regarded as the fundamental distinction. Indeed, evaluative respect is similar to appraisal respect, while respekt, obstacle respect, observantia, directive respect, institutional respect, and care respect could be analyzed as forms of recognition respect. Some philosophers, however, have found the recognition/appraisal distinction to be inadequate, inasmuch as it seems to have no room for reverentia, especially in the form of the felt experience of the sublimity of the moral law and of persons as such (e.g., Buss 1999b), and it seems to obscure the variety of valuings that different modes of respect can involve. Much philosophical work has involved refining the recognition/appraisal distinction.
In the rest of this article, I will discuss respect and self-respect using Darwall’s term “recognition respect,” Hudson’s term “evaluative respect,” and Feinberg’s “reverential respect” (the last for the valuing feeling that is involuntary motivational without being deliberative), specifying the valuing dimensions as necessary.
In everyday discourse, respect most commonly refers to one of two attitudes or modes of conduct. The first is the kind of respect individuals show (or should show) others because of the latter’s social role or position. For example, children should respect their parents by listening and courtroom spectators should respect the judge. by rising upon her entrance. This is a social form of recognition respect that is, typically, structured by social institutions whose norms are authoritative for participants in the institutions and that need not involve any positive valuing of the object. “Respect” is also commonly used, second, in a valuing sense, to mean thinking highly of someone: having a lot of respect for someone who has overcome adversity or losing all respect for a betrayer. This is evaluative respect. However, philosophical attention to respect has tended to focus on recognition respect that acknowledges or values the object from a moral point of view, which we can call “moral recognition respect.” These discussions tend to relate such respect to the concepts of moral standing or moral worth. Moral standing, or moral considerability, is the idea that certain things matter morally in their own right and so are appropriate objects of direct fundamental moral consideration or concern (Birch 1993; P. Taylor 1986). Alternatively, it is argued that certain things have a distinctive kind of intrinsic moral worth, often called “dignity,” in virtue of which evoke reverential respect or ought to be accorded some valuing form of moral recognition respect. In modern philosophical discussions, humans are universally regarded as the paradigm objects of moral respect. Although some theorists argue that nature (or, all living beings, species, ecosystems) or societies (or, cultures, traditions) also warrant the moral consideration and valuing of moral recognition respect, most philosophical discussion of respect has focused on moral recognition respect for persons.
2. Respect for Persons
People can be the objects or recipients of different forms of respect. We can (directive) respect a person’s legal rights, show (institutional) respect for the president by calling her “Ms. President,” have a healthy (obstacle) respect (respekt) for an easily angered person, (care) respect someone by cherishing her in her concrete particularity, (evaluatively) respect an individual for her commitment to a worthy project, and accord one person the same basic moral respect we think any person deserves. Thus, the idea of respect for persons is ambiguous. Because both institutional respect and evaluative respect can be for persons in roles or position, the phrase “respecting someone as an R” might mean either having high regard for a person’s excellent performance in the role or behaving in ways that express due consideration or deference to an individual qua holder of that position. Similarly, the phrase “respecting someone as a person” might refer to appraising her as overall a morally good person, or acknowledging her standing as an equal in the moral community, or attending to her as the particular person she is as opposed to treating her like any other human being. In the literature of moral and political philosophy, the notion of respect for persons commonly means a kind of respect that all people are owed morally just because they are persons, regardless of social position, individual characteristics or achievements, or moral merit.
In times past, it was taken for granted that respect for human beings was a hierarchical notion; some humans, it was thought, have a higher moral standing and a greater moral worth than others and so are morally entitled to greater recognition respect. (Not just in times past – this is still the core of racism, sexism, and other forms of bigotry.) However, the modern understanding of respect for persons rests on the idea that all persons as such have a distinctive moral status in virtue of which we have unconditional obligations to regard and treat them in ways that are constrained by certain inviolable limits. This is sometimes expressed in terms of rights: all persons, it is said, have a fundamental moral right to respect simply because they are persons. Connected with this is the idea that all persons are fundamentally equal, despite the very many things that distinguish one individual from another. All persons, that is, have the moral standing of equality in the moral community and are equally worthy of and owed respect. Respect acknowledges the moral standing of equal persons as such and is also the key mode of valuing persons as persons.
But which kind of respect are all persons owed? It is obvious that we could not owe every individual evaluative respect, let alone equal evaluative respect, since not everyone acts morally correctly or has an equally morally good character. Moreover, since reverential respect is an involuntary emotional response to something that is “awesome,” but we can’t have a moral obligation to experience an emotion, reverential respect can’t be the kind we owe all persons. So, if it is true that all persons are owed or have a moral right to respect just as persons, then the concept of respect for person has to be analyzed as some form or combination of forms of moral recognition respect. One analysis takes moral recognition respect for a person as a person to involve recognizing that this being is a person, appreciating that persons as such have a distinctive moral standing and worth, understanding this standing and worth as the source of moral constraints on one’s attitudes, desires, and conduct, and viewing, valuing, and treating this person only in ways that are appropriate to and due persons (Dillon 1997, 2010).
2.1 Some important issues
It is controversial, however, whether we do indeed have a moral obligation to respect all persons regardless of merit, and if so, why. There are disagreements, for example, about the scope of the claim, the grounds of respect, and the justification for the obligation. There is also a divergence of views about the kinds of treatment that are respectful of persons.
One source of controversy concerns the scope of the concept of a person. Although in everyday discourse the word “person” is synonymous with “human being,” some philosophical discussions treat it as a technical term whose range of application might not be coextensive with the class of human beings (just as, for legal purposes, business corporations are regarded as persons). This is because some of the reasons that have been given for respecting persons entail both that some non-human things warrant the same respect on the very same grounds as humans and that not all humans do. Consequently, one question an account of respect for persons has to address is: Who or what are persons that are owed respect? Different answers have been offered, including all human beings; all and only those humans who are themselves capable of respecting persons; all beings capable of rational activity, or of sympathy and empathy, or of valuing, whether human or not; all beings capable of functioning as moral agents, whether human or not; all beings capable of participating in certain kinds of social relations, whether human or not. The second, third, and fourth answers would seem to exclude deceased humans and humans who lack sufficient mental capacity, such as the profoundly mentally disabled, the severely mentally ill and senile, those in persistent vegetative states, the pre-born, and perhaps very young children. The third, fourth, and fifth answers might include humans with diminished capacities, artificial beings (androids, sophisticated robots), spiritual beings (gods, angels), extraterrestrial beings, and certain animals (apes, dolphins).
In trying to clarify who or what we are obligated to respect, we are naturally led to a question about the ground or basis of respect: What is it about persons that makes them matter morally in such a way as to make them worthy of respect? One common way of answer this question is to look for some morally valuable natural qualities or capacities that are common to all beings that are noncontroversially owed respect (for example, all normal adult humans). Even regarding humans, there is a question of scope: Are all humans owed respect? If respect is something to which all human beings have an equal claim, then, it has been argued, the basis has to be something that all humans possess equally or in virtue of which humans are naturally equal, or a threshold quality that all humans possess, with variations above the threshold ignored. Some philosophers have argued that certain capacities fit the bill; others argue that there is no quality actually possessed by all humans that could be a plausible ground for a moral obligation of equal respect. Some draw from this the conclusion that respect is owed not to all but only to some human beings, for example, only morally good persons (Dean 2014). Another view is that the search for valuable qualities possessed by all humans that could ground universally owed moral recognition respect gets things backwards: rather than being grounded in some fact about humans, respect confers moral standing and worth on them (Sensen 2017; Bird forthcoming). But the last view still leaves the questions: why should this morally powerful standing and worth be conferred on humans? And is it conferred on all humans? Yet another question of scope is: Must persons always be respected? One view is that individuals forfeit their claim to respect by, for example, committing heinous crimes of disrespect against other persons, such as murder in the course of terrorism or genocide. Another view is that there are no circumstances under which it is morally justifiable to not respect a person, and that even torturers and child-rapists, though they may deserve the most severe condemnation and punishment and may have forfeited their rights to freedom and perhaps to life, still remain persons to whom we have obligations of respect, since the grounds of respect are independent of moral merit or demerit (Hill 2000b).
There is a further question of justification to be addressed, for it is one thing to say that persons have a certain valuable quality, but quite another thing to say that there is a moral obligation to respect persons (Hill 1997). So, we must ask: What reasons do we have for believing that the fact that persons possess quality X entails that we are morally obligated to respect persons by, for example, treating them in certain ways? Another way of asking a justification question seeks not a normative connection between qualities of persons and moral obligation, but an explanation for our belief that humans (and perhaps other beings) are owed respect, for example: What in our experience of other humans or in our evolutionary history explains the development and power of this belief? On some accounts, our actual felt experiences of reverential respect play a significant role (Buss 1999b). In other accounts, what justifies accepting our experience of respect for humans (or other beings) as grounds for an obligation is its coherence with our other moral beliefs (Hill 2000b; Margalit 1996; Gibbard 1990).
Other questions concern what respecting persons requires of us. Some philosophers argue that the obligation to respect person functions as a negative constraint: respect involves refraining from regarding or treating persons in certain ways. For example, we ought not to treat them as if they were worthless or had value only insofar as we find them useful or interesting, or as if they were mere objects or specimens, or as if they were vermin or dirt; we ought not to violate their basic moral rights, or interfere with their efforts to make their own decisions and govern their own conduct, or humiliate them, or treat them in ways that flout their nature and worth as persons. Other theorists maintain that we also have positive duties of respect: we ought, for example, to try to see each of them and the world from their own points of view, or help them to promote their morally acceptable ends, or protect them from their own self-harming decisions. And some philosophers note that it may be more respectful to judge someone’s actions or character negatively or to punish someone for wrongdoing than to treat them as if they were not responsible for what they did, although requirements of respect would impose limits on how such judgments may be expressed and how persons may be punished. Another question concerns equality of respect. While most theorists agree that moral recognition respect is owed equally to all persons and that it requires treating persons as equals (as all having the same basic moral worth and status), there is disagreement about whether respect requires that persons be treated equally (whatever is done or not done for or to one person must be done or not done for or to everyone). One view is that equal treatment would fail to respect important differences between individuals (Frankfurt 1999). Perhaps, however, as regards respect as a negative constraint, it is appropriate to treat all persons the same: no one should be treated like worthless garbage (just as no U.S. citizen should be compelled to incriminate themselves), while as regards respect as a positive duty, it may be more respectful of each person to treat individuals with different needs, aims, and circumstances differently (as a loving parent might allow her older children but not the younger ones to have social media accounts).
2.2 Kant’s Account of Respect for Persons
The most influential account of respect for persons is found in the moral philosophy of Immanuel Kant (1785, 1788, 1793, 1797). Indeed, most contemporary discussions of respect for persons explicitly claim to rely on, develop, or challenge some aspect of Kant’s ethics. Central to Kant’s ethical theory is the claim that all persons, regardless of personal qualities or achievements, social position, or moral track-record, are owed respect just because they are persons, that is, beings with rational and autonomous wills. To be a person is to have a status and worth unlike that of any other kind of being: it is to be an end in itself with dignity. And the only appropriate response to such a being is respect. Moreover, respect for persons is not only appropriate but also unconditionally required: persons must always be respected. Because we are all too often inclined not to respect each other, one formulation of the Categorical Imperative, which is the supreme principle of morality, commands that our actions express due respect for persons: “Act in such a way that you treat humanity, whether in your own person or the person of any other, never simply as a means but always at the same time as an end” (Grundlegung zur Metaphysik der Sitten (Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals) (1785, 4:429). Although commentators disagree about how precisely to understand this imperative, one common view is that it defines our fundamental moral obligation as respect all persons, including ourselves, and thus defines morally right actions as those that express respect for persons as ends in themselves and morally wrong actions as those that express disrespect or contempt for persons (Wood 1999). (On other readings, respect is one of our fundamental duties, but there are others, such as love, justice, and moral self-improvement.) In addition to this general commandment, Kant argues that there are also more specific duties of respect for other persons and self-respect, to which we’ll return. For now, we must address the question, What is it to be an end in itself and to possess dignity?
An end, for Kant, is anything for the sake of which we act. Kant identifies two kinds of ends. The first are subjective ends, which are things we want, which we pursue or promote through means we think will help us to get or advance them. The value of subjective ends is conditional on or relative to the desire or interests of the individual who values them. The other kind of end is objective. These are ends in themselves, ends whose value is not dependent on any interests or desires but is absolute and unconditional, grounded solely in what they are. Kant maintains that all and only rational beings are ends in themselves. The technical term “persons” delineates the category of beings whose rational nature “already marks them out as ends in themselves…and an object of respect” (Groundwork 4: 428).
To act for the sake of persons as ends in themselves, to respect them, is not to pursue or promote them, but to value them as the unconditionally valuable beings they are. It is also to acknowledge that there are constraints on our treatment of persons, for to be an end in itself is also to be a limit--just as the end of the road puts a limit on our travels, so an end in itself puts an absolute limit on the subjective ends we may set, the means we may use to pursue them, and, very importantly, on how we may treat ends in themselves. Such beings must never be used as if they were merely means, as if they were nothing more than tools that we may use however we want to advance our ends. Note, however, that it is not wrong to treat persons as means to our ends; indeed, we could not get along in life if we could not make use of the talents, abilities, service, and labor of other people. What we must never do is treat persons as mere means to our ends, to treat them as if the only value they have is what derives from their usefulness to us. Rather, we must always treat them “as the same time as an end.”
Kant holds that persons, as ends in themselves, have dignity (Die Metaphysik der Sitten (The Metaphysics of Morals) (1797), 6: 435). But what is dignity? Until the last century or so, “dignity” (from the Latin dignitas, worthiness) referred to a high social status associated with the aristocracy, offices of power, and high church positions. Dignity thus distinguished socially important people from the hoi polloi, who had no dignity (Debes 2017). Kant’s view that every person has dignity thus marks a revolution in valuation (but see Dean 2014 and Hay 2012 for the view that only morally good people have dignity). Commentators disagree about how to understand what Kant means by dignity (cf. Sensen 2017, 2011; Cureton 2013; Darwall 2008). But the most common interpretation is that dignity is a distinctive kind objective worth that is absolute (not conditional on anyone’s needs, desires, or interests, and a value that everyone has an overriding reason to acknowledge); intrinsic or inherent (not bestowed or earned and not subject to being lost or forfeited); incomparable and the highest form of worth (a being with dignity cannot rationally be exchanged for or replaced by any other valued object, and is infinitely valuable, we might say, rather than worth $5 or $5 million).
In arguing for respect for the dignity of persons, Kant explicitly rejects two other conceptions of human value: the aristocratic idea of honor that individuals differentially deserve according to their social rank, individual accomplishments, or moral virtue (on the aristocratic dimensions of honor, see Darwall 2013; Berger 1983), and the view, baldly expressed by Hobbes, that:
… the value or worth of a man is, as of all other things, his price—that is to say, so much as would be given for the use of his power—and therefore is not absolute but a thing dependent on the need and judgment of another. (Hobbes 1651, 79)
In The Metaphysics of Morals, Kant agrees with Hobbes that if we think of humans as merely one kind of animal among others “in the system of nature,” we can ascribe a price to them, an extrinsic value that depends on their usefulness. But, he argues,
a human being regarded as a person, that is, as the subject of morally practical reason, is exalted above all price…as an end in himself he possesses a dignity by which he exacts respect for himself from all other beings in the world. (MM, 6: 434–435)
Against the aristocratic view Kant argues that although individuals as members of some social community or other may have or lack meritorious accomplishment or status or may deserve honor or evaluative respect to different degrees or not at all, and some people deserve social recognition respect based on their socially significant features or positions, all persons as members of the moral community, i.e., the community of all and only ends in themselves, are owed the same moral recognition respect, for the dignity that they possesses as rational is unconditional and independent of all distinguishing facts about or features of them.
As the Categorical Imperative indicates, in virtue of the humanity in them that persons are, and so ought to be treated as, ends in themselves. Commentators generally identify humanity (that which makes us distinctively human beings and sets us apart from all other animal species) with two closely related aspects of rationality: the capacity to set ends and the capacity to be autonomous, both of which are capacities to be a moral agent (for example, Wood 1999; Hill 1997; Korsgaard 1996). The capacity to set ends, which is the power of rational choice, is the capacity to value things through rational judgment: to determine, under the influence of reason independently of antecedent instincts or desires, that something is valuable or important, that it is worth seeking or valuing. It is also, thereby, the capacity to value ends in themselves, and so it includes the capacity for respect (Velleman 1999). The capacity to be autonomous is the capacity to be self-legislating and self-governing, that is, (a) the capacity to legislate moral laws that are valid for all rational beings through one’s rational willing by recognizing, using reason alone, what counts as a moral obligation, and (b) the capacity then to freely resolve to act in accordance with moral laws because they are self-imposed by one’s own reason and not because one is compelled to act by any forces external to one’s reason and will, including one’s own desires and inclinations. The capacity to be autonomous is thus also the capacity to freely direct, shape, and determine the meaning of one’s own life, and it is the condition for moral responsibility. It is then, not as members of the biological species homo sapiens that human beings have dignity and so are owed moral recognition respect, but as rational beings who are capable of moral agency.
There are several important consequences of the Kantian view of the scope of moral recognition respect for persons as persons. First, while all normally functioning human beings possess the rational capacities that ground recognition respect, there can be humans in whom these capacities are altogether absent and who therefore, on this view, are not persons and are not owed respect. Second, these capacities could, in principle, be possessed by beings who are not biologically human, and such beings would also be persons with dignity whom we are morally obligated to respect. Third, because dignity does not depend on how well or badly the capacities for moral agency are exercised, on whether a person acts morally or has a morally good character or not, dignity is not a matter of degree and cannot be diminished or lost through vice or morally bad action or increased through virtue or morally correct action. Thus, the morally worst person has the same dignity as the morally best, although the former, we might say, fail to live up to their dignity. Likewise, moral recognition respect is not something individuals have to earn or might fail to earn, so even the morally worst individuals must still be regarded as ends in themselves and treated with respect. Of course, wrongdoing may call for punishment and may be grounds for forfeiting certain rights, but it is not grounds for losing dignity, for being regarded as worthless scum, or denied all respect (Hill 2000b). What grounds dignity is something that all persons have in common, not something that distinguishes one individual from another. Thus, each person is to be respected as an equal among equals, without consideration of individual achievements or failures, social rank, moral merit or demerit. However, the equality of all rational beings does not entail that persons cannot also be differentially evaluated and valued in other ways for their particular qualities, accomplishments, merit, or usefulness, although such valuing and treatment must always be constrained by the moral requirement to accord recognition respect to persons as ends in themselves.
In The Metaphysics of Morals, Kant develops the implications of this view of persons as ends in themselves. His doctrine of justice holds that the fundamental freedom and equality of persons is the basis of the legitimate state, that freedom of choice must be respected and promoted, that persons are bearers of fundamental rights and that the moral status of persons imposes limits on permissible legal punishment. In his doctrine of virtue, Kant discusses specific moral duties of recognition respect for other persons, as well as duties of recognition self-respect, to which we’ll return below. Here, Kant explicitly invokes the notion of respect as observantia. We have no moral duty to feel respect for others; rather, the respect we owe others is “to be understood as the maxim of limiting our self-esteem by the dignity of humanity in another person, and so as respect in the practical sense” (MM, 6:449). This duty of recognition respect owed to others requires two things: first, that we adopt as a regulating policy a commitment to control our own desire to think well of ourselves (this desire being the main cause of disrespect), and, second, that we refrain from treating others in the following ways: treating them merely as means (valuing them as less than ends in themselves), showing contempt for them (denying that they have any worth), treating them arrogantly (demanding that they value us more highly than they value themselves), making them look like worthless beings by defaming them by publicly exposing their faults, and ridiculing or mocking them.
Subsequent work in a Kantian vein on the duty of respect for others has expanded the list of ways that we are morally required by respect to treat persons. In particular, although Kant says that the duties of recognition respect are strictly negative, consisting in not engaging in certain conduct or having certain attitudes, many philosophers have argued that respecting others involves positive actions and attitudes as well. The importance of autonomy and agency in Kant’s moral philosophy has led many philosophers to highlight respect for autonomy. Thus, we respect others as persons (negatively) by doing nothing to impair or destroy their capacity for autonomy, by not interfering with their autonomous decisions and their pursuit of the (morally acceptable) ends they value, and by not coercing or deceiving them or treating them paternalistically. We also respect them (positively) by protecting them from threats to their autonomy (which may require intervention when someone’s current decisions seem to put their autonomy at risk) and by promoting autonomy and the conditions for it (for example, by allowing and encouraging individuals to make their own decisions, take responsibility for their actions, and control their own lives). Some philosophers have highlighted Kant’s claim that rationality is the ground for recognition respect, arguing that to respect others is to engage with them not as instruments or obstacles but as persons who are to be reasoned with. The importance of the capacity to set ends and value things has been taken by some philosophers to entail that respect also involves helping others to promote and protect what they value and to pursue their ends, provided these are compatible with due respect for other persons, and making an effort to appreciate values that are different from our own. Kant’s emphasis in the doctrine of justice on the fundamental rights that persons have has led still others to view the duty of recognition respect for persons as the duty to respect the moral rights they have as persons; some have claimed that the duty to respect is nothing more than the duty to refrain from violating these rights (Benn 1988; Feinberg 1970).
Finally, it is worth noting that on Kant’s account, both the moral law and morally good people--those who do what is right out of respect for the moral law--are also objects of respect. The respect here is reverentia, the inescapable felt consciousness of the unconditional authority of the law and compelling examples of obedience to it, a consciousness of one’s mind “bowing,” as it were, in submission. Reverentia can give rise both to recognition respect of the law and persons as such and to evaluative respect for good people. (See discussions in kant’s Groundwork (4:401n); Metaphysics of Morals (6:399–418); Kritik der praktischen Vernunft (Critique of Practical Reason) (1788) (5:72–76); and Die Religion innerhalb der Grenzen der bloßen Vernunft (Religion within the Bounds of Mere Reason) (1793) (6:21–23); and in Stratton-Lake 200; Grenberg 1999; Wood 1999; Hill 1998; McCarty 1994).
2.3 Further issues, developments, and applications
Philosophical discussions of respect since Kant have tended, on the one hand, to develop or apply various aspects of it, or on the other, to take issue with it or develop alternative accounts of respect. Some of the discussions have focused on more theoretical issues. For example, Kant gives the notion of respect for persons a central and vital role in moral theory. One issue that has since concerned philosophers is whether respect for persons is the definitive focus of morality, either in the sense that moral rightness and goodness and hence all specific moral duties, rights, and virtues are explainable in terms of respect or in the sense that the supreme moral principle from which all other principles are derived is a principle of respect for persons. Some philosophers have developed ethical theories in which a principle of respect for persons is identified as the fundamental and comprehensive moral requirement (for example, Donagan 1977; Downie and Telfer 1969). Others (for example, Hill 1993; Frankena 1986; Cranor 1975) argue that while respect for persons is surely a very important moral consideration, it cannot be the principle from which the rest of morality is deduced. They maintain that there are moral contexts in which respect for persons is not an issue and that there are other dimensions of our moral relations with others that seem not to reduce to respect. Moreover, they argue, such a principle would seem not to provide moral grounds for believing that we ought to treat mentally incapacitated humans or nonhuman animals decently, or would (as Kant argues) make a duty to respect such beings only an indirect duty—one we have only because it is a way of respecting persons who value such beings or because our duty to respect ourselves requires that we not engage in activities that would dull our ability to treat persons decently—rather than a direct duty to such beings (Metaphysics of Morals, 6:443).
Some theorists maintain that utilitarianism, a moral theory generally thought to be a rival to Kant’s theory, is superior with regard to this last point. A utilitarian might argue that it is sentience rather than the capacity for rational autonomy that is the ground of moral recognition respect, and so would regard mentally incapacitated humans and nonhuman animals as having moral standing and so as worthy of at least some moral respect in themselves. Another issue, then, is whether utilitarianism (or more generally, consequentialism) can indeed accommodate a principle of respect for persons. In opposition to the utilitarian claim, some Kantians argue that Kant’s ethics is distinguishable from consequentialist ethics precisely in maintaining that the fundamental demand of morality is not that we promote some value, such as the happiness of sentient beings, but that we respect the worth of humanity regardless of the consequences of doing so (Wood 1999; Korsgaard 1996). Thus, some philosophers argue that utilitarianism is inconsistent with respect for persons, inasmuch as utilitarianism, in requiring that all actions, principles, or motives promote the greatest good, requires treating persons as mere means on those occasions when doing so maximizes utility, whereas the very point of a principle of respect for persons is to rule out such trading of persons and their dignity for some other value (Benn 1988, Brody 1982). In opposition, other theorists maintain not only that a consequentialist theory can accommodate the idea of respect for persons (Cummiskey 2008, 1990; Pettit 1989; Gruzalski 1982; Landesman 1982; Downie and Telfer 1969), but also that utilitarianism is derivable from a principle of respect for persons (Downie and Telfer 1969) and that consequentialist theories provide a better grounding for duties to respect persons (Pettit 1989).
In addition to the debate between Kantian theory and utilitarianism, theoretical work has also been done in developing the role of respect for persons in Habermasian communicative ethics (Young 1997; Benhabib 1991) and in exploring respect in the ethics of other philosophers, including ancient Greek poets (Giorgini 2017), Plato (Rowe 2017), Aristotle (Thompson 2017; Weber 2017; Rabbås 2015; Jacobs 1995; Preus 1991), Hobbes (2017), Hegel (Laitinen 2017; Moland 2002), and Mill (Loizides 2017). Cross-cultural explorations include discussions of similarities and differences between western (Kantian) views of respect for persons and Indian (Ghosh-Dastidar 1987), Confucian (Liu 2019; Lu 2017; Chan 2006; Wawrytko 1982), and Taoist views (Wong 1984). Several theorists have developed distinctively feminist account of respect for persons (Farley 1993; Dillon 1992a).
Other philosophical discussions have been concerned with clarifying the nature of the respect that is owed to persons and of the persons that are owed respect. Some of these discussions aim to refine and develop Kant’s account, while others criticize it, or offer alternatives. One significant non-Kantian account is Pettit’s conversive theory of respect for persons (Pettit 2021, 2015). An influential development of the Kantian account is Darwall’s second-personal account (2021, 2015, 2008, 2006, 2004), according to which the regulation of conduct that moral recognition respect involves arises from our directly acknowledging each other as equal persons who have the moral authority to address moral demands to one another that each of us is morally obligated to accept. The reciprocal relations of persons as authoritative claims-makers and mutually accountable claims-responders is, in Darwall’s view, one way of understanding what Kant calls in the Groundwork a “kingdom of ends.”
Another area of interest has been the connections between respect and other attitudes and emotions, especially love and between respect and virtues such as trust. For example, Kant argues that we have duties of love to others just as we have duties of respect. However, neither the love nor the respect we owe is a matter of feeling (or, is pathological, as Kant says), but is, rather, a duty to adopt a certain kind of maxim, or policy of action: the duty of love is the duty to make the ends of others my own, the duty of respect is the duty to not degrade others to the status of mere means to my ends (Metaphysics of Morals, 6: 449–450). Love and respect, in Kant’s view, are intimately united in friendship; nevertheless, they are in tension with one another and respect seems to be the morally more important of the two. Critics object to what they see here as Kant’s devaluing of emotions, maintaining that emotions are morally significant dimensions of persons both as subjects and as objects of both respect and love. In response, some philosophers contend that respect and love are more similar and closely connected in Kant’s theory than is generally recognized (Bagnoli 2003; Velleman 1999; Baron 1997; R. Johnson 1997). Others have developed accounts of respect that is or incorporates a form of love (agape) or care (Dillon 1992a; Downie and Telfer 1969; Maclagan 1960), and some have argued that emotions are included among the bases of dignity and that a complex emotional repertoire is necessary for Kantian respect (Wood 1999; Sherman 1998a; Farley 1993). In a related vein, some philosophers maintain that it is possible to acknowledge that another being is a person, i.e., a rational moral agent, and yet not have or give respect to that being. What is required for respecting a person is not simply recognizing what they are but emotionally experiencing their value as a person (Thomas 2001a; Buss 1999b; Dillon 1997). Other attitudes, emotions, and virtues whose connections with respect have been discussed are toleration (for example, Carter 2013; Deveaux 1998; Addis 2004), forgiveness (for example, Holmgren 1993), good manners (Stohr 2012; Buss 1999a), esteem (for example, Brennan and Pettit 1997), reverence (Woodruff 2003, 2001), honor (Darwall 2015), and appreciation (Hill 2021). Work has also been done on attitudes and emotions that are (usually taken to be) opposed to respect, such as arrogance (Dillon 2003) and contempt (Miceli and Castelfranci 2018; Mason 2017; Bell 2013).
Another source of dissatisfaction with Kant’s account has been with his characterization of persons and the quality in virtue of which they must be respected. In particular, Kant’s view that the rational will which is common to all persons is the ground of respect is thought to ignore the moral importance of the concrete particularity of each individual, and his emphasis on autonomy, which is often understood to involve the independence of one person from all others, is thought to ignore the essential relationality of human beings (for example, Noggle 1999; Farley 1993; Dillon 1992a; E. Johnson 1982). Rather than ignoring what distinguishes one person from another, it is argued, respect should involve attending to each person as a distinctive individual and to the concrete realities of human lives, and it should involve valuing difference as well as sameness and interdependence as well as independence. Other critics respond that respecting differences and particular identities inevitably reintroduces hierarchical discrimination that is antithetical to the equality among persons that the idea of respect for persons is supposed to express (for example, Bird 2004). Identity and difference may, however, be appropriate objects of other forms of consideration and appreciation.
The ideas of mutual respect or disrespect and respect for particularity and relationality has also become an important topic in moral and political philosophy. Helm has argued that a “community of respect” is essential to understanding what a person is (Helm 2017). Margalit argues that humiliation, both disrespect and the result of being disrespected, is a form of exclusion of individuals from the good of community (Margalit 1996). One issue is how persons ought to be respected in multicultural liberal democratic societies (for example, Balint 2006; Tomasi 1995; C. Taylor 1992; Kymlicka 1989). Respect for persons is one of the basic tenets of liberal democratic societies, which are founded on the ideal of the equal dignity of all citizens and which realize this ideal in the equalization of rights and entitlements among all citizens and so the rejection of discrimination and differential treatment. Some writers argue that respecting persons requires respecting the traditions and cultures that permeate and shape their individual identities (Addis 1997). But as the citizenry of such societies becomes increasingly more diverse and as many groups come to regard their identities or very existence as threatened by a homogenizing equality, liberal societies face the question of whether they should or could respond to demands to respect the unique identity of individuals or groups by differential treatment, such as extending political rights or opportunities to some cultural groups (for example, Native Americans, French Canadians, African-Americans) and not others. Some of these discussions are carried out in terms of recognition rather than of respect, although some theorists contrast recognition and respect (McBride 2013). Honneth develops a broader, critical account of recognition that argues for a harmonious relationship among universal (recognition) respect, esteem, and love, arguing that each is essential for the development of positive relations towards ourselves (Honneth 2007, 1995).
The idea that all persons are owed respect has been applied in a wide variety of contexts. For instance, some philosophers employ it to justify various positions in normative ethics, such as the claim that persons have moral rights (Benn 1971; Feinberg 1970; Downie and Telfer 1969) or duties (Fried 1978; Rawls 1971), or to argue for principles of equality (Williams 1962), justice (Narveson 2002a, 2002b; Nussbaum 1999), and education (Andrews 1976). Others appeal to respect for persons in addressing a wide variety of practical issues such as abortion, racism and sexism, rape, punishment, physician-assisted suicide, pornography, affirmative action, forgiveness, terrorism, sexual harassment, cooperation with injustice, treatment of gays and lesbians, sexual ethics, and many others. In political philosophy, respect for persons has been used to examine issues of global inequality (e.g., Moellendorf 2010). One very important application context is biomedical ethics, where the principle of respect for autonomy is one of four basic principles that have become “the backbone of contemporary Western health care ethics” (Brannigan and Boss 2001, 39; see also Beauchamp and Childress 1979/2001 and, for example, Kerstein 2021; Munson 2000; Beauchamp and Walters 1999). The idea of respect for patient autonomy has transformed health care practice, which had traditionally worked on physician-based paternalism, and the principle enters into issues such as informed consent, truth-telling, confidentiality, respecting refusals of life-saving treatment, the use of patients as subjects in medical experimentation, and so on.
3. Respect for Nature and Nonhuman Beings
Although persons are the paradigm objects of moral recognition respect, it is a matter of some debate whether they are the only things that we ought morally to respect. One serious objection raised against Kant’s ethical theory is that in claiming that only rational beings are ends in themselves deserving of respect, it licenses treating all things which aren’t persons as mere means to the ends of rational beings, and so it supports domination and exploitation of all nonpersons and the natural environment. Taking issue with the Kantian position that only persons are respect-worthy, many philosophers have argued that humans who are not agents or not yet agents, human embryos, nonhuman animals, sentient creatures, plants, species, all living things, biotic communities, the natural ecosystem of our planet, and even mountains, rocks, and viruses have (full or perhaps just partial) moral standing or worth and so are appropriate objects of or are owed moral recognition respect. Of course, it is possible to value such things instrumentally insofar as they serve human interests, but the idea is that such things matter morally and have a claim to respect in their own right, independently of their usefulness to humans.
A variety of different strategies have been employed in arguing for such respect claims. For example, the concept of moral recognition respect is sometimes stripped down to its essentials, omitting much of the content of the concept as it appears in respect for persons contexts. The respect that is owed to all things, it can be argued, is a very basic form of attentive contemplation of the object combined with a prima facie assumption that the object might have intrinsic value (Birch 1993). Another strategy is to argue that the true grounds for moral worth and recognition respect are other than or wider than rationality. One version of this strategy (employed by P. Taylor 1986) is to argue that all living things, persons and nonpersons, have equal inherent worth and so equally deserve the same kind of moral respect, because the ground of the worth of living things that are nonpersons is continuous with the ground of the worth for persons. For example, we can regard all living things as respect-worthy in virtue of being quasi-agents and centers of organized activity that pursue their own good in their own unique way. I
A third strategy, which is employed within Kantian ethics, is to argue that respect for persons logically entails respect for nonpersons. For example, one can argue that rational nature is to be respected not only by respecting humanity in someone’s person but also by respecting things that bear certain relations to rational nature, for example, by being fragments of it or necessary conditions of it. Respect would thus be owed to humans who are not persons and to animals and other sentient beings (Foreman 2017; Rocha 2015; Wood 1998). Another strategy argues against Kant that we can both acknowledge that rational moral agents have the highest moral standing and worth and are owed maximal respect, and also maintain that other beings have lesser but still morally significant standing or worth and so deserve less but still some respect. So, although it is always wrong to use moral agents merely as means, it may be justifiable to use nonpersons as means (for example, to do research on human embryos or kill animals for food) provided their moral worth is also respectfully acknowledged (Meyer and Nelson, 2001). Much philosophical work has been done, particularly in environmental ethics, to determine the practical implications of the claim that things other than persons are owed respect (e.g., Corral 2015; Foreman 2015; Schmidtz 2011; Bognar 2011; Connolly 2006; Wiggins 2000; Westra 1989).
While there is much controversy about respect for persons and other things, there is surprising agreement among moral and political philosophers about at least this much concerning respect for oneself: self-respect is something of great importance in everyday life. Indeed, it is regarded both as morally required and as essential to the ability to live a satisfying, meaningful, flourishing life—a life worth living—and just as vital to the quality of our lives together. Saying that a person has no self-respect or acts in a way no self-respecting person would act, or that a social institution undermines the self-respect of some people, is generally a strong moral criticism. Nevertheless, as with respect itself, there is philosophical disagreement, both real and merely apparent, about the nature, scope, grounds, and requirements of self-respect. Self-respect is often defined as a sense of worth or as due respect for oneself; it has been analyzed in various ways: it is treated as a moral duty connected with the duty to respect all persons, as something to which all persons have a right and which it would be unjust to undermine, as a moral virtue essential to morally good living, and as something one earns by living up to demanding standards. Self-respect is frequently (but not always correctly) identified with or compared to self-esteem, self-confidence, dignity, self-love, a sense of honor, self-reliance, pride, and it is contrasted (but not always correctly) with servility, shame, humility, self-abnegation, arrogance, self-importance. Understanding how, if at all, self-respect is connected with and different from these other attitudes and stances is important to having a good understanding of self-respect and the other things.
In addition to the questions philosophers have addressed about respect in general, other questions have been of particular concern to those interested in self-respect, such as: (1) What is self-respect, and how is it connected to or different from related notions such as self-esteem, self-confidence, pride, and so on? How are respect for persons and respect for oneself alike and unalike? (2) How is self-respect related to such things as moral rights, virtue, autonomy, integrity, and identity? (3) Is there a moral duty to respect ourselves as there is a duty to recognition respect others? (4) Are there objective conditions—for example, moral standards or correct judgments—that a person must meet in order to have self-respect, or is self-respect a subjective phenomenon that gains support from any sort of self-valuing without regard to correctness or moral acceptability? (5) Does respecting oneself conceptually entail or causally require or lead to respecting other persons (or anything else)? And how are respect for other persons and respect for oneself alike and unalike? (6) What features of an individual’s psychology and experience, what aspects of the social context, and what modes of interactions with others support or undermine self-respect? (7) Are social institutions and practices to be judged just or unjust (at least in part) by how they affect self-respect? Can considerations of self-respect help us to better understand the nature and wrongness of injustices such as oppression and to determine effective and morally appropriate ways to resist or end them?
4.1 The concept of self-respect
Self-respect is a form of self-regard, a moral relation of persons (and only persons) to themselves that concerns their own important worth. Self-respect is thus essentially a valuing form of respect. It is, moreover, a normative stance--it is due regard for oneself, proper regard for the dignity of one’s person or position (as the O.E.D. puts it). Like respect for others, self-respect is a complex of multilayered and interpenetrating phenomena; it involves all those aspects of cognition, valuation, affect, expectation, motivation, action, and reaction that compose a mode of being in the world at the heart of which is an appropriate appreciation of oneself as having significant worth. Unlike some forms of respect, self-respect is not something one has only now and again or that might have no effect on its object. Rather, self-respect has to do with the structure and attunement of an individual’s identity and of her life, and it reverberates throughout the self, affecting the configuration and constitution of the person’s thoughts, desires, values, emotions, commitments, dispositions, and actions. As expressing or constituting one’s sense of worth, it includes an engaged understanding of one’s worth, as well as a desire and disposition to protect and preserve it. Accounts of self-respect differ in their characterizations of the beliefs, desires, affects, and behaviors that are constitutive of it, chiefly because of differences concerning both the aspects or conception of the self insofar as it is the object of one’s respect and also the nature and grounds of the worth of the self or aspects of the self.
Most theorists agree that as there are different kinds of respect, so there are different kinds of self-respect. However, we clearly cannot apply all kinds of respect to ourselves: it makes no sense to talk of directive respect for oneself, for instance, and although one might regard oneself or some of one’s characteristics as obstacles (“I’m my own worst enemy”), this would not generally be considered a form of self-respect. Because the notion of self-worth is the organizing motif for self-respect, and because in the dominant Western tradition two kinds of worth are ascribed to persons, two kinds of self-respect can be distinguished.
One way of expressing the distinction is to focus on the kinds of self-worth around which it is oriented. One kind of worth has to do with what the individual is: occupant of a social role, member of a certain class, group, or people, someone with a certain place in a social hierarchy, or simply a human person. Kantian dignity is one form, but not the only form, of this kind of worth. Such status- or identity-grounded worth entails both entitlements to due treatment from others and responsibilities for the individual in virtue of being the kind of thing that is rightly the object of respect. Recognition self-respect centers on this kind of worth. (Bird calls this “entitlement self-respect” (Bird 2010); Schemmel calls it “standing self-respect” (Schemmel 2019)). The censuring question, “Have you no self-respect?”, the phrase “No self-respecting person would ...,” and the idea that everyone has a right to self-respect concern recognition self-respect. Another kind of self-respect depends not on what one is but on the kind of person one is making of oneself, on the extent to which one’s character and conduct meet standards of worthiness. Evaluative self-respect has to do with this second kind of worth, an acquired worth that we can call “merit,” which is based on the quality of one’s character and conduct. (Darwall (1997) calls this “appraisal self-respect”; Bird and Schemmel call it “standards self-respect,” since merit is a function of the standards to which one holds oneself and by which one evaluates or appraises oneself.) We earn or lose merit, and so deserve or don’t deserve evaluative self-respect, through what we do or become. Although they are different, recognition self-respect and evaluative self-respect are related. The former involves, among other things, recognizing certain norms as entailed by one’s identity-based worth and valuing oneself appropriately by striving to live in accord with them. The latter involves regarding oneself as having merit because one is or is becoming the kind of person who does live in accord with what one regards as appropriate norms or standards.
Individuals have numerous identities and so worth bases for different forms of recognition self-respect. While self-respect based on one’s social role or position can be quite important to the individual and how she lives her life as a self-respecting chef, rabbi, mother, teacher, Hindu, or member of the aristocracy, most philosophical discussions, heavily influenced by Kant, focus on dignity-based respect for oneself as a person, that is, on moral recognition self-respect. Recognition respect for oneself as a person, then, involves living in light of an understanding and appreciation of oneself as having dignity and moral status just in virtue of being a person, and of the moral constraints that arise from that dignity and status. All persons are morally obligated or entitled to have this kind of self-respect. Because the dominant Kantian conception of persons grounds dignity in three things—equality, agency, and individuality—we can further distinguish three kinds of recognition self-respect. The first is respect for oneself as a person among persons, as a member of the moral community with a status and dignity equal to every other person (see, for example, Thomas 1983a; Boxill 1976; Hill 1973). This involves having some conception of the kinds of treatment from others that would count as one’s due as a person and treatment that would be degrading or beneath one’s dignity, desiring to be regarded and treated appropriately, and resenting and being disposed to protest disregard and disrespectful treatment. Thinking of oneself as having certain moral rights that others ought not to violate is part of this kind of self-respect; servility (regarding oneself as the inferior of others) and arrogance (thinking oneself superior to others) are among its opposites.
The second kind of recognition self-respect involves an appreciation of oneself as an agent, a being with the ability and responsibility to act autonomously and value appropriately (see, for example, G. Taylor 1985; Telfer 1968). Persons who respect themselves as agents take their responsibilities seriously, especially their responsibilities to live in accord with their dignity as persons, to govern themselves fittingly, and to make of themselves and their lives something they believe to be good. So, self-respecting persons regard certain forms of acting, thinking, desiring, and feeling as befitting them as persons and other forms as self-debasing or shameful, and they expect themselves to adhere to the former and avoid the latter. They take care of themselves and seek to develop and use their talents and abilities in pursuit of their plans, projects, and goals. Those who are shameless, uncontrolled, weak-willed, self-consciously sycophantic, chronically irresponsible, slothfully dependent, self-destructive, or unconcerned with the shape and direction of their lives may be said to not respect themselves as agents.
A third kind of recognition self-respect involves the appreciation of the importance of being autonomously self-defining. One way a self-respecting individual does this is through having, and living in light, of a normative self-conception, i.e., a conception of being and living that she regards as worthy of her as the particular person she is. Such a self-conception both gives expression to ideals and commitments that shape the individual’s identity, and also organizes desires, choices, pursuits, and projects in ways that give substance and worth to the self. Self-respecting people hold themselves to personal expectations and standards the disappointment of which they would regard as unworthy of them, shameful, even contemptible (although they may not apply these standards to others) (Hill 1982). People who sell out, betray their own values, live inauthentic lives, let themselves be defined by others, or are complacently self-accepting lack this kind of recognition self-respect.
To these three Kantian kinds of recognition self-respect, we can add a fourth, which has to do with the fact that it is not just as abstract human beings or as agents with personal and universalizable moral goals and obligations that individuals can, do, or should respect themselves but also as concrete persons embedded in particular social structures and occupying various social positions with status-related responsibilities they must meet to be self-respecting (Middleton 2006). This last kind also has political implications, as discussed below.
Evaluative self-respect, which expresses confidence in one’s merit as a person, rests on an appraisal of oneself in light of the normative self-conception that structures recognition self-respect. Recognition self-respecting persons are concerned to be the kind of person they think it is good and appropriate for them to be and they try to live the kind of life such a person should live. Thus, they have and try to live by certain standards of worthiness by which they are committed to judge themselves. Indeed, they stake themselves, their value and their identities, on living in accord with these standards. Because they want to know where they stand, morally, they are disposed to reflectively examine and evaluate their character and conduct in light of their normative vision of themselves. And it matters to them that they are able to “bear their own survey,” as Hume says (1739, 620). Evaluative self-respect contains the judgment that one is or is becoming the worthy kind of person one seeks to be, and, more significantly, that one is not in danger of becoming an unworthy kind of person (Dillon 2004). Evaluative self-respect holds, at the least, the judgment that one “comes up to scratch,” as Telfer (1968) puts it. Those whose conduct is unworthy or whose character is shameful by their own standards do not deserve their own evaluative respect. However, people can be poor self-appraisers and their standards can be quite inappropriate to them or to any person, and so their evaluative self-respect, though still subjectively satisfying, can be unwarranted, as can the loss or lack of it. Interestingly, although philosophers have paid scant attention to evaluative respect for others, significant work has been done on evaluative self-respect. This may reflect an asymmetry between the two: although our evaluative respect for others may have no effect on them, perhaps because we don’t express it or they don’t value our appraisal, our own self-evaluation matters intensely to us and can powerfully affect our self-identity and the shape and structure of our lives. Indeed, an individual’s inability to stomach herself can profoundly diminish the quality of her life, even her desire to continue living.
Some philosophers have contended that a third kind of self-valuing underlies both recognition and evaluative self-respect. It is a more basic sense of worth that enables an individual to develop the intellectually more sophisticated forms, a precondition for being able to take one’s qualities or the fact that one is a person as grounds of positive self-worth. It has been called “basic psychological security” (Thomas 1989), “self-love” (Buss 1999), and “basal self-respect” (Dillon 1997). Basal self-valuing is our most fundamental sense of ourselves as mattering and our primordial interpretation of self and self-worth. Strong and secure basal self-respect can immunize an individual against personal failing or social denigration, but damage to basal self-respect, which can occur when people grow up in social, political, or cultural environments that devalue them or “their kind,” can make it impossible for people to properly interpret themselves and their self-worth, because it affects the way in which they assess reality and weigh reasons. Basal self-respect is thus the ground of the possibility of recognition and evaluative self-respect.
There are also non-deontological accounts of moral recognition self-respect. Utilitarians, for example, can treat self-respect as of paramount importance to a flourishing or happy life, and thereby justifying moral constraints on the treatment of others (Scarre 1992). Similarly, one could give a virtue-theoretical account of recognition self-respect, especially the agentic form (Dillon 2015), although this avenue has been relatively unexplored
It is common in everyday discourse and philosophical discussion to treat self-respect and self-esteem as synonyms. It is evaluative self-respect, typically, with which self-esteem is conflated (Dillon 2013). Evaluative self-respect and (high) self-esteem are both forms of positive self-regard concerned with one’s worth, both involve having a favorable view of oneself in virtue of one’s activities and personal qualities, and a person can have or lack either one undeservedly. Nevertheless, many philosophers have argued that the two attitudes are importantly different (for example, Dillon 2004, 2013; Harris 2001; Chazan 1998; Sachs 1981; Darwall 1977), although some theorists treat the evaluative stance as a form of self-esteem (“mortal self-esteem”). The main difference between the two is that evaluative self-respect is a normative stance and self-esteem is not: the former calls for justification in light of standards one has good reason to regard as appropriate, while the latter arises from beliefs about oneself whose justification need not matter to one and that need not involve standards-based self-assessment. Many philosophers agree that evaluative self-respect is morally important, which makes sense inasmuch as it is in the service of the moral demands of dignity, worthy character, agency, and one’s moral commitments, and so is a motivation for morally appropriate living. Self-esteem--having a good opinion of oneself or feeling good about oneself--is one of the most extensively studied phenomena in psychology and social psychology; it is generally regarded by social scientists as central to healthy psychological functioning and well-being, although they note that it has no necessary connection to moral values, is central to such negative states as narcissism, and can lead to serious disrespect of others and harm unless appropriately constrained (Baumeister et al 1996). (But see Keshen (2017) on the value of reasonable self-esteem.) One way of distinguishing evaluative self-respect and self-esteem is by their grounds and the points of view from which they are appraised. Evaluative self-respect involves an assessment from a moral point of view of one’s character and conduct in light of standards one regards as implied by one’s moral worth as an agent and a person. Self-esteem, as popularly and scientifically understood, is based both on whatever qualities or activities one prizes or thinks others prize, and on the esteem one believes one gets from others whose esteem one values. It does not essentially concern morally significant worth, appropriate self-valuing, or self-assessment from a moral point of view, and it can be based on features wholly unrelated to or even opposed to good character. For example, one can have a good opinion of oneself in virtue of being a good joke-teller or for having won an important sports competition and yet not think one is a good person because of it (Darwall 1977). And depending on what serves one’s psychological needs or suits one’s companions, one can derive high self-esteem from successful thuggery as from being honest and kind. To have self-esteem is to feel good about oneself; to have evaluative self-respect is to feel justified, to be able to hold one’s head up, look others in the eye, face oneself in the mirror. Another way of distinguishing them focuses on what it is to lose them: to lose evaluative respect for oneself is to find oneself to be shameful, contemptible, or intolerable; to lose self-esteem is to think less well of oneself, to be downcast because one believes one lacks qualities that would add to one’s luster (Harris 2001) or that others think less well of one.
Self-respect is also often identified with pride, although the two are rather different (Morton 2017). Just as there are different kinds of self-respect so, there are different kinds of pride, which are complexly related. In one sense, pride is the pleasure or satisfaction taken in one’s achievements, possessions, or associations; this kind of pride can be an affective element of either evaluative self-respect or self-esteem. In another sense, pride is inordinate self-esteem or vanity, an excessively high opinion of one’s qualities, accomplishments, or status that can make one arrogant and contemptuous of others. This kind of pride contrasts with both well-grounded evaluative self-respect and the interpersonal kind of moral recognition self-respect. But pride can also be a claim to and celebration of a status worth or to equality with others, especially other groups (for example, Black Pride), which is interpersonal recognition self-respect (Thomas 1993a, 1978–79). Pride can also be “proper pride,” which is a sense of one’s dignity that prevents one from doing what is unworthy; this is the agentic dimension of recognition self-respect. Pride’s opposites, shame and humility, are also closely related to self-respect. A loss of evaluative self-respect may be expressed in shame, but shameless people manifest a lack of recognition self-respect; and although humiliation can diminish or undermine recognition self-respect and evaluative self-respect, humility is an appropriate dimension of the evaluative self-respect of any imperfect person.
One issue with which contemporary philosophers have been concerned is whether self-respect is an objective concept or a subjective one. If it is the former, then there are certain beliefs, attitudes, and dispositions a person must have to be self-respecting. A person who thought of herself as a lesser sort of being whose interests and well-being are less important than those of others would not count as having moral recognition self-respect, no matter how appropriate she regards her stance. If self-respect is a subjective concept, then a person counts as having self-respect if, for example, she believes she is not tolerating treatment she regards as unworthy or behaving in ways she thinks is beneath her, regardless of whether her judgments about herself are accurate or her standards or sense of what she is due are judged by others to be reasonable or worthy (Massey 1983a). Psychologists, for whom “self-esteem” is the term of practice, tend to regard the various dimensions of a person’s sense of worth as subjective. Many philosophers treat the interpersonal dimension of recognition self-respect objectively, and it is generally thought that having manifestly inaccurate beliefs about oneself is good grounds for at least calling an individual’s sense of worth unjustified or compromised (Meyers 1989). But there is no consensus regarding the standards to which individuals hold themselves and by which they judge themselves, and certainly the standards of the self-defining dimension of moral recognition self-respect are inescapably, though perhaps not exclusively, subjective. Complicating the objective/subjective distinction, however, is the fact of the social construction of self-respect. What it is to be a person or to have a status worthy of respect, what treatment and conduct are appropriate to a person or one with such a status, what forms of life and character have merit—all of these are given different content in different sociocultural contexts. Individuals necessarily, though perhaps not inalterably, learn to engage with themselves and with issues of self-worth in the terms and modes of the sociocultural conceptions in which they have been immersed. And different kinds of individuals may be given different opportunities in different sociocultural contexts to acquire or develop the grounds of the different kinds of self-respect (Dillon 2021, 1997; Moody-Adams 1992–93; Meyers 1989; Thomas 1983b). Even fully justified self-respect may thus be less than strongly objective and more than simply subjective.
4.2 Treatment of self-respect in moral and political philosophy
Self-respect is frequently appealed to as a means of justifying a wide variety of philosophical claims or positions, generally in arguments of the form: x promotes (or undermines) self-respect; therefore, x is to that extent to be morally approved (or objected to). For example, appeals to self-respect have been used to argue for, among many other things, the value of moral rights (Feinberg 1970), moral requirements or limits regarding forgiving others or oneself (Dillon 2001; Holmgren 1998, 1993; Novitz 1998; Haber 1991; Murphy 1982), and both the rightness and wrongness of practices such as affirmative action. Such arguments rely on rather than establish the moral importance of self-respect. Most philosophers who attend to self-respect tend to treat it as important in one of two ways, which are exemplified in the very influential work of Kant and John Rawls.
Kant argues that, just as we have a moral duty to respect others as persons, so we have a moral duty to respect ourselves as persons, a duty that derives from our dignity as rational beings. This duty requires us to act always in an awareness of our dignity and so to act only in ways that are consistent with our status as ends in ourselves and to refrain from acting in ways that abase, degrade, defile, or disavow our rational nature. That is, we have a duty of moral recognition self-respect. In The Metaphysics of Morals (1797), Kant argues for specific duties to oneself generated by the general duty to respect humanity in our persons, including duties to not engage in suicide, misuse of our sexual powers, drunkenness and other unrestrained indulgence of inclination, lying, self-deception, avarice, and servility. Kant also maintains that the duty of self-respect is the most important moral duty, for unless there were duties to respect oneself, there could be no moral duties at all. Moreover, fulfilling our duty to respect ourselves is a necessary condition of fulfilling our duties to respect other persons. Kant maintains that we are always aware of our dignity as persons and so of our moral obligation to respect ourselves, and he identifies this awareness as a feeling of reverential respect for ourselves. This is one of the natural capacities of feeling which we could have no duty to acquire but that make it possible for us to be motivated by the thought of duty. Reverence for self is, along with “moral feeling,” conscience, and love of others, a subjective source of morality, and it is the motivational ground of the duty of self-respect. Kant also discusses evaluative self-respect, especially in Critique of Practical Reason (1788) and his Lectures on Ethics (1779), as a combination of noble pride, which is the awareness that we have honored and preserved our dignity by acting in morally worthy ways, and a healthy dose of humility, which is the awareness that we inevitably fall short of the lofty requirements of the moral law. Kant regards well-grounded evaluative self-respect as a subjective motivation to continue striving to do right and be good.
Rawls, by contrast, views self-respect neither as something we are morally required to have and maintain nor as a feeling we necessarily have, but as an entitlement that social institutions are required by justice to support and not undermine. In A Theory of Justice (1971) he argues that self-respect (which he sometimes calls “self-esteem” is a “primary good,” something that rational beings want whatever else they want, because it is vital both to the experienced quality of individual lives and to the ability to carry out or achieve whatever projects or aims an individual might have. It is, moreover, a social good, one that individuals are able to acquire only under certain social and political conditions. Rawls defines self-respect as including “a person’s sense of his own value, his secure conviction that his conception of the good, his plan of life, is worth carrying out,” and it implies “a confidence in one’s ability, so far as it is within one’s power, to fulfill one’s intentions” (Rawls 1971, 440). He argues that individuals’ access to self-respect is to a large degree a function of how the basic institutional structure of a society defines and distributes the social bases of self-respect, which include the messages about the relative worth of citizens that are conveyed in the structure and functioning of institutions, the distribution of fundamental political rights and civil liberties, access to the resources individuals need to pursue their plans of life, the availability of diverse associations and communities within which individuals can seek affirmation of their worth and their plans of life from others, and the norms governing public interaction among citizens. Since self-respect is vital to individual well-being, Rawls argues that justice requires that social institutions and policies be designed to support and not undermine self-respect. Rawls argues that the principles of justice as fairness are superior to utilitarian principles insofar as they better affirm and promote self-respect for all citizens.
Rawls’s view that the ability of individuals to respect themselves is heavily dependent on their social and political circumstances has been echoed by a number of theorists working in moral, social, and political philosophy. For example, Margalit (1996) argues that a decent society is one whose institutions do not humiliate people, that is, give people good reason to consider their self-respect to be injured (but see Bird 2010). Honneth’s theory of social criticism (1995) focuses on the way people’s self-respect and self-identity necessarily depend on the recognition of others and so are vulnerable to being misrecognized or ignored both by social institutions and in interpersonal interactions. Some theorists have used the concept of self-respect to examine the oppression of women, people of color, gays and lesbians, and other groups that are marginalized, stigmatized, or exploited by the dominant culture, identifying the plethora of ways in which oppressive institutions, images, and actions can do damage to the self-respect of members of these groups. Other writers discuss ways that individuals and groups might preserve or restore self-respect in the face of injustice or oppression, and the ways in which the development of self-respect in individuals living under oppression or injustice empowers them to participate in the monumental struggles for justice and liberation (for example, Babbitt 2000, 1993; Bartky 1990a, 1990b, 1990c; Basevich 2022; Boxill 1992, 1976; Boxill and Boxill 2015; Collins 1990; Dillon 2021, 1997, 1995; Diller 2001; Hay 2013, 2011; Holberg 2017; Ikuenobe 2004; Khader 2021; Meyers 1989, 1986; Mohr 1992, 1988; Moody-Adams 1992–93; Seglow 2016; Statman 2002; Thomas 2001b, 1983a, 1978–79; Weber 2016). Some theorists, especially those working within a feminist framework, have argued that the prevailing conceptions of self-respect in Kantian theory or in contemporary liberal societies themselves contain features that reflect objectionable aspects of the dominating culture, and they have attempted to reconceive self-respect in ways that are more conducive to empowerment and emancipation (for example, Borgwald 2012, Dillon 1992c).
In moral philosophy, theorists have also focused on connections between self-respect and various virtues and vices, such as self-trust (Borgwald 2012; Govier 1993), justice (Bloomfield 2011), honesty (Mauri 2011), benevolence (Andrew 2011), humility (Dillon 2020, 2015; Grenberg 2010), self-forgiveness (Dillon 2001; Holmgren 1998; Novitz 1998), self-improvement (Johnson 2011), general immorality (Bagnoli 2009; Bloomfield 2008), and arrogance (Dillon 2022, 2021, 2015, 2007, 2003).
Everyday discourse and practices insist that respect and self-respect are personally, socially, politically, and morally important, and philosophical discussions of the concepts bear this out. Their roles in our lives as individuals, as people living in complex relations with other people and surrounded by a plethora of other beings and things on which our attitudes and actions have tremendous effects, cannot, as these discussions reveal, be taken lightly. The discussions thus far shed light on the nature and significance of the various forms of respect and self-respect and their positions in a nexus of profoundly important but philosophically challenging and contestable concepts. These discussions also reveal that more work remains to be done in clarifying these attitudes and their places among and implications for our concepts and our lives.
Philosophical works chiefly on respect and related concepts
- Addis, A., 1997, “On Human Diversity and the Limits of Toleration,” in Ethnicity and Group Rights (Nomos 39), I. Shapiro and W. Kymlicka (eds.), New York: New York University Press.
- Anderson, E., 1999, “What is the Point of Equality?” Ethics, 109: 287–337.
- –––, 1993, Value in Ethics and Economics, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Andrews, J.N., 1976, “Social Education and Respect for Others,” Journal of Moral Education, 5: 139–143.
- Armitage, F., 2006, “Respect and Types of Injustice,” Res Publica, 12: 9–34.
- Arnold, D.G. and Bowie, N.E., 2005, “Sweatshops and Respect,” Business Ethics Quarterly, 13(2): 221–242.
- Arrington, R. L., 1978, “On Respect,” Journal of Value Inquiry, 12: 1–12.
- Atwell, J.E., 1982, “Kant’s Notion of Respect for Persons,” in Respect for Persons (Tulane Studies in Philosophy, Volume 31), O.H. Green (ed.), New Orleans: Tulane University Press.
- Bagnoli, C., 2021, “Respect and the Dynamics of Finitude,” in Respect: Philosophical Essays, R. Dean and O. Sensen (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2007, “Respect and Membership in the Moral Community,” Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 10: 113–128.
- –––, 2003, “Respect and Loving Attention,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 33: 483–516.
- Baldner, K., 1990, “Realism and Respect,” Between the Species, 6: 1–8.
- Balint, P., 2006, “Respect Relations in Diverse Societies,” Res Publica, 12: 35–57.
- Barilan, M.Y. and Weintraub, M., 2001, “Persuasion as Respect for Persons: An Alternative View of Autonomy and the Limits of Discourse,” Journal of Medicine and Philosophy, 26: 13–33.
- Barnes, A., 1990, “Some Remarks on Respect and Human Rights,” Philosophical Studies, (Ireland): 263–273.
- Baron, M.W., 1997, “Love and Respect in the Doctrine of Virtue,” The Southern Journal of Philosophy, 36 (Supplement): 29–44.
- Beauchamp, T.L. and Childress, J.F., 1979/2001, Principles of Biomedical Ethics, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Beauchamp, T.L. and Walters, L., 1999, Contemporary Issues in Bioethics, 5th edition, Belmont, CA: Wadsworth.
- Bell, M., 2013, Hard Feelings: The Moral Psychology of Contempt, New York: Oxford University Press
- Benditt, T., 2008, “Why Respect Matters,” Journal of Value Inquiry, 42: 487–496.
- Benhabib, S., 1991, Situating the Self, New York: Routledge.
- Benn, S.I., 1988, A Theory of Freedom, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 1971, “Privacy, Freedom, and Respect for Persons,” in Privacy (Nomos 13), J. R. Pennock and J. W. Chapman (eds.), New York: Atherton Press.
- Berger, P., 1983, “On the Obsolescence of the Concept of Honor,” in Revisions: Changing Perspectives in Moral Philosophy, S. Hauerwas and A. MacIntyre (eds.), Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Besch, T.M., 2014, “On Discursive Respect,” Social Theory and Practice, 40: 207–231.
- Birch, T.H., 1993, “Moral Considerability and Universal Consideration,” Environmental Ethics, 15: 313–332.
- Bird, C., forthcoming, Human Dignity and Political Criticism, Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 2010, “Mutual Respect and Civic Education,” Educational Philosophy and Theory, 42: 112–128.
- –––, 2004, “Status, Identity, and Respect,” Political Theory, 32: 207–232.
- Blum, A., 1988, “On Respect,” Philosophical Inquiry, 10: 58–63.
- Boettcher, J., 2007, “Respect, Recognition, and Public Reason,” Social Theory and Practice, 33: 223–249.
- Bognar, G., 2011, “Respect for Nature,” Ethics, Policy, and Environment, 14: 147–149.
- Bognar, G. and S. Kerstein, 2010, “Saving Lives and Respecting Persons,” Journal of Ethics and Social Philosophy, 5 (2): 1–21 [Bognar and Kerstein 2010 available online] doi: 10.26556/jesp.v5i2
- Brannigan, M.C. and Boss, J.A., 2001, Health Care Ethics in a Diverse Society, Mountain View, CA: Mayfield.
- Brannmark, J., 2017, “Respect for Persons in Bioethics: Towards a Human Rights–Based Account,” Human Rights Review, 18: 171–187.
- Bratu, C., 2017, “The Source of Moral Motivation and Actions We Owe to Others: Kant’s Theory of Respect,” in The Roots of Respect: A Historical–Philosophical Itinerary, G. Giorgini and E. Irrera (eds.), Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
- Broadie, A. and Pybus, E.M., 1975, “Kant’s Concept of ‘Respect’,” Kant-Studien, 66: 58–64.
- Brody, B.A., 1982, “Towards a Theory of Respect for Persons,” in Respect for Persons, O.H. Green (ed.), Tulane Studies in Philosophy, Vol. 31, New Orleans: Tulane University Press.
- Bunch, A., 2014, “Throwing Oneself Away: Kant on the Forfeiture of Respect,” Kantian Review, 19: 71–91.
- Buss, S., “Valuing Autonomy and Respecting Persons: Manipulation, Seduction, and the Basis of Moral Constraints,” Ethics, 115: 195–235.
- –––, 1999a, “Appearing Respectful: The Moral Significance of Manners,” Ethics, 109: 795–826.
- –––, 1999b, “Respect for Persons,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 29: 517–550.
- Carter, I., 2013, “Are Toleration and Respect Compatible?” Journal of Applied Philosophy, 30: 195–208.
- –––, 2011, “Respect and the Basis of Equality,” Ethics, 121: 538–571.
- Cary, P., 1996, “Believing the Word: A Proposal about Knowing Other Persons,” Faith and Philosophy, 13: 78–90.
- Chadwick, R., 2017, “Ways of Showing Respect for Life,” Bioethics, 31: 494.
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- –––, 2018, Respect for Human Beings with Intellectual Disabilities,“ in Disability in Practice: Attitudes, Policies, and Relationships, A. Cureton and T.E. Hill, Jr., (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2014, ”Respect Towards Elderly Demented Patients,“ Diametros, 39: 109–124.
- –––, 2013, ”Kant on Duties to Others from Respect,“ in Kant’s Tugendlehre, A. Trampota, O. Sensen, and J. Timmerman (eds.), Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
- –––, 2009, ”Kant’s Conception of Human Dignity,“ Kant-Studien, 100: 309–331.
- Shafer, C.M. and Frye, M., 1977, ”Rape and Respect,“ in Feminism and Philosophy, M. Vetterling-Braggin, F.A. Elliston, and J. English (eds.), Totowa, N.J.: Rowman & Littlefield.
- Sherman, N., 1998a, ”Concrete Kantian Respect,“ Social Philosophy and Policy, 15: 119–148.
- –––, 1998b, ”Empathy, Respect, and Humanitarian Intervention,“ Ethics and International Affairs, 12: 103–119.
- Shields, P.R., 1998, ”Some Reflections on Respecting Childhood,“ Journal of Value Inquiry, 32: 369–380.
- Shockley, K., 2009, ”Practice Dependent Respect,“ Journal of Value Inquiry, 43: 41–54.
- Shostak, S., 2013, ”Respect for Nature: A Theory of Environmental Ethics,“ The European Legacy, 18: 799–800.
- Simpson, E., 1979, ”Objective Reasons and Respect for Persons,“ Monist, 62: 457–469.
- Singleton, J., 2007, ”Kant’s Account of Respect: A Bridge Between Rationality and Anthropology,“ Kantian Review, 12: 40–60.
- Skorupski, J., 2005, ”Blame, Respect, and Recognition: A Reply to Theo Van Willigenberg,“ Utilitas, 17(3): 333–347.
- Smith, D.H., ed., 1984, Respect and Care in Medical Ethics, Lanham, MD: University Press of America.
- Spelman, E.V., 1977, ”On Treating Persons as Persons,“ Ethics, 88: 150–161.
- Spitler, G., 1982, ”Justifying Respect for Nature,“ Environmental Ethics, 4:255–260.
- Stark, C., 2009, ”Respecting Human Dignity: Contract vs. Capabilities,“ Metaphilosophy, 40: 366–381.
- Steinhoff, U., 2015, ”Against Equal Respect and Concern, Equal Rights, and Egalitarian Impartiality,“ in Do All Persons Have Basic Worth? On ”Basic Equality“ and Equal Respect and Concern, U. Steinhoff (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University of Press.
- Stith, R., 2004, ”The Priority of Respect: How Our Common Humanity Can Ground Our Individual Dignity,“ International Philosophical Quarterly, 44(2): 165–184.
- Stohr, K., 2012, On Manners, New York: Routledge.
- Stratton-Lake, P., 2000, Kant, Duty, and Moral Worth, London: Routledge.
- Strauss, M., 2003, ”The Role of Recognition in the Formation of Self-Understanding,“ in Recognition, Responsibility, and Rights, R. N. Fiore and H. L. Nelson (eds.), Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
- Taylor, C., 1992, ”The Politics of Recognition,“ in Multiculturalism and ”The Politics of Recognition,“ A. Gutmann (ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- Taylor, P.W., 1986, Respect for Nature, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
- –––, 1981, ”The Ethics of Respect for Nature,“ Environmental Ethics, 3: 197–218.
- Thomas, L., 2001a, ”Morality, Consistency, and the Self: A Lesson in Rectification,“ Journal of Social Philosophy, 32: 374–381.
- –––, 1992–93, ”Moral Deference,“ The Philosophical Forum, 24: 233–250.
- Thompson, N., 2017, ”Respect in the Ethics of Aristotle,“ in N. Thompson, What Is Honor?, New Haven: Yale University Press.
- Timmons, M. and R. Johnson (eds.), 2015, Reason, Value, and Respect: Kantian Themes From the Philosophy of Thomas E. Hill, Jr., New York: Oxford University Press.
- Tomasi, J., 1995, ”Kymlicka, Liberalism, and Respect for Cultural Minorities,“ Ethics, 105: 580–603.
- Tse, P., 2014, ”Species Egalitarianism and Respect for Nature,“ in Dimensions of Moral Agency, D. Boersema (ed.), Newcastle upon Tyne, U.K.: Cambridge Scholars.
- van Wietmarschen, H., 2021, ”Political Liberalism and Respect,“ Journal of Political Philosophy, 29:353–374.
- Vanhoutte, W.M.A., 2011, ”Human and Non-Human Animals: Equal Rights or Duty,“ Philosophia, 40: 192–211.
- Velleman, J.D., 1999, ”Love as a Moral Emotion,“ Ethics, 109: 338–374.
- Ware, O., 2014, ”Forgiveness and Respect for Persons,“ American Philosophical Quarterly, 51: 247–260.
- Wawrytko, S.A., 1982, ”Confucius and Kant: The Ethics of Respect,“ Philosophy East and West, 32: 237–257.
- Weber, S., 2017, ”Aristotle on Respect for Persons,“ in Roots of Respect: A Historical–Philosophical Itinerary,, G. Giorgini and E. Irrera (eds.), Berlin: Walter de Gruyter.
- Westra, L., 1989, ”‘Respect,’ ‘Dignity,’ and ‘Integrity:’ An Environmental Proposal for Ethics,“ Epistemologia, 12: 91–123.
- Wiggens, D., 2000, ”Nature, Respect for Nature, and the Human Scale of Values,“ Presidential Address, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 100: 1–32.
- Williams, B.A.O., 1962, ”The Idea of Equality,“ in Politics, Philosophy, and Society, vol. 2, P. Laslett and W. G. Runciman (eds.), Oxford: Blackwell.
- Wilson, E., 2009, ”Is Kant’s Concept of Autonomy Absurd?“ History of Philosophy Quarterly, 26: 159–174.
- Wolff, J., 1998, ”Fairness, Respect, and Egalitarian Ethics,“ Philosophy and Public Affairs, 27: 97–122.
- Wong, D., 1984, ”Taoism and the Problem of Equal Respect,“ Journal of Chinese Philosophy, 11: 165–183.
- Wood, A.W., 2010. ”Respect and Recognition,“ in J. Skorupski (ed.), The Routledge Companion to Ethics, London: Routledge.
- ––, 2009, ”Duties to Oneself, Duties of Respect to Others, in The Blackwell Companion to Kant’s Ethics, T.E. Hill, Jr. (ed.), Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.
- ––, 1999, Kant’s Ethical Thought, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 1998, “Kantian Duties Regarding Nonrational Nature,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supp. 72: 189–210.
- Woodruff, P., 2003, “Reverence, Respect, and Dependence,” in Virtues of Independence and Dependence on Virtues, L. Beckman (ed.), New Brunswick: Transactional Press.
- ––, 2001, Reverence: Renewing a Forgotten Virtue, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Young, I.M., 1997, “Asymmetrical Reciprocity: On Moral Respect, Wonder, and Enlarged Thought,” Constellations, 3: 340–363.
- Zinkin, M., 2017, “Kantian Constructivism, Respect, and Moral Depth,” in Realism and Antirealism in Kant’s Moral Philosophy, E.E. Schmidt and R. dos Santos (eds.), Berlin: De Gruyter.
- –––, 2006, “Respect for the Law and the Use of Dynamic Terms in Kant’s Theory of Moral Motivation,” Archiv fur Geschichte der Philosophie, 88: 31–53.
Philosophical works chiefly on self-respect and related concepts
- Adler, M.J., et al., 1952, “Honor,” in The Great Ideas: A Syntopicon of Great Books of the Western World, Chicago: Encyclopedia Britannica, Inc.
- Allen, R.F., 2008, “Free Agency and Self-Esteem,” Sorites, 20: 74–79.
- Andrew, B., 2011, “Self-Respect and Loving Others,” in Sex, Love, and Friendship, A. L. McEvoy (ed.), New York: Rodopi.
- Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, W.D. Ross (trans.), in Basic Works of Aristotle, R. McKeon (ed.), New York: Random House, 1941.
- Babbitt, S., 2000, Artless Integrity: Moral Imagination, Agency, and Stories, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
- –––, 1993, “Feminism and Objective Interests: The Role of Transformation Experiences in Rational Deliberation,” in Feminist Epistemologies, L. Alcoff and E. Potter (eds.), New York: Routledge.
- Balaief, L., 1975, “Self-Esteem and Human Equality,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 36: 25–43.
- Bagnoli, C., 2009, “The Mafioso Case: Autonomy and Self-Respect,” Ethical Theory and Moral Practice, 12: 477–493.
- Bartky, S.L., 1990a, “Feminine Masochism and the Politics of Personal Transformation,” in Bartky, Femininity and Domination: Studies in the Phenomenology of Oppression, New York: Routledge.
- –––, 1990b, “On Psychological Oppression,” Bartky, Femininity and Domination: Studies in the Phenomenology of Oppression, New York: Routledge
- –––, 1990c, “Shame and Gender,” in Bartky, Femininity and Domination: Studies in the Phenomenology of Oppression, New York: Routledge.
- Basevich, E., 2022, “Self-Respect and Self-Segregation: A Du Boisian Challenge to Kant and Rawls,” Social Theory and Practice, 3.
- Baumeister, R.L, L. Smart, and J.M Boden, “Relation of Threatened Egotism to Violence and Aggression: The Dark Side of High Self-Esteem,” Psychological Review, 103: 5–33.
- Becker, L.C., 1992, “Pride,” in Encyclopedia of Ethics, L. C. Becker and C. B. Becker (eds.), New York: Garland Publishing, Inc.
- Bernick, M., 1978, “A Note on Promoting Self-Esteem,” Political Theory, 6: 109–118.
- Bird, C., 2010, “Self-Respect and the Respect of Others,” European Journal of Philosophy, 18: 17–40.
- Bloomfield, P., 2011, “Justice as a Self-Regarding Virtue,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 82: 46–64.
- ––, 2008, “The Harm of Immorality” Ratio, 21: 241–259.
- Borgwald, K., 2012, “Women’s Anger, Epistemic Personhood, and Self-Respect,” Philosophical Studies, 161: 69–76.
- Boxill, B.R., 1992, Blacks and Social Justice, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
- –––, 1976, “Self-Respect and Protest,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 6: 58–69; reprinted in Dignity, Character, and Self-Respect, R.S. Dillon (ed.), New York: Routledge, 1995.
- Boxill, B., and J. Boxill, 2015, “Servility and Self-Respect: An African American and Feminist Critique,” in Reasons, Value, and Respect: Kantian Themes From the Philosophy of Thomas E. Hill, Jr., M. Timmons and R. Johnson (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Bratu, C., 2019–2020, “Self-Respect and the Disrespect of Others,” Ergo, 6 [Bratu 2019–20 available online] doi: 10.3998/ergo.12405314.0006.013.
- Braybrooke, D., 1983, Ethics in the World of Business, Totowa, N.J.: Rowman & Allanheld.
- Campbell, R., 1979, Self-Love and Self-Respect: A Philosophical Study of Egoism, Ottawa: Canadian Library of Philosophy.
- Care, N., 2000, Decent People, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
- Carter, J.A., and E.C. Gordon (eds.), The Moral Psychology of Pride, London: Rowman & Littlefield.
- Champlin, T.S., 1995, “Hanfling on Self-Love,” Philosophy, 70: 107–110.
- Chazan, P., 1998, “Self-Esteem, Self-Respect, and Love of Self: Ways of Valuing the Self,” Philosophia, 26: 41–63.
- Christensen, D., 2007, “Epistemic Self-Respect,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 107: 319–337.
- Collins, P.H., 1990, Black Feminist Thought: Knowledge, Consciousness, and the Politics of Empowerment, New York: Routledge.
- Cunningham, A., 2013, Modern Honor: A Philosophical Defense, New York: Routledge.
- Cureton, A., 2013, “From Self-Respect to Respect for Others,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 94: 166–187.
- Daniels, N., 1975, “Equal Liberty and Unequal Worth of Liberty,” in Reading Rawls: Critical Studies of “A Theory of Justice,” N. Daniels (ed.), New York: Basic Books, Inc.
- Darwall, S.L., 1988, “Self-Deception, Autonomy, and Moral Constitution,” in Perspectives on Self-Deception, B.P. McLaughlin and A.O. Rorty (eds.), Berkeley: University of California Press.
- DeGrazia, D., 1991, “Grounding a Right to Health Care in Self-Respect and Self-Esteem,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 5: 301–318.
- Deigh, J., 1983, “Shame and Self-Esteem: A Critique,” Ethics, 93: 225–245; reprinted in Dignity, Character, and Self-Respect, R.S. Dillon (ed.), New York: Routledge, 1995.
- Diller, A., 2001, “Pride and Self-Respect in Unjust Social Orders,” Philosophy of Education 2001: 308–310.
- Dillon, R. S., forthcoming, “Old-Fashioned Vices in Contemporary Crises, or, It Matters How You Value Yourself,” in Oxford Studies in Normative Ethics, vol 12, M. Timmons (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2021, “Self-Respect, Arrogance, and Power: A Feminist Analysis,” in Respect: Philosophical Essays, R. Dean and O. Sensen (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2020, “Humility and Self-Respect: Kantian and Feminist Perspectives,” in Routledge Handbook on the Philosophy of Humility, M. Alfano, M.P. Lynch, and A. Tanesini (eds.), London and New York: Routledge.
- –––, 2015, “Self-Respect and Humility in Kant and Hill,” in Reason, Value, and Respect: Kantian Themes from the Philosophy of Thomas E. Hill, Jr., M. Timmons and R. Johnson (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2013, “Self-Respect and Self-Esteem,” International Encyclopedia of Ethics, H. LaFollette (ed.), New York: Wiley–Blackwell.
- –––, 2007, “Arrogance, Self-Respect, and Personhood,” Journal of Consciousness Studies, 14: 101–126.
- –––, 2004, “‘What’s a Woman Worth? What’s Life Worth? Without Self-Respect?’: On the Value of Evaluative Self-Respect,” in Moral Psychology: Feminist Ethics and Social Theory, P. DesAutels and M. Walker (eds.), Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
- –––, 2003, “Kant on Arrogance and Self-Respect,” in Setting the Moral Compass: Essays by Women Philosophers, C. Calhoun (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- –––, 2001, “Self-Forgiveness and Self-Respect,” Ethics, 112: 53–83.
- –––, 1997, “Self-Respect: Moral, Emotional, Political,” Ethics, 107: 226–249.
- ––– (ed.), 1995, Dignity, Character, and Self-Respect, New York: Routledge.
- –––, 1992b, “How to Lose Your Self-Respect,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 29: 125–139.
- –––, 1992c, “Toward a Feminist Conception of Self-Respect,” Hypatia, 7: 52–69; reprinted in Dignity, Character, and Self-Respect, R.S. Dillon (ed.), New York: Routledge, 1995.
- Doppelt, G., 2009, “The Place of Self-Respect in a Theory of Justice,” Inquiry, 52: 127–154.
- –––, 1981, “Rawls’s System of Justice: A Critique from the Left,” Noûs, 15: 259–307.
- Elster, J., 1985–86, “Self-Realization in Work and Politics: The Marxist Conception of the Good Life,” Social Philosophy and Policy, 3: 97–126.
- Eyal, N., 2005, “Perhaps the Most Important Primary Good: Self-Respect and Rawls’ Principles of Justice,” Politics, Philosophy, and Economics, 4: 195–215.
- Ezorsky, G., 1991, Racism & Justice: The Case for Affirmative Action, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Falk, W.D., 1986, “Morality, Form, and Content,” in Ought, Reasons, and Morality: The Collected Papers of W. D. Falk, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Feinberg, J., 1970, “The Nature and Value of Rights,” Journal of Value Inquiry, 4: 243–257.
- Ferguson, A., 1987, “A Feminist Aspect Theory of the Self,” in Science, Morality, and Feminist Theory, M. Hanen and K. Nielsen (eds.), Calgary: University of Calgary Press.
- Ferkany, M., 2009, “Recognition, Attachment, and the Social Bases of Self-worth,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 47: 263–283.
- –––, 2008, “The Educational Importance of Self-Esteem,” Journal of Philosophy of Education, 42: 119–132.
- Flanagan, O., 1991, Varieties of Moral Personality: Ethics and Psychological Realism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Friedman, M., 1985, “Moral Integrity and the Deferential Wife,” Philosophical Studies, 47: 141–150.
- Gewirth, A., 1992, “Human Dignity as the Basis of Rights,” in The Constitution of Rights: Human Dignity and American Values, M.J. Meyer and W.A. Parent (eds.), Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- –––, 1978, Reason and Morality, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Govier, T., 1993, “Self-Trust, Autonomy, and Self-Esteem” Hypatia, 8: 99–120.
- Grace, H.A., 1953, “The Self and Self-Acceptance,” Educational Theory, 3: 220–235.
- Grenberg, J., 2010, Kant and the Ethics of Humility, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Gutman, A., 1980, Liberal Equality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Haber, J.G., 1991, Forgiveness, Savage, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
- Hadji Haldar, H., 2009, “The Qu’ranic Principle of Peace,” Journal of Shi’a Islamic Studies, 2: 159–180.
- Hampton, J., 1997, “The Wisdom of the Egoist: The Moral and Political Implications of Valuing the Self,” Social Philosophy and Policy, 14: 21–51.
- –––, 1993, “Selflessness and the Loss of Self,” Social Philosophy and Policy, 10: 135–165.
- Hansberg, O.E., 2000, “The Role of Emotions in Moral Psychology: Shame and Indignation,” Proceedings of the Twentieth World Congress of Philosophy, vol 9: Philosophy of Mind, B. Elevitch (ed.), Bowling Green: Philosophy Documentation Center.
- Harris, G.W., 2001, “Self-Esteem,” in Encyclopedia of Ethics, 2nd edition, L.C. Becker and C.B. Becker (eds.), New York: Garland Publishing, Inc.
- Hay, C., 2013, Kantianism, Liberalism, and Feminism: Resisting Oppression, New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
- –––, 2011, “The Obligation to Resist Oppression,” Journal of Social Philosophy, 42: 21–45.
- Heins, V., 2008, “Realizing Honneth: Redistribution, Recognition, and Global Justice,” Journal of Global Ethics, 4: 141–153.
- Held, V., 1973, “Reasonable Progress and Self-Respect,” The Monist, 57: 12–27.
- Hill, T.E., Jr., 1992, “Self-Respect,” in Encyclopedia of Ethics, L.C. Becker and C.B. Becker (eds.), New York: Garland Publishing, Inc.
- –––, 1991, Autonomy and Self-Respect, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 1986, “Darwall on Practical Reason.” Ethics 96: 604–619.
- –––, 1982, “Self-Respect Reconsidered,” in Respect for Persons, O. H. Green (ed.), Tulane Studies in Philosophy, Vol. 31, New Orleans: Tulane University Press; reprinted in Dignity, Character, and Self-Respect, R.S. Dillon (ed.), New York: Routledge, 1995.
- –––, 1973, “Servility and Self-Respect,” Monist, 57: 12–27; reprinted in Dignity, Character, and Self-Respect, R.S. Dillon (ed.), New York: Routledge, 1995.
- Hoffman, G., 2014, “The Self-Disrespect Objection to Bioenhancement Technologies: A Feminist Analysis of the Complex Relationship between Enhancement and Self-Respect,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 45: 448–521.
- Holberg, E.A., 2017, “Kant, Oppression, and the Possibility of Nonculpable Failures to Respect Oneself,” Southern Journal of Philosophy, 55: 285–305.
- Holroyd, J., 2010, “Substantively Constrained Choice and Deference,” Journal of Moral Philosophy, 7: 180–199.
- Holmgren, M., 1998, “Self-Forgiveness and Responsible Moral Agency,” Journal of Value Inquiry, 32: 75–91.
- Honneth, A., 1995, The Struggle for Recognition: The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts, Cambridge: Polity Press.
- Horsburgh, H.J.N., 1954, “The Plurality of Moral Standards,” Philosophy, 24: 332–346.
- Hudson, S.D., 1986, Human Character and Morality: Reflections from the History of Ideas, Boston: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
- Hume, D., 1751, Enquiries Concerning the Principle of Morals, J.B. Schneewind (ed.), Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1983.
- –––, 1739, A Treatise of Human Nature, L.A. Selby-Bigge (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1971.
- Ikuenobe, P., 2004, “Culture of Racism, Self-Respect, and Blameworthiness,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 18: 27–55.
- Isenberg, A., 1949, “Natural Pride and Natural Shame,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 10: 1–24.
- Johnson, R., 2011, Self-Improvement: An Essay in Kantian Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Kekes, J., 1988, “Shame and Moral Progress,” in Ethical Theory: Character and Virtue, Midwest Studies in Philosophy, vol. 13, P.A. French, T.E. Uehling, and H.K. Wettstein (eds.), Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Kelleher, W., 2009, “Respect and Empathy in the Social Science Writings of Michael Polanyi,” Tradition and Discovery, 35: 8–32.
- Keshen, R., 2017, Reasonable Self-Esteem: A Life of Meaning, Second Edition, Montreal & Kingston: McGill-Queens University Press.
- Khader, S.J., 2021, “Self-Respect under Conditions of Oppression,” in Respect: Philosophical Essays, R. Dean and O. Sensen (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Kramer, M.H., 2017, “On Political Morality and the Conditions of Warranted Self-Respect,” Journal of Ethics, 21: 335–349.
- –––, 2002, Justifying Emotions: Pride and Jealousy, New York: Routledge.
- –––, 1998, “Self-Respect, Megalopsychia, and Moral Education,” Journal of Moral Education, 27: 5–17.
- Kristjansson, K., 2007, “Measuring Self-Respect,” Journal for the Theory of Social Behavior, 37: 225–242.
- Kupfer, J., 1997, “What’s Wrong with Prostitution?” in Explorations in Value, T. Magnal (ed.), Amsterdam: Rodopi.
- –––, 1995, “Prostitutes, Musicians, and Self-Respect,” Journal of Social Philosophy, 26: 75–88.
- LaCaze, M., 2008, “Seeing Oneself Through the Eyes of the Other: Asymmetrical Reciprocity and Self-Respect,” Hypatia, 23: 118–135.
- Lane, R.E., 1982, “Government and Self-Esteem,” Political Theory, 10: 5–31.
- Lomasky, L., 1987, Persons, Rights, and the Moral Community, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Maclaren, E., 1974, “Dignity,” Journal of Medical Ethics, 3: 40–41.
- Margalit, A., 1996, The Decent Society, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- Martin, M.W., 1996, Love’s Virtues, Lawrence, KS: University Press of Kansas.
- –––, 1989, Everyday Morality: An Introduction to Applied Ethics, Belmont, Calif.: Wadsworth.
- –––, 1986, Self-Deception and Morality, Lawrence, KS: University Press of Kansas.
- Massey, S. J., 1983a, “Is Self-Respect a Moral or a Psychological Concept?” Ethics, 93: 246–261; reprinted in Dignity, Character, and Self-Respect, R.S. Dillon (ed.), New York: Routledge, 1995.
- –––, 1983b, “Kant on Self-Respect,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 21: 57–73.
- Mauri, M., 2011, “Self-Respect and Honesty,” Filozofia, 66: 74–82.
- McGary, H., 1988, “Reparations, Self-Respect, and Public Policy,” in Ethical Theory and Society, D. Goldberg (ed.), New York: Holt, Rinehart, & Winston.
- McKinnon, C., 2000, “Exclusion Rules and Self-Respect,” Journal of Value Inquiry, 34: 491–505.
- –––, 1997, “Self-Respect and the Stepford Wives,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 97: 325–330.
- Meyer, M.J., 1992, “Dignity,” in Encyclopedia of Ethics, L.C. Becker and C.B. Becker (eds.), New York: Garland Publishing, Inc.
- –––, 1989, “Dignity, Rights, and Self-Control,” Ethics, 99: 520–534.
- –––, 1987, “Kant’s Conception of Dignity and Modern Political Thought,” History of European Ideas, 8: 319–332.
- Meyer, M.J., and W.A. Parent, eds., 1992, The Constitution of Rights: Human Dignity and American Values, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Meyers, D.T., 1989, Self, Society, and Personal Choice, New York: Columbia University Press; excerpts reprinted in Dignity, Character, Self-Respect, R.S. Dillon (ed.), New York: Routledge, 1995.
- –––, 1987a, “The Socialized Individual and Individual Autonomy,” in Women and Moral Theory, E.F. Kittay and D.T. Meyers (eds.), Totowa, NJ: Rowman and Littlefield.
- –––, 1987b, “Work and Self-Respect,” in Moral Rights in the Workplace, G. Ezorsky (ed.), Albany: State University of New York Press.
- –––, 1986, “The Politics of Self-Respect,” Hypatia, 1: 83–100.
- Michelman, F., 1975, “Constitutional Welfare Rights and A Theory of Justice,” in Reading Rawls: Critical Studies of, A Theory of Justice, N. Daniels (ed.), New York: Basic Books, Inc.
- Middleton, D., 2006, “Three Types of Self-Respect,” Res Publica, 12: 59–76.
- Mohr, R.D., 1992, Gay Ideas: Outings and Other Controversies, Boston: Beacon Press.
- –––, 1988, Gays/Justice: A Study of Ethics, Society, and Law, New York: Columbia University Press.
- Molyneux, D., 2009, “Should Healthcare Professionals Respect Autonomy Just Because it Promotes Welfare?”, Journal of Medical Ethics, 35: 245–250.
- Montefiore, A., 1980, “Self-Reality, Self-Respect, and Respect for Others,” in Studies in Ethical Theory, Midwest Studies in Philosophy, vol. 3, P.A. French, T.E. Uehling, and H.K. Wettstein (eds.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
- Moody-Adams, M.M., 1992–93, “Race, Class, and the Social Construction of Self-Respect,” The Philosophical Forum, 24: 251–266; reprinted in Dignity, Character, and Self-Respect, R.S. Dillon (ed.), New York: Routledge, 1995.
- Morgan, K.P., 1986, “Romantic Love, Altruism, and Self-Respect: An Analysis of Simone de Beauvoir,” Hypatia, 1: 117–148.
- Morris, B., 1946, “The Dignity of Man,” Ethics, 57: 57–64.
- Murphy, J.G., 1982, “Forgiveness and Resentment,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 7: 503–516.
- –––, 1972, “Moral Death: A Kantian Essay on Psychopathy,” Ethics, 82: 284–298.
- Murphy, J.G. and Hampton, J., 1988, Forgiveness and Mercy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Nielsen, K., 1980, “Capitalism, Socialism, and Justice: Reflections on Rawls’s Theory of Justice,” Social Praxis, 7: 253–277.
- Novitz, D., 1998, “Forgiveness and Self-Respect,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 58: 299–315.
- Nozick, R., 1981, Philosophical Explanations, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
- –––, 1974, Anarchy, State, and Utopia, New York: Basis Books.
- Owen, D., 2002, “Equality, Democracy, and Self-Respect: Reflections of Nietzsche’s Agonal Perfectionism,” Journal of Nietzsche Studies, 24: 113–131.
- Parent, W.A., 1992, “Constitutional Values and Human Dignity,” in The Constitution of Rights: Human Dignity and American Values, M.J. Meyer and W.A. Parent (eds.), Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Peters, R.S., 1974, Psychology and Ethical Development, London: George Allen and Unwin.
- Phillips, M., 1987, “Reason, Dignity, and the Formal Conception of Practical Reason,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 24: 191–198.
- Postow, B.C., 1978–79, “Economic Dependence and Self-Respect,” The Philosophical Forum, 10: 181–205.
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