Notes to Rigid Designators

1. Two philosophers alleged to deserve more credit than they have received for their work in support of rigidity are Ruth Marcus and Alvin Plantinga. Marcus' legacy has raised some clamor: the 1990s, especially, saw “a historical controversy over the extent to which the leading elements of Kripke's theory of reference and related doctrines were derived from Marcus” (Garrett, 2005, p. 1600). There is plenty of credit to go around, for the discovery of rigidity's importance, but Marcus does hold the distinction of clearing away by means of formal work important doubts about the necessity of identity statements, and of distinguishing, in this connection, names from descriptions: see the entry intensional logic, §2.4. On Plantinga's early role, see e.g., Davidson (2003, pp. 4, 15).

2. One might expect terms for rigid designators to correspond in the following way: a “strongly” rigid designator would be obstinately rigid, referring to its object in all possible worlds. A “weakly” rigid designator would be one that refers to its object in just those possible worlds in which the object exists. It is plausible to suppose that the question over whether statements like ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’, or perhaps ‘If Hesperus exists then Hesperus = Phosphorus’, are strongly necessary or merely weakly necessary depends on whether ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are “strongly” rigid (obstinate) or merely “weakly” rigid in this sense. However, as Kripke has defined ‘strongly rigid’, ‘Hesperus’ cannot be a “strongly rigid designator”; that distinction is reserved for designators that designate a necessarily existing object (1980, pp. 48-9). Thus, given the truth of a classical tradition according to which God and entities like numbers exist and could not have failed to exist, ‘7’ or ‘God’ are “strongly rigid” in Kripke's sense: this is a special case of obstinate rigidity.

3. Of course there are skeptics who would say “pot-ā-to – pot-ä-to,” just as there are in the alethic parallel case (for a temporally-oriented skeptic, see Miller 2005). Quinn, presented below as a critic of the counterpart reduction, actually nuances his position to make room, in effect, for this idea that there is no ontologically substantive difference expressed by counterpart-talk, as opposed to rigidity-talk: he allows that counterpart-talk could be presented as a mere verbal variant of ordinary speech with rigid designators, in which case “Talk of person-stages” would be “derivative from talk of persons who persist through time” (Quinn 1978, pp. 353–354). But then there is really no point to the awkward rendering of ordinary talk into the stages idiom. Quinn accordingly directs his critical attention, in effect, to a metaphysically substantive interpretation of counterpart-theoretic talk, in criticizing reductive analyses. A further nuance, special to the temporal as opposed to the alethic case, is that Quinn-inspired reservations about verbal camouflage can arise without nonrigidity if ‘you’ is taken as a rigid designator but for a sum of instantaneous parts, with respect to different times within a possible world.

4. Talk about an essence is not as common as talk about the essence, but it can be helpful since many properties apply to you and only you in all possible worlds: see Plantinga 1985, pp. 85-7; 1974, p. 98. Context might select, so that “the” relevant essence can differ, depending on whether the topic is theoretical identity statements, say (see discussion in the main entry), haecceitism or whatnot. Plantinga's definition of an essence is given in the section on Individual Essences in the entry actualism.

5. Brentano, according to one interpretation anyway, maintained in effect that we single out an individual rigidly in our minds by way of grasping the individual's qualitative essence. “To have ideas of distinct individuals,” in a transworld crowd of similar singulars, “the difference between their properties must be present to consciousness,” as Brown puts the idea (2000, p. 34): so in order to explain successful singular thought, Brentano relies upon an “exhaustive definition” that lists qualities distinguishing the object of thought (Brentano, quoted in Brown 2000, p. 35). Compare, by contrast, Plantinga (who is apparently unaware of Brentano's connection with the offending view: 1974, pp. 94-95):

Why should we accept this idea? Suppose we consider an analogous temporal situation. In Herbert Spiegelberg's book The Phenomenological Movement there are pictures of Franz Brentano at the age of 20 and of 70 respectively. The youthful Brentano looks much like Apollo; the elderly Brentano resembles, instead, Jerome Hines in his portrayal of the dying Czar in Boris Godounov. Most of us believe that the same object exists at various distinct times; but do we know of some empirically manifest property P such that a thing is Brentano at a given time t if and only if it has P? Surely not; and this casts no shadow whatever on the intelligibility of our thought and talk about Brentano.

Despite the foregoing quotation and despite Plantinga’s abiding and adamant support for transworld identity, Plantinga seems in later writings to be unexpectedly non-committal with respect to whether individuals last trans-temporally (2011, pp. 66–67). He may favor a split position, insofar as temporal modality is concerned: anyhow, his position seems broadly congenial with such a split (2011, pp. 115, 119). As a dualist, he might hold that persons’ names like ‘Brentano’ are temporally rigid but nevertheless not hold that names for physical objects are also temporarily rigid (e.g., ‘the Empire State Building’, ‘K2’, or the name of a person’s body).

6. Reduction of modal talk to talk about qualitative similarity is one motive for invoking counterpart theory (Russell 2013, p. 88) and if the counterparts construal is offered as a reduction (which is typical) then the serious-counterpart theorist has a natural reply to the charge that her interpretation of modal discourse camouflages a change of meaning. She can reply that any such reduction is going to have to involve some change in meaning in that it clarifies and refines what natural language gropes to express but which natural language in effect manages to express only incompletely or with an admixture of confusion. Therefore if a criticism along the relevant lines is to meet its mark, it has to go so far as to say that counterpart theory fails to distill the message English speakers convey and instead merely replaces it with a message on a decidedly alien subject matter, using the same sentences. Plantinga, of course, goes so far as to say just this. For him, the counterpart theorist has modal opinions “clearly” at odds with those of ordinary speakers, “hopes to remedy the situation by giving the semantical reductive analysis in question,” and so offers a reduction that hides the vast disagreement in opinion (Plantinga 2003, pp. 222–223; cf, by contrast, Stalmaker 2003, p. 186).

Plantinga himself seems doubtful about any reduction of modal talk in terms of what could be expressed nonmodally: in order to explain what he means by saying that objects exist with respect to other possible worlds, say, he quickly appeals to our original modal claims: so “To suppose that Socrates has P in the actual world but lacks it in W is to suppose only that Socrates does in fact have P but would not have had it, had W been actual” (1974, p. 92: emphasis added). Kripke denies that the reduction is possible: “judgments involving directly expressed modal locutions (‘it might have been the case that’) certainly come earlier” than their articulation in terms of possible worlds, and “in practice, no one who cannot understand” these modal locutions properly would understand what it means, say, to exist with respect to other possible worlds (1980, p. 19n). Counterpart theory, on the other hand, promises the possibility of reduction (but does not necessarily force it: Russell 2013, pp. 87–88).

A popular Quinean way of viewing reduction and conceptual change, which would appeal to neither Plantinga nor Kripke but which will worry many readers, threatens to weaken the foregoing position articulated against counterpart theory. According to the Quinean framework, there is no difference in principle between a proper reduction of English modal sentences that preserves the original content or that preserves what is good about the original content or the like, on the one hand, and a change in subject matter that redeploys the original sentences to express alien content, on the other hand. Such a difference could only be a difference in degree, such as that between tall and short, not a difference in kind, such as that between apples and oranges. The foregoing position articulated against counterpart theory could probably be recast in a Quinean framework, albeit with some loss in strength; but there is reason to suppose that reformulation is not needed anyway, because if we accept any rigid designation in the first place, we have thereby already committed ourselves against the Quinean framework. These issues of conceptual change are discussed at length in LaPorte (2004, chaps 5 and 6, especially pp. 164–72).

By blurring the contrast between verbal and substantive differences, Quineans would thereby blur the contrast between serious-counterpart theorists and rigidity theorists. Still other philosophers would blur the contrast between serious-counterpart theorists and rigidity theorists even while maintaining the difference between matters verbal and substantive: hence, it is sometimes suggested that that ontological contrast itself is more verbal than substantive (see, e.g., Sidelle 2002 p. 137). Compare, by contrast, Martí: “any attempt to make rigidity and counterpart theory compatible yields a notion that is, simply put, not the notion of rigidity” (Martí 2003, p. 169; see also Sullivan 2005, pp. 583–587; Torza 2013, pp. 744, 770).

7. Of course, some expressions like ‘α’ may directly refer even if ordinary proper names like ‘Petrarch’ do not: so a descriptivist account of the semantics of ordinary names that designates or “indexes” the world α might not escape whatever problems of direct reference the descriptivist is hoping to circumvent by way of descriptivism. Relatively straightforward descriptivist accounts for the semantics of names that follow the pattern of the α-indexing account cited in the text, for its simplicity, may successfully capture the semantics of certain names; but there are more sophisticated descriptivisms that seem to have better prospects for broad application (for further discussion and references, see LaPorte 2013, chapter 3 §2.4, chapter 8 §2.2). Similarly, there are other common ways to rigidify descriptions besides world-indexing (e.g., one could use an operator like Kaplan's ‘dthat’); and there are also ways other than that of appealing to world-indexing, for motivating the case that structured designators can be rigid de jure, even when the structured designators are clearly not directly referential (or, again, clearly not thoroughly directly referential: and again, for details and references on the different options, the interested reader may turn elsewhere: see LaPorte 2013, p. 63 n.12 and p. 140, respectively).

8. Often an association between causal grounding and rigidity is complicated by a further association between causal grounding and indexicality. Thus, Putnam, for example, calls causally grounded terms “indexical,” because they designate whatever has the underlying essence of samples around the speaker. ‘Water’ and ‘whale’ are supposed to be indexical; ‘hunter’ and ‘bachelor’ are not, since they have analytic definitions. According to Putnam “Kripke's doctrine that natural-kind words are rigid designators and our doctrine that they are indexical are but two ways of making the same point” (1975, p. 234). But these do not really seem to be two ways of making the same point. For further citations and discussion, see LaPorte 2000, §2; 2004, pp. 42-3.

9. Reference is not secured by way of causal grounding in the relevant respect, anyway: by way of ostension to an object in something like a causal baptismal ceremony. It is a different question whether some terms in the reference-fixing description are causally grounded. It is hard to come up with descriptions free from such terms (Stanley 1997a, p. 564; Devitt and Sterelny 1999, p. 60). If there are no such descriptions available, then every rigid designator for a concrete object may be said to be “broadly” causally grounded in the respect that it is either grounded in the primary way by means of ostension to an object in something like a causal baptismal ceremony or it is hooked to a description some terms in which are causally grounded in the primary way. In that case, of course, broad causal grounding is ubiquitous and not specially tied to rigidity: all singular concrete object designators, including non-rigid definite descriptions, are broadly causally grounded.

10. Presumably, the relevant possibilities could not include all metaphysically possible states of affairs: otherwise, it is hard to see how (1) and (4) could share the same content, at least without help from a sophisticated widescopism (Sosa shows how this could help even though there are no modal operators: 2001, pp. 34-5n.7), which is supposed to be a distinct suggestion.

11. Stanley agrees, though he withholds his reasons: 1997b, p. 156.

12. As suggested above, one might maintain a related line that the notion of semantic content, assertion, proposition, and so on must be reevaluated in light of the distinction between assertoric content and ingredient sense: one might say therefore that Kripke is onto one explication and that assertoric content is yet another explication of the unrefined notion semantic content, assertion, proposition, and so on. Something like this position is adopted by Chalmers, who is a pluralist about content (Chalmers 2006a, §1.4; what most interests Chalmers is the division between what is epistemic in Fregean sense and the modal phenomenon of rigidity: 2002, pp. 157-9). Even Dummett might tolerate the above proposal that Kripke is onto one explication of semantic content, assertion, proposition, and so on: he resists a simple yes or no answer to the question whether ‘St. Joachim had a daughter’ expresses the same proposition as ‘the father of Mary had a daughter’: “The word ‘proposition’ is treacherous,” he cautions (p. 48). Stanley (1997b, 132, 140, 155), by contrast, is much less favorably disposed to say that Dummett's distinction could be said to bring to light more than one notion of semantic content, assertion, proposition, and the like.

13. Further, we might hold that the theory of direct reference is merely an empirical theory about natural language, and that even if it is true, there are other possible languages in which a name spelled and pronounced like ‘Petrarch’ is a disguised description meaning the same as ‘the famous humanist most closely associated in α with the Italian Renaissance’. For such a language, rigidity does the work one would expect. So the work, even with respect to names, is independent from the theory of direct reference not only epistemically (for all many philosophers know languages do not conform to the theory of direct reference and rigidity performs its work anyway) but metaphysically (it is metaphysically possible that languages do not conform to the theory of direct reference and rigidity performs its work anyway).

14. Other examples of the necessary a posteriori made famous by Kripke may be accepted by direct reference theorists. Whether these examples owe anything to rigidity may be contested (e.g., when the examples concern kinds). Here it is enough to point out the vicinity and general nature of the complications, which the reader can pursue.

15. Thus, for Chalmers (2006b, §3.1) it is one of just a few “core claims of two-dimensionalism,” as recent authors understand it, that apriority obtains if and only if the primary intension (indicated on the diagonal) is true at all scenarios.

16. There are complications here: if the horizontal intension is a “secondary intension,” in the specific way that Chalmers, for one, understands it, then it is debatable whether the intension is an infallible guide to whether a term is rigid. According to a venerable tradition, there is an omniscient agent x, and it is impossible that either x should have failed to be an omniscient agent or that any being y such that yx should have been an omniscient agent. Something similar can be said for ‘the simplest agent’. This makes ‘the omniscient agent’ and ‘the simplest agent’ rigid designators. However, neither ‘the omniscient agent’ nor ‘the simplest agent’ appears to designate the same thing in all worlds along Chalmers' secondary intension. It would appear that ‘the omniscient agent = the simplest agent’ has a contingently true or false secondary intension, even if tradition is right and the relevant designators are actually rigid. But if tradition is right and these designators are actually rigid, then ‘the omniscient agent = the simplest agent’ is not contingently true or false. Yet even if these complications afflict the specific version of two-dimensionalism at hand, where that two-dimensionalism does successfully capture the status of an identity statement as necessary or contingent, it would appear to owe this to rigidity: the horizontal intension successfully mirrors rigidity or lack thereof in these cases.

17. Does ‘watery stuff’ nonrigidly designate the property or kind H2O, whether horizontally or diagonally, by virtue of applying to stuff that is H2O with respect to some worlds and not others? Or does ‘watery stuff’ rather fail to designate the property H2O at all, though the expression applies to stuff that is H2O, since it fails to apply to stuff that is H2O with respect to some worlds? There is no need here to answer these questions, which gesture toward some of the complications with treating property terms as rigid.

18. Possible replies to a general version of this objection are discussed in § Of course, any or all of those replies might undermine a general statement of the objection while failing to apply to this or that specific version, with its particular context or nuances.

Notes to Supplement: Stipulating Identity Trans-world, Without Qualitative Criteria for a Designatum to Satisfy

1. The problem is powerfully motivated by Augustine (see Matthews for discussion: 2005, pp. 29–30), for example, whose best illustration (‘walking’) reminds us that the problem attends reference to properties and kinds, as well as individuals. Augustine's example underscores the depth of the problem at hand: even if we did know of essential criteria by which to apply a name like yours and indeed even if the criteria were qualitative, similar issues would arise with respect to how we establish reference to the qualities themselves (a point Kripke observes: 1971, p. 148).

Copyright © 2016 by
Joseph LaPorte <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free