Notes to Rigid Designators

1. Two philosophers alleged to deserve more credit than they have received for their work in support of rigidity are Ruth Marcus and Alvin Plantinga. Marcus’ legacy has raised some clamor: the 1990s, especially, saw “a historical controversy over the extent to which the leading elements of Kripke’s theory of reference and related doctrines were derived from Marcus” (Garrett, 2005, p. 1600). There is plenty of credit to go around, for the discovery of rigidity’s importance, but Marcus does hold the distinction of clearing away by means of formal work important doubts about the necessity of identity statements, and of distinguishing, in this connection, names from descriptions: see the entry intensional logic, §2.4. On Plantinga’s early role, see e.g., Davidson (2003, pp. 4, 15).

2. One might expect terms for rigid designators to correspond in the following way: a “strongly” rigid designator would be obstinately rigid, referring to its object in all possible worlds. A “weakly” rigid designator would be one that refers to its object in just those possible worlds in which the object exists. It is plausible to suppose that the question over whether statements like ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’, or perhaps ‘If Hesperus exists then Hesperus = Phosphorus’, are strongly necessary or merely weakly necessary depends on whether ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are “strongly” rigid (obstinate) or merely “weakly” rigid in this sense. However, as Kripke has defined ‘strongly rigid’, ‘Hesperus’ cannot be a “strongly rigid designator”; that distinction is reserved for designators that designate a necessarily existing object (1980, pp. 48-9). Thus, given the truth of a classical tradition according to which God and entities like numbers exist and could not have failed to exist, ‘7’ or ‘God’ are “strongly rigid” in Kripke’s sense: this is a special case of obstinate rigidity.

3. As for whether names are rigid over time or whether a nonrigid counterpart treatment is preferable, there are skeptics who would say “pot-ā-to – pot-ä-to,” just as there are in the alethic parallel case (for a temporally-oriented skeptic, see Miller 2005). Quinn, presented below as a critic of the counterpart reduction, actually nuances his position to make room, in effect, for this idea that there is no ontologically substantive difference expressed by counterpart-talk, as opposed to rigidity-talk: he allows that counterpart-talk could be presented as a mere verbal variant of ordinary speech with rigid designators, in which case “Talk of person-stages” would be “derivative from talk of persons who persist through time” (Quinn 1978, pp. 353–354). But then there is really no point to the awkward rendering of ordinary talk into the stages idiom. Quinn accordingly directs his critical attention, in effect, to a metaphysically substantive interpretation of counterpart-theoretic talk, in criticizing reductive analyses. A further nuance, special to the temporal as opposed to the alethic case, is that Quinn-inspired reservations about verbal camouflage can arise without nonrigidity if ‘you’ is taken as a rigid designator but for a sum of instantaneous parts, with respect to different times within a possible world. I have discussed only one objection to names being rigid over time, but there are others not necessarily committed to instantaneous individuals (e.g., Dranseika, Dagys and Berniūnas 2020).

4. Brentano, according to one interpretation anyway, maintained in effect that we single out an individual rigidly in our minds by way of grasping the individual’s qualitative essence. “To have ideas of distinct individuals,” in a transworld crowd of similar singulars, “the difference between their properties must be present to consciousness,” as Brown puts the idea (2000, p. 34): so in order to explain successful singular thought, Brentano relies upon an “exhaustive definition” that lists qualities distinguishing the object of thought (Brentano, quoted in Brown 2000, p. 35). Compare, by contrast, Plantinga (who is apparently unaware of Brentano’s connection with the offending view!):

Why should we accept this idea? Suppose we consider an analogous temporal situation. In Herbert Spiegelberg’s book The Phenomenological Movement there are pictures of Franz Brentano at the age of 20 and of 70 respectively. The youthful Brentano looks much like Apollo; the elderly Brentano resembles, instead, Jerome Hines in his portrayal of the dying Czar in Boris Godounov. Most of us believe that the same object exists at various distinct times; but do we know of some empirically manifest property P such that a thing is Brentano at a given time t if and only if it has P? Surely not; and this casts no shadow whatever on the intelligibility of our thought and talk about Brentano (Plantinga 1974, pp. 94-95).

Despite the foregoing quotation and despite Plantinga’s abiding and adamant support for transworld identity, Plantinga seems in later writings to be unexpectedly non-committal with respect to whether individuals last trans-temporally (2011, pp. 66–67). He may favor a split position, insofar as temporal modality is concerned: anyhow, his position seems broadly congenial with such a split (2011, pp. 115, 119). As a dualist, he might hold that persons’ names like ‘Brentano’ are temporally rigid but nevertheless not hold that names for physical objects are also temporarily rigid (e.g., ‘the Empire State Building’, ‘K2’, or the name of a person’s body).

5. Reduction of modal talk to talk about qualitative similarity is one motive for invoking counterpart theory (Russell 2013, p. 88) and if the counterparts construal is offered as a reduction (which is typical) then the serious-counterpart theorist has a natural reply to the charge that her interpretation of modal discourse camouflages a change of meaning. She can reply that any such reduction is going to have to involve some change in meaning in that it clarifies and refines what natural language gropes to express but which natural language in effect manages to express only incompletely or with an admixture of confusion. Therefore if a criticism along the relevant lines is to meet its mark, it has to go so far as to say that counterpart theory fails to distill the message English speakers convey and instead merely replaces it with a message on a decidedly alien subject matter, using the same sentences. Plantinga, of course, goes so far as to say just this. For him, the counterpart theorist has modal opinions “clearly” at odds with those of ordinary speakers, “hopes to remedy the situation by giving the semantical reductive analysis in question,” and so offers a reduction that hides the vast disagreement in opinion (Plantinga 2003, pp. 222–223; cf, by contrast, Stalmaker 2003, p. 186).

Plantinga himself seems doubtful about any reduction of modal talk in terms of what could be expressed nonmodally: in order to explain what he means by saying that objects exist with respect to other possible worlds, say, he quickly appeals to our original modal claims: so “To suppose that Socrates has P in the actual world but lacks it in W is to suppose only that Socrates does in fact have P but would not have had it, had W been actual” (1974, p. 92: emphasis added). Kripke denies that the reduction is possible: “judgments involving directly expressed modal locutions (‘it might have been the case that’) certainly come earlier” than their articulation in terms of possible worlds, and “in practice, no one who cannot understand” these modal locutions properly would understand what it means, say, to exist with respect to other possible worlds (1980, p. 19n). Counterpart theory, on the other hand, promises the possibility of reduction (but does not necessarily force it: Russell 2013, pp. 87–88).

A popular Quinean way of viewing reduction and conceptual change, which would appeal to neither Plantinga nor Kripke but which will worry many readers, threatens to weaken the foregoing position articulated against counterpart theory. According to the Quinean framework, there is no difference in principle between a proper reduction of English modal sentences that preserves the original content or that preserves what is good about the original content or the like, on the one hand, and a change in subject matter that redeploys the original sentences to express alien content, on the other hand. Such a difference could only be a difference in degree, such as that between tall and short, not a difference in kind, such as that between apples and oranges. The foregoing position articulated against counterpart theory could probably be recast in a Quinean framework, albeit with some loss in strength; but there is reason to suppose that reformulation is not needed anyway, because if we accept any rigid designation in the first place, we have thereby already committed ourselves against the Quinean framework. These issues of conceptual change are discussed at length in LaPorte (2004, chaps 5 and 6, especially pp. 164–72).

By blurring the contrast between verbal and substantive differences, Quineans would thereby blur the contrast between serious-counterpart theorists and rigidity theorists. Other philosophers would blur the contrast between serious-counterpart theorists and rigidity theorists even while maintaining the difference between matters verbal and substantive: hence, it is sometimes suggested that that ontological contrast itself is more verbal than substantive (see, e.g., Sidelle 2002 p. 137). Compare, by contrast, Martí: “any attempt to make rigidity and counterpart theory compatible yields a notion that is, simply put, not the notion of rigidity” (Martí 2003, p. 169; see also Sullivan 2005, pp. 583–587; Torza 2013, pp. 744, 770).

6. There are other common ways to rigidify (e.g., ‘the actual F’). Descriptions can be rigid as well as non-rigid. Can directly referential designators, too, be rigid or non-rigid? Perhaps they can, at least in theory. Teresa Robertson, for example, maintains “the possibility that a term that is nondescriptional is nonetheless stipulated to work in the following way: it designates Penelope Mackie at the actual world, Saul Kripke at some other possible world, and Hilary Putnam at some still other possible world” (Robertson 2009, p. 135; see also Salmon 1981, p.33n.35). Others controvert this possibility—e.g., Arthur Sullivan: “What I deny is the possibility of an unstructured but nonrigid designator” (Sullivan 2012 p. 37; see also Soames 2002, pp. 264–5; King 2001, p. 311).

7. Often an association between causal grounding and rigidity is complicated by a further association between causal grounding and indexicality. Thus, Putnam, for example, calls causally grounded terms “indexical,” because they designate whatever has the underlying essence of samples around the speaker. ‘Water’ and ‘whale’ are supposed to be indexical; ‘hunter’ and ‘bachelor’ are not, since they have analytic definitions. According to Putnam “Kripke’s doctrine that natural-kind words are rigid designators and our doctrine that they are indexical are but two ways of making the same point” (1975, p. 234). But these do not really seem to be two ways of making the same point. For further citations and discussion, see LaPorte 2000, §2; 2004, pp. 42-3.

8. Reference is not secured by way of causal grounding in the relevant respect, anyway: by way of ostension to an object in something like a causal baptismal ceremony. It is a different question whether some terms in the reference-fixing description are causally grounded. It is hard to come up with descriptions free from such terms (Stanley 1997a, p. 564; Devitt and Sterelny 1999, p. 60). If there are no such descriptions available, then every rigid designator for a concrete object may be said to be “broadly” causally grounded in the respect that it is either grounded in the primary way by means of ostension to an object in something like a causal baptismal ceremony or it is hooked to a description some terms in which are causally grounded in the primary way. In that case, of course, broad causal grounding is ubiquitous and not specially tied to rigidity: all singular concrete object designators, including non-rigid definite descriptions, are broadly causally grounded.

9. Presumably, the relevant possibilities could not include all metaphysically possible states of affairs: otherwise, it is hard to see how (1) and (4) could share the same content, at least without help from a sophisticated widescopism (Sosa shows how this could help even though there are no modal operators: 2001, pp. 34-5n.7), which is supposed to be a distinct suggestion.

10. Stanley agrees, though he withholds his reasons: 1997b, p. 156.

11. As suggested above, one might maintain a related line that the notion of semantic content, assertion, proposition, and so on must be reevaluated in light of the distinction between assertoric content and ingredient sense: one might say therefore that Kripke is onto one explication and that assertoric content is yet another explication of the unrefined notion semantic content, assertion, proposition, and so on. Something like this position is adopted by Chalmers, who is a pluralist about content (Chalmers 2006, §1.4; what most interests Chalmers is the division between what is epistemic in Fregean sense and the modal phenomenon of rigidity: 2002, pp. 157-9). Even Dummett might tolerate the above proposal that Kripke is onto one explication of semantic content, assertion, proposition, and so on: he resists a simple yes or no answer to the question whether ‘St. Joachim had a daughter’ expresses the same proposition as ‘the father of Mary had a daughter’: “The word ‘proposition’ is treacherous,” he cautions (p. 48). Stanley (1997b, 132, 140, 155), by contrast, is much less favorably disposed to say that Dummett’s distinction could be said to bring to light more than one notion of semantic content, assertion, proposition, and the like.

12. Further, we might hold that the theory of direct reference is merely an empirical theory about natural language, and that even if it is true, there are other possible languages in which a name spelled and pronounced like ‘Petrarch’ is a disguised description meaning the same as ‘the famous humanist most closely associated in α with the Italian Renaissance’. For such a language, rigidity does the work one would expect. So the work, even with respect to names, is independent from the theory of direct reference not only epistemically (for all many philosophers know languages do not conform to the theory of direct reference and rigidity performs its work anyway) but metaphysically (it is metaphysically possible that languages do not conform to the theory of direct reference and rigidity performs its work anyway).

13. Other examples of the necessary a posteriori made famous by Kripke may be accepted by direct reference theorists. Whether these examples owe anything to rigidity may be contested (e.g., when the examples concern kinds). Here it is enough to point out the vicinity and general nature of the complications, which the reader can pursue.

Notes to Supplement: Stipulating Identity Trans-world, Without Qualitative Criteria for a Designatum to Satisfy

14. The problem is powerfully motivated by Augustine (see Matthews for discussion: 2005, pp. 29–30), for example, whose best illustration (‘walking’) reminds us that the problem attends reference to properties and kinds, as well as individuals. Augustine’s example underscores the depth of the problem at hand: even if we did know of essential criteria by which to apply a name like yours and indeed even if the criteria were qualitative, similar issues would arise with respect to how we establish reference to the qualities themselves (a point Kripke observes: 1971, p. 148).

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