A rigid designator designates the same object in all possible worlds in which that object exists and never designates anything else. This technical concept in the philosophy of language has critical consequences felt throughout philosophy. In their fullest generality, the consequences are metaphysical and epistemological. Whether a statement’s designators are rigid or non-rigid may determine whether it is necessarily true, necessarily false, or contingent. This metaphysical status is sometimes out of accord with what one would expect given a statement’s apparent epistemological status as a posteriori or a priori. Statements affected include central ones under investigation in philosophical subdisciplines from the philosophy of science to mind to ethics and aesthetics. Hence, much of the discussion in various subdisciplines of philosophy is explicitly or implicitly framed around the distinction between rigid and non-rigid designators.
- 1. A Basic Characterization of Rigid Designation, its Interest, and the Breadth of its Application
- 2. Relations Between Rigidity and Associated Theories
- 2.1 Relations Between Rigidity and Transworld Identity
- 2.2 Relations Between Rigidity and Associated Theories of Reference
- 3. Philosophical Work for Rigidity
- 4. Objections to Rigidity
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. A Basic Characterization of Rigid Designation, its Interest, and the Breadth of its Application
1.1 Names, Ordinary Descriptions, and Identity Statements
Before going into refinements, consider a famous application made by Saul Kripke, who coined the word ‘rigid designator’. Kripke is not the first philosopher to discuss the idea behind the term he coined, but his illuminating discussions have made the importance of rigidity widely appreciated.
Kripke (1980;1971) famously argues that because a rigid designator designates the same object in all possible worlds, an identity statement in which both designators are rigid must be necessarily true if it is true at all, even if the statement is not a priori. His classic example is the identity statement ‘Hesperus is identical with Phosphorus’, which is true, but which was discovered a posteriori to be true. (Let us understand a “statement” to be a sentence under an interpretation; and, following Kripke’s notation in 1971 and elsewhere, let us shorten ‘Hesperus is identical with Phosphorus’ to ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ even though Kripke does not do that in 1980.) ‘Hesperus’ is a name that was given to a heavenly body seen in the evening, and ‘Phosphorus’ is a name that was, unknown to the first users of the name, given to that same heavenly body seen in the morning. The heavenly body is Venus.
One might initially suppose that since the statement ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ was only discovered empirically to be true, it must be contingently true. But, says Kripke, it is necessarily true. The only respect in which it might have turned out false is not metaphysical but epistemic: thus, one could as well say of a geometrical theorem before it is proven that it might or might not turn out to be true or that it might or might not be provable without the parallels postulate. But if it is true and is provable without the parallels postulate, that is a matter of metaphysical necessity. In the same way, if the statement ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is true, that is a matter of metaphysical necessity.
‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true if true at all because ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are proper names for the same object. Like other names, Kripke maintains, they are rigid: each designates just the object it actually designates in all possible worlds in which that object exists, and it designates nothing else in any possible world. The object that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ name in all possible worlds is Venus. Since ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ both name Venus in all possible worlds, and since Venus = Venus in all possible worlds, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is true in all possible worlds.
A description like ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is, on the other hand, not rigid. That explains why the identity statement
(H) ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’
is true but not necessarily true. While Hesperus is in fact the brightest object in the evening sky apart from the moon, Hesperus might have been dimmer: had, say, Hesperus been obscured by cosmic dust, Mars might have been the object designated by ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ rather than Hesperus. In that case, the above identity statement (H) would have been false. So the reason that (H) could have been false is that ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ does not designate Hesperus rigidly. It designates Hesperus in this world, which explains why (H) is true, but this description designates Mars in some other worlds, which explains why (H) could have been false: (H) would have been false had some other such world been actual.
1.2 Standard Clarifications from Kripke
Some potential misunderstandings are well known.
First, a rigid designator is used in a certain way in the actual world. Given that meaning, it designates the same object with respect to all possible worlds, regardless of how this term is used, or not used, in those other possible worlds: for although we identify objects in other worlds by our own names, natives of some of these worlds use other names (Kripke 1980, p. 77; for discussion of objections, see Fitch 2004, pp. 103–4).
Second, although the statement (H) is not necessarily true, it is nevertheless Kripke’s view and the standard view that the object that is in fact the brightest in the evening sky, Venus (Hesperus), is necessarily identical to Hesperus.
Third and finally, ‘Hesperus’ is rigid because it picks out Hesperus in all worlds that contain Hesperus. In worlds not containing Hesperus, the designator fails to name anything other than Hesperus. There is more than one account of a rigid designator that conforms to that requirement (many do: Rami 2019). On one basic account, a rigid designator designates its designatum in every possible world containing the designatum and in other possible worlds the designator fails to designate. In places, Kripke suggests that this is his idea:
When I use the notion of a rigid designator, I do not imply that the object referred to necessarily exists. All I mean is that in any possible world where the object in question does exist, in any situation where the object would exist, we use the designator in question to designate that object. In a situation where the object does not exist, then we should say that the designator has no referent and that the object in question so designated does not exist (Kripke 1971, p. 146; a disclaimer is reported in Kaplan 1989b, p. 570n.8).
In other places, Kripke seems to have in mind another account of rigidity: one according to which a rigid designator designates its object in every possible world, whether or not the designatum exists in that world. Hence, he says, “If you say, ‘suppose Hitler had never been born’ then ‘Hitler’ refers here, still rigidly, to something that would not exist in the counterfactual situation described” (Kripke 1980, p. 78).
It may be that no substantive issues ride on which conception of rigidity is adopted (Stanley 1997a, pp. 557, 566ff.). On the other hand, some philosophers have held that true statements using a proper name to express that so and so might not have existed are unintelligible unless the relevant name refers to the object in all worlds, period. That might provide a substantive reason for favoring the latter type of rigidity (see, e.g., Besson 2009; Gómez-Torrente 2006, p. 250; Plantinga 1985, p. 84; on Plantinga, see also the subsection on “Worlds and Essences” in the entry on actualism), obstinate rigidity, as Salmon calls it (1981, p. 34). Kripke’s quote above hints that obstinate rigidity might afford this kind of advantage. But Kripke never argues for one position or another. Despite occasional slips in favor of one or another refined version of rigidity, he deliberately sidesteps these “delicate issues” when he gives them his full attention (1980, p. 21, n. 21).
There are stronger and weaker brands of necessity corresponding to the possible notions of rigidity. Kripke argues that a sentence like ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is at least “weakly” necessary (1971, p. 137): true in all those possible worlds in which Hesperus exists and Phosphorus exists. The statement may enjoy a stronger necessity, too, which would render it true in all worlds, period. In this entry, “necessity” is to be understood as weak necessity (at least).
1.3 Rigidity for a Diversity of Grammatical Categories
Rigidity is most straightforwardly applied to proper names of concrete objects. There is general agreement that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Biden’ refer rigidly. The debate about which expressions in natural languages are rigid designators is typically set up with a background assumption that proper names are singular terms. This assumption is challenged by predicative accounts of names (think of ‘every Biden’: Fara 2015). Whether such alternatives can “explain why names are rigid” (Lee 2020, p. 253; Schoubye 2018), perhaps in recognizing singular reference or denotation for some uses of names tacitly equivalent to demonstratives or definite descriptions (categories discussed below), remains a matter of controversy.
Rigidity is applied commonly to indexicals, like ‘now’ or ‘you’, as well as names. If, when I use ‘you’ in a context, my utterance means something like the person at the door (Nunberg 1993; Smith 1989 §5), then presumably it is not rigid. You may be at the door, but in another possible world it is another philosopher who comes visiting. On the other hand, if (as Kaplan proposes: 1989a) ‘you’ refers directly to an individual, without amounting to a disguised description meaning the same as a description like ‘the person at the door’, then it would seem to be rigid. So if I say, pleasantly surprised, “You made good time,” we could discuss reasons for this and conditions under which this might not have been the case, but in all of our considerations the same individual, and not anyone else who might have been at my door in good time or not, is the one in question. The individual in question is the one who is in fact identical to you (as any account could put it). After Kaplan, indexicals have typically been treated as rigid; but there seem to be nonrigid uses.
Demonstratives such as ‘that’ raise similar issues as indexicals. So also do noun phrases like ‘that flower you just picked’ (see King 2001, chap 2, for discussion). As Wolter (2009, p. 457) observes, “there is not yet consensus” about which such expressions “allow non-rigid interpretations and which do not,” but it is standard to hold some to be rigid (Nowak 2019).
The paradigm example of non-rigid designators, since the work of of Kripke, has been definite descriptions like ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’. However, some definite descriptions, such as ‘the successor of 2’, are rigid designators; their rigidity seems to arise in virtue of facts about metaphysical reality, in this case, the necessity of mathematical facts, rather than facts about the semantic properties of expressions. Such definite descriptions are therefore “de facto” rigid designators. The Russellian view that definite descriptions are quantified expressions is also widely held. Since it is natural to think of rigidity but not, in view of Russell, to think of definite descriptions in connection with singularity, the question dawns of how to think about rigidity with categories of expressions other than singular terms. This broad topic, which surfaces in other connections too, has received much discussion in recent years.
Another category of terms whose singular status raises questions is that of natural kind terms like ‘gold’ and ‘water’. Again, these seem widely to be thought singular at least some of the time. They are frequently counted as rigid. Other related and again apparently singular terms that are sometimes counted rigid include ‘redness’ and ‘loudness’. More controversial are singular terms for properties that are more artificial: ‘bachelorhood’, or ‘soda pop’. Not just singular terms but also general terms, like ‘tiger’, ‘hot’, and ‘red’ are often recognized as rigid (following Kripke’s suggestion: 1980, p. 134). These terms raise complications not present for singular terms. I discuss kind and property terms toward the end of this entry.
Terms from other grammatical categories, as well, might admit a rigid/non-rigid distinction (for the broadest account of rigidity available, see Haze 2021). Philosophers have attended relatively little to the status of verbs and adverbs, in this connection (but see, e.g., López de Sa 2008). Compare ‘to begin writing’, ‘to commence writing’, and ‘to do what the teacher commanded at time t’ (where the command was, “Begin writing”). Evidently, the necessity of ‘One is about to begin writing if and only if one is about to commence writing’ is not enjoyed by ‘One is about to begin writing if and only if one is about to do what the teacher commanded at time t’. Arguably, the reason for the modal differences has to do with the rigidity or non-rigidity, in some appropriately extended sense, of the contained verbs. Something similar applies to adverbs. Compare ‘She ran quickly’ with ‘She ran in the manner signaled by her coach’ (where the signal means: Run quickly!).
1.4 Rigidity for Temporal and other Non-Alethic Modal Talk
Just as rigidity might have bearing on different grammatical categories, not merely the paradigms to which Kripke applies it, rigidity might also have bearing on different modalities. For example, just as ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ seems to designate Venus with respect to the actual world but not with respect to other possible worlds in which Venus is obscured by some other body like Mars, just so the expression seems to designate Venus with respect to the present time but not with respect to other times at which Venus is obscured by some other body. By contrast, ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ seem to designate Venus with respect to all times. (For cautions about the analogy, see Gómez-Torrente 2006, p. 249.) Therefore, again, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ seems to be true regardless of the time of utterance; ‘Hesperus = the brightest nonlunar body in the evening sky’, on the other hand, is false when uttered as a passing comet outshines Venus.
Whether we are talking about alethic rigidity (designation of the same individual with respect to other possible worlds) or temporal rigidity (designation of the same individual with respect to other times), a commitment to rigidity will be attended by similar sorts of metaphysical and epistemic commitments. Here it will do to indicate briefly some ontological commitments. Just as recognition of alethically rigid designation carries with it a commitment to some sort of transworld identity (discussed later), so the recognition of temporally rigid designation carries with it a commitment to some sort of “transtime” or transtemporal identity. Similar alternatives to rigidity are available to theorists who oppose rigidity. Hence, if we adopt the ontological position that individuals are instantaneous so that we find it natural to think in terms of the “stages” of you since, although the stages are not identical, they’re similar and ordered in relation to one another spatiotemporally or causally, then we might naturally take names like yours to range over different instantaneously-lasting individuals, and so conclude with Varzi (2003, p. 387), that “the rigidity claim can’t be right and a counterpart-theoretic semantics seems required.”
Familiar, broadly applicable reservations about the reduction of modal talk to counterparts talk arise in their turn: namely reservations according to which ordinary speakers’ accurate talk of a future and a past for you uses ‘you’ and your name rigidly since ordinary speakers presuppose or assert that something in the past and something in the future is identical to you. The counterpart substitute, it will be said, is either a misdiagnosis or a tacit concession to the falsity of ordinary claims and a masking over of that falsity by means of a so-called reductive analysis. Quinn, for example, anticipates the dilemma, maintaining that identity through time is what is needed to honor claims to an individual’s lasting through a day, and maintaining further that if we conclude that we don’t really last over time, and decide anyway that “it would be convenient to speak” in some counterpart-reductive fashion in order to be able still to assent when ordinary speakers innocently say ‘You were around yesterday and will probably be around tomorrow’, then we end up masking our disagreement with what ordinary speakers literally claim (1978, p. 348). Metaphysical positions of great consequence are thereby concealed: ‘you’ll be around tomorrow’ is now, according to the newly proposed reductive reading, to be accepted on the liberal terms that tomorrow there is a line of “momentary creatures endowed with similar properties,” none of whom is really you. But were a reductionist to affirm correctly the usual sentence, now eviscerated of the usual content, the affirmation should bring you “no comfort at all” (1978, p. 350; see also p. 347). The hope is that you yourself are around tomorrow; if others are around too, that might be good, but it is not enough to satisfy your hope. (So we would put it if we believed in the reality of different times. More neutrally, we might put the point as follows. When we conceive of tomorrow, you’re part of what we’re conceiving as present, hopefully; if others are around too, that is irrelevant to this hope.) Since the sentence ‘you’ll be around tomorrow’ on its original interpretation expresses comfortingly that your hope is to be realized, and since the reductive assent does not, the reductive assent hardly ends up conveying the appropriate opinion about what ordinary speakers are talking about.
Kripke presents rigidity first as an alethic notion but there is also a temporal interpretation, as we’ve seen. There are other interpretations too, which is not surprising if rigidity is fundamental to all our modal talk: and it seems reasonable to say, with Føllesdal, that it is. “All our talk about change, about causation, ethics and knowledge and belief, as well as about the other modalities, presupposes that we can keep our singular terms referring to the same objects. To the extent that we fail, these notions become incoherent” (Føllesdal 1986, p. 111).
Furthermore, a term might rigidly designate under one interpretation of rigidity but non-rigidly designate under a different interpretation of rigidity: thus, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is apparently not epistemically necessary, even though it seems alethically and temporally necessary. Accordingly, ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ are plausibly thought not to be epistemically rigid, in which case, as Fitting and Mendelsohn (1998, p. 219) observe, “it is hard to see whether there are any rigid designators under the epistemic reading.” A counterpart construal (see below) might be offered more plausibly for epistemic possibility than for temporal or alethic possibility, as Kripke himself sometimes suggests (Rabern 2018, pp. 12–13): when we say that Hesperus might for all we know have turned out not to be Phosphorus, we seem to have in mind a possible world in which something else—a counterpart—is present in the morning or evening, not Hesperus (Phosphorus). This entry will address an alethic interpretation of rigidity for the most part.
2. Relations Between Rigidity and Associated Theories
2.1 Relations Between Rigidity and Transworld Identity
A rigid designator designates by picking out its designatum not just with respect to the actual world—as things are—but with respect to all other possible worlds in which it is present, as well. That a proper name like your name is rigid by way of picking out its same designatum (you) with respect to possible worlds or situations different than those actually obtaining, though that claim is not without detractors, is a claim that enjoys great appeal. Call the relevant claim “transworld identity.” The claim is associated with a host of others that might enjoy much less appeal. Many such claims turn out to be separable from rigidity. Nevertheless, transworld identity remains a substantive commitment of rigidity, at least as classically understood.
2.1.1 Questionable Controversy
The commitment to transworld identity should not be confused with a commitment to realism about possible worlds. Prominent champions of rigidity seem favorably inclined to realism (see Davidson’s 2003 collection of Plantinga’s essays; see also Kripke 1980, p. 16). But there is no reason an instrumentalist about possible worlds like Bas Van Fraassen, say, who regards possible-worlds talk as a useful fiction, cannot appeal to rigidity (as Van Fraassen does: 1984). What matters for the position that a designator for an individual x is a rigid designator, is that in using that designator to entertain the various counterfactual situations or worlds S in which x exists, whether we do the counterfactual entertaining about x by way of apprehending abstracta, say (if worlds are real objects, abstract ones), or by way of pretending (if counterfactual talk is a fictional pretense, say, because worlds are not real) or whatnot, we entertain situations (or pretend to do so) that, were they to obtain, would contain x: so we tacitly commit to “the impossibility that S obtain and x fail to exist” (Plantinga 1974, p. 96). Accordingly, suppose I say to you, “If you’d driven to the park instead of walked, you’d have missed the refreshing breeze.” Here I entertain a nonfactual possibility associated with your driving to the park. Whom, in that entertained possibility, do we think of and speak of, as driving and not walking? The transworld-identity theorist says: you. No one else “gets into the act” as the driver according to the transworld-identity theorist (as Lewis would frame that view, without sympathy: 1986, p. 196).
Realism about worlds, then, is not something rigidity or transworld identity comes attached to; non-realists have their version.
How about essentialism? Whether we want to say that rigidity or transworld identity is committed on that score might well depend on the form of essentialism in question. Not many philosophers would dispute Cartwright’s observation that “‘Shakespeare’ is rigid only if the man Shakespeare could not have existed without being Shakespeare—or as we might equally well say, only if it is essential to Shakespeare that he is Shakespeare” (Cartwright 1998, p. 69). So if Shakespeare could have been Biden instead of Shakespeare, ‘Shakespeare’ would not be rigid.
But even if appeals to the rigidity of a name like ‘Shakespeare’ (or related appeals to the transworld identity of Shakespeare) cannot be divorced from essentialist commitments like the forgoing, such appeals will not commit us to much at all about what a designatum is essentially like with respect to the various possible worlds in which it exists to serve as the designatum: whether Shakespeare could have been a brute, say, or had different parents (matters over which Kripke tellingly disagrees with, say, Plantinga: Kripke 1980, pp. 110ff; Plantinga 1974, pp. 65ff).
It is far from clear then, that transworld identity and the rigidity that depends on it come attached to substantive essentialism of a sort that settles salient disputes in philosophy about which of your properties are essential to you. Closely related to the issue of substantive essences is the issue of substantive criteria, perhaps qualitative criteria. Such concerns, as developed in a metaphysical direction, will be addressed in connection with counterpart theory and transworld identity; here let us move in an epistemological direction in order to address concerns about what we might call transworld “identification.”
Kripke addresses the objection that we cannot meaningfully talk about you, with respect to another possible world, without first having some qualitative criterion of identity, some qualitatively distinguishing mark that allows us to pick you out from other objects in the world at issue, in order to assign your name to the right person, i.e., to you, as the individual that satisfies the qualitative criterion. This criterion would appeal to your essence (or be “an essence”: see Plantinga 1985, pp. 85–7; 1974, p. 98; recall, for this example, the minimal requirements of weak necessity), in the minimal respect that the criterion must be something that you and you alone have with respect to any given possible world. As an objection, the worry is that we know of no such qualitative criterion so we can not meaningfully discuss you, with respect to any merely possible world.
One way to defend rigid designation in view of the forgoing objection would be to insist that as successful speakers, we do after all know of qualitative criteria by which we are able to distinguish individuals like you by name: some historical figures have in effect adopted this position, thereby defending rigid designation. But Kripke would concede that we speakers are not privy to the content of any qualitative criterion characterizing you. It is hard to gainsay the concession. We would certainly be hard-pressed to say in any enlightening way just what qualities characterize you with respect to the various possible worlds. Kripke would evidently agree that there is something that it is to amount to you, as opposed to anything else, and that your essence is what qualifies an object—you—to be the designatum of your name with respect to any possible world (he doesn’t say that your essence is qualitative though, and he outright rejects certain versions of that claim). But Kripke would deny that a speaker would have to know this essence, or to rely upon any other nontrivial criteria distinguishing you from world to world, in order to refer to you by way of a rigid designator (Kripke 1980, pp. 15–20; see also Plantinga 1974, pp. 93–98).
Still, we can imagine why others have demurred. After all, if we lack the ability to say in an informative way just what it is to amount to you, as opposed to anyone else, with respect to counterfactual situations, then how can we as speakers know enough of what we’re talking about in order to select you as the designatum, as opposed to anyone else, with respect to counterfactual situations? How can we know that you, no other, are the subject of our thought and talk? We certainly cannot define your name rigidly by means of essence-invoking criteria if we don’t know such criteria.
In response, Kripke (1980, p. 44; see also Plantinga 1974, p. 97) insists that we may give a satisfactory account of how we designate you, trans-world, without giving a satisfying account of your essence or of criteria distinguishing you. Whatever the content of your essence, we may simply stipulate that the bearer of your name is to be you when we consider other possible worlds in which you do different things than those that you in fact do. Accordingly, we may take for granted that you are the protagonist of the different actions at those different worlds, despite our not thinking about what your essence is.
There is something sensible about this suggestion. It seems sensible to suppose that ordinary speakers do something like stipulate: a speaker might naturally insist, “I’m thinking of you driving instead of walking, not someone like you.” We take the success of this stipulation for granted, at least for many purposes, in many contexts.
Even so, the appeal to stipulation is more like a promissory note than the satisfaction of an explanatory obligation. The appeal to stipulation puts off for another occasion any attempt to resolve how we succeed at doing what we take for granted that we manage somehow to do: namely, how we succeed at referring to the right individual, by means of our stipulative effort. There has to be some “reason the stipulated situation, when we use a name, contains the object it does” (Sidelle 1995, p. 99n.4) rather than likely competitors. It is hardly obvious what that reason would be. To see why, consider that in order successfully to stipulate that a name is to follow just you, as a rigid and therefore transworld tracking device, our stipulative effort has to be able, across worlds, to allow us to distinguish what is you from what is not you but is instead your body (say: assume you are not your body). How is this to be done without specifying criteria, if you were with your body when your parents smiled in your direction and baptized you with a rigid designator, saying “We have decided on a name for the birth certificate: …,” thereby stipulating that you are to be called by the name they chose for you? “It is not by magic,” as Jackson (1998, p. 82) reminds us, that your name “picks out what it does pick out” rigidly—namely you—despite the competition against you presented by a different candidate for designation—your copresent body.
So how does it happen that the stipulative effort attaches your name to you and not competitors? According to a Lockean line of thinking, the indispensability of criteria becomes clear when we consider that question; stipulation is no substitute for criteria. Unless speakers have essential criteria in mind to demarcate the real referent—you, in this instance—from alternative candidates like your body, the speaker would stipulate a rigid designator in vain: his names would turn out, disappointingly, to be “the Signs of he knows not what, which is in Truth to be the Signs of nothing” (Locke, Essay III.ii.2, p. 406). On this line of thinking, a stipulation leaves too much indeterminacy to secure the right rigidity. To insist that the right designatum is secured without criteria seems, according to this line of thinking, to insist on stipulation getting it right by magic.
So there is more to be said about transworld criteria, even if an appeal to stipulation is all right so far as it goes. But because the relevant contributions to the discussion become scattered and elliptic, a supplementary document is handy for elaboration:
Stipulating Identity Trans-world, Without Qualitative Criteria for a Designatum to Satisfy
2.1.2 Residual Metaphysical Controversy
It is not obvious that rigidity and its attending transworld identity run up against anti-realism, nor against any substantive essentialism or its gainsayers, nor against the intuition that there must be some way to assign reference that avoids (perhaps by way of qualitative criteria) the charge according to which the relation between rigid designator and designatum comes by magic. But rigidity and its attending transworld identity do run into genuine conflict with certain metaphysical positions about what we’re talking about when we engage in counterfactual talk. The most prominent alternative to the commitment construes modal discourse about you in terms of counterparts of you who are not you and who act in your stead at other possible worlds. Thus, for David Lewis and fellow counterpart theorists, what matters to whether you might have driven instead of walked is indeed whether, in other possible worlds, someone other than you—but sufficiently similar qualitatively to you—drives instead of walks. So for Lewis, you don’t have an important role, or indeed any role, among the players of the driving-as-opposed-to-walking worlds: and your qualities do. You are altogether absent from any world we entertain in considering the driving scenario as a scenario that you might have opted for, and in considering such a scenario we are not entertaining a thought about you as the protagonist. Let us call this proposal concerning counterfactual talk “serious counterpart theory” (following Russell 2013, p. 87).
The proposal that it is not you yourself but similar “counterparts” to you, who are relevant in this way to what you yourself might have done, is unappealing at face value: intuitively, as Noonan says, a claim about what you opted not to do but certainly “might have done hardly seems, at first sight, to be correctly interpretable as a claim about what someone else (however similar…) does in another possible world” (§6 of the entry on identity: this is a cleaned-up version of the so-called “Humphrey objection”: Kripke 1980, p. 45n.13; 1971, p. 148; cf. Lewis’ replies to the Humphrey objection as originally cast: Lewis 1986, p. 196).
Indeed, one might go further by way of objections to the counterpart-construal of modal discourse, as Plantinga and Salmon do. Plantinga argues at length that the counterpart theorist’s mistake is not really to misinterpret ‘you might have driven’, by offering an erroneous analysis of what makes it true; rather, the counterpart theorist’s mistake is two-fold: the first mistake is to reject what ordinary speakers are saying by ‘you might have driven’, and the second mistake (a deviation from prudence) is to conceal the disagreement. The concealment is effected by assigning to the very same sentence used by ordinary speakers, ‘you might have driven’, an alien interpretation that the (serious) counterpart theorist can endorse, rather than the interpretation that would in fact be faithful to what the ordinary speakers are really saying. The new counterpart-involving interpretation renders reinterpreted sentences, no longer English, agreeable or offensive to the metaphysical commitments of a counterpart theorist pretty much when the respective English sentence does likewise for English speakers. In this way, the counterpart theorist can affirm and reject the usual modal sentences of English, understanding them differently though: so the counterpart theorist maintains the deceptive appearance of agreement with ordinary speakers by means of “a verbal camouflage,” as Salmon agrees (Salmon 1981, p. 236; cf. Stalnaker 2003, pp. 118ff.).
For her part, the counterparts-invoking theorist might emphasize the desirability of reduction. Or she might point to other desiderada: for another likely example, she might wish to maintain contingency where rigidity commits us to necessity (Gibbard 1975, p. 188; Lewis 1986, p. 256; Delia Graff Fara joins many others in counting this as “the main benefit” of a counterpart construal: 2008, p. 186). One might turn to counterpart theory for relief from vagueness, since whether an object essentially has any given property can be a vague question; on the other hand, so too can the “question whether an object actually has a certain property,”as Kripke suggests (1980, p.115n.57). There are other motives.
The issues at stake between serious counterpart theory and transworld identity become complex quickly. The tangle of considerations can be more formally motivated than are the intuitive considerations already canvassed. Your theory might force unwelcome baroqueness in expression, when formalized (Linsky and Zalta 1996; Williamson 2000; 2002). Worse, you might find that you cannot even say in the preferred formal language what you want, intuitively, to say: e.g., “There could have been things that do not actually exist” (Russell discusses the history of this example: 2013, p. 485).
If its defenders are right, then counterpart theory can express all that anyone wants to express—even what transworld identity theorists want to express (Bacon forthcoming; Russell 2013). If so, then such qualms about formal resources need not divide serious-counterpart theorists from transworld identity theorists (and similarly for transtime identity theorists like Quinn 1978 (Meyer 2013)). But that would not reduce any divisiveness in the foregoing intuitive metaphysical considerations (these are the considerations that “must always play a dominant role,” too, according to Kripkean methodology anyway: 1976, p. 411).
2.2 Relations Between Rigidity and Associated Theories of Reference
Rigidity is generally discussed in the literature in connection with several theories about reference that were introduced or reintroduced or discussed feverishly about the time Kripke called attention to rigid designation. These theories address either the question of what it is that designating terms say or express or contribute to the content of propositions that they are used to articulate, or the question how it is that designating terms come to say or express or contribute the content they do. The relationship between rigidity and these other theories of reference, which is often blurred in the literature, can be brought into focus in a way that is fairly uncontroversial, in many instances.
2.2.1 Direct Reference
About the time Kripke named rigidity, Kaplan named the theory of “direct reference” (in “Demonstratives,” eventually published as 1989a: see 1989b, p. 571). As the theory is usually understood, it is the position that the semantic content of a name or other directly referring expression is nothing more than the referent: the referent is all that the name contributes to a proposition expressed by a sentence containing it. So there is no descriptive information semantically conveyed by a directly referring expression. If we think of propositions as “structured entities looking something like the sentences which express them,” as Kaplan invites us to do, we can think of directly referring terms as terms whose contribution to a proposition lacks the structure that characterizes the contribution of definite descriptions. In the case of a definite description, “the constituent of the proposition will be some sort of complex, constructed from various attributes by logical composition. But in the case of a singular term which is directly referential, the constituent of the proposition is just the object itself” (Kaplan 1989a, p. 494; see also the section relating possible worlds and structured propositions in the entry on structured propositions).
Direct reference theorists (e.g., Soames 2002, pp. 240, 243), also called “Millians” after J. S. Mill, insist that ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ and ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’ express the same proposition or share the same content. At first glance, these statements appear to say different things, but if ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ contribute no descriptive information (like is a morning star or is an evening star) to the proposition expressed by either sentence, but only the referent, which is the same for each term, then the sentences have to say the same thing despite first appearances.
It is generally acknowledged that rigidity cannot be identified with direct reference. That is because some expressions designate rigidly by means of describing the designatum: e.g., ‘The successor of 2’, which rigidly designates 3. Kripke calls designators like ‘The successor of 2’ rigid de facto, rather than rigid de jure: the description happens to be satisfied by the same object in every possible world and never anything else. Compare the intuitively distinct case of de jure rigidity in a name, like ‘Biden’. Here the intent is to refer to this person in all possible worlds, whatever descriptions may designate him. Still, not all rigid de jure expressions seem to be directly referential (as some direct reference theorists agree: e.g., Kaplan 1989b, p. 577n.25; cf. Salmon 2003, pp. 486–7; see also Stanley’s 1997a discussion: 570–1). An example of a description that is rigid de jure might be ‘The famous humanist most closely associated, in α, with the Italian Renaissance’, where ‘α’ is a name for the actual world (on world-indexing, see Plantinga 1974, pp. 62–65), or a similar actualized description. The designatum must first be picked out in α by whether it meets the descriptive requirements (with or without the indexing) there in α: but the purpose of the indexing is to keep the term referring, with respect to other worlds, to that same item picked out originally in α by virtue of meeting the right requirements there. So the rigidity seems de jure.
Descriptivists claim that names are disguised descriptions: perhaps a rigidified description like the foregoing captures that content of ‘Petrarch’. Direct reference theorists deny that names have descriptive content like this. Either way, the rigidity of names and even de jure rigidity of names could plausibly be honored (as opponents of direct reference hold, such as Plantinga 1985, pp. 82–7; Sidelle 1992; 1995; Justice 2003; the same goes for hybid views as well as the polar views discussed: Garcia-Carpintero 2018).
2.2.2 Causal Grounding
Another theory of reference that was named about the time ‘rigid designator’ was coined, and that is widely associated with rigid designation, is the causal theory of reference. All that is relevant here is one method of term dubbing associated with that theory. According to a typical causal theorist, many terms are coined in a “baptismal ceremony,” during which the dubber points at an object in her perceptual field (hence, the object’s causal role), and establishes reference by appeal to this object. The baptismal object might become the referent, if the term’s coiner says something to this effect: “Term t is to be used for that object.” The baptismal object might also be a sample of a substance that becomes the referent, if the term’s coiner says something to this effect: “Term t is to be used for the substance instantiated by that object.” Or the object might have some other connection to the referent, as might happen if the term’s coiner says something to this effect: “Term t is to be used for the ceremonial function of that ancient artifact,” or “Term t is to be used for the leader of that wolf pack.” Most of these examples involve a definite description, which is used to “fix the reference” (Kripke 1980, pp. 54–6, 135), and not as a synonym: the term is to apply to the designatum even with respect worlds in which it does not satisfy the description. In all of these examples, whether the relevant term designates in a given instance depends on the properties of the object used to ground reference in the baptismal ceremony. The relevant properties may not be known to the term’s coiner.
Some philosophers seem to think that rigid terms are just those coined in accordance with a baptism like the above. But causal grounding is not closely tied to rigidity. Since many philosophers deny that rigidity applies to designators for kinds (see below), designators for other entities serve better to illustrate. First, designators that are rigid can fail to be causally grounded. ‘The successor of 2’, which is rigid de facto, may be a case in point. ‘3’ might be an example of a rigid de jure term that is not causally grounded. And there can evidently be terms for concrete objects that are rigid but not causally grounded. You coin ‘Joy’ in the following way: “‘Joy’ is to be used for the most joy-filled individual.” Here you use the description to fix the reference, not as a synonym: whatever individual is most filled with joy is the designatum, even when we are discussing worlds in which that same individual is glum. Reference is not secured by way of causal grounding; you never point to anything in a baptismal ceremony. Yet the designator is rigid.
So designators that are rigid might fail to be causally grounded. Designators that are causally grounded might also fail to be rigid. You find an old painting. After engaging in some convoluted discussion about legal ownership, you decide to clarify your terms: “Let the expression ‘Originalowner’ designate, for any possible world w, the original owner in w of that painting” (you point at the painting). You have causally grounded ‘Originalowner’ by means of a baptismal ceremony; but the referent varies from world to world, depending on who first owned the painting. The term is not rigid.
The rigidity of names does not rule out descriptivism. As we’ve seen, disguised descriptions may be world-indexed or otherwise rigidified. The present section discusses strategies for maintaining descriptivism according to which a name like ‘Petrarch’ has the same content as ordinary nonrigid descriptions like ‘The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance’.
188.8.131.52 Names as Wide-Scope Descriptions
One proposal to defend traditional, non-world-indexed descriptivism has taken the label “widescopism.” According to this proposal, the rigidity of names is or may be treated as a matter of scope. ‘Petrarch’, on this view, may be a disguised ordinary description meaning the same as ‘The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance’. It is natural to think that ‘Petrarch’ cannot have this semantic content, since ‘Petrarch might not have been famous’ seems unambiguously true, but ‘The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance might not have been famous’ has a false reading. It can have the same truth conditions as a scoped sentence something like, ‘It might have been the case that: for some x, x is the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance and x has never been famous’, which is false. But according to the proposal in question, the false reading for ‘The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance might not have been famous’ does not show that ‘Petrarch’ fails to mean the same as ‘the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance’. The other reading is the relevant one. According to that reading, the name takes wide scope, and the truth conditions are the same as those for a sentence like, ‘For some x, x is the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance and it might have been the case that: x has never been famous’, which is true.
Kripke (1980 pp. 11–15) points out that there are problems with this attempt to accommodate rigidity. Some sentences have no modal operators. When we evaluate these sentences with respect to other worlds, we do not seem to admit that the designatum changes, as it would if names were non-rigid descriptions taking the proper scope in modal contexts. Thus, we can describe a possible world in which Petrarch dies as an infant. With respect to such a world, would ‘Petrarch is never famous’ be true? It seems so. But on the proposal in question, the sentence would say the same as ‘The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance is never famous’, which is false with respect to any world. Also, it seems that we can make names appear inside the scope of a modal operator: “It might have been the case that: Petrarch never became famous.” This would apparently be impossible to do on the view in question, but we seem to be able to do it. On the basis of such considerations, Kripke rejects this proposal for accommodating rigidity within descriptivism.
Kripke’s arguments seem to have persuaded most of his audience (including Salmon 1981, p. 26n.28), and his principal target, Michael Dummett, has responded by making some modifications (1981, pp. xvii–xix). Others have followed Dummett with more sophisticated variations (e.g., Sosa 2001; Hunter 2005; cf. Caplan 2005; Everett 2005; cf. Soames 2005; a good overview is provided by Noonan 2013, chap 13).
184.108.40.206 Assertoric Content and Ingredient Sense
Assuming that Kripke’s arguments against widescopism are successful, it might appear that rigid and nonrigid designators differ in content. Thus, any statement S containing a proper name cannot have the same content as a statement S′ that differs from S just in the respect that a proper name in S is replaced by a non-rigid designator in S′. Following Stanley (whose precise formulations differ slightly from this and from each other: 1997a, pp. 568–9; 1997b, p. 135), we might call this the Rigidity Thesis.
But Dummett has still another suggestion that, if successful, would refute the Rigidity Thesis (or at least one understanding of it). Consider the similarity between (1)–(4):
- The famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa
- The famous humanist now most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa
- The famous humanist here most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa
- The famous humanist in α most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa.
In some intuitive sense, it might seem that these statements share the same content. Thus, for example, what one believes when one assents to any of (2)–(4) might seem to be what one believes when one assents to (1). Even so, (1)–(4) contribute different semantic values to complex sentences in which they are embedded. What one believes when assenting to (1′) is not what one believes in assenting, say, to (2′):
- It will always be the case that the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa
- It will always be the case that the famous humanist now most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance wrote the epic Africa.
(1′) is dubiously true, at best. It might well be that Lorenzo Valla will overtake Petrarch at some future time, being a famous humanist more closely associated with the Italian Renaissance than Petrarch. And Valla did not write the epic Africa. On the other hand, (2′) is true, at least assuming, for the sake of an illustration, that (1) and (2) are true. On that assumption, it does not matter that Valla might overtake Petrarch later: that will be too late to affect their respective status as it is now.
Given that (1)–(4) make different semantic contributions to complex sentences in which they are embedded, must we reject the earlier suggestion that they share the same content? Here we might use a tip from Dummett to resist an affirmative answer. We might acknowledge that (1)–(4) share the same truth conditions, which amount to at least one bona fide use of ‘content’. Thus, for Dummett, a speaker who could classify sufficiently detailed possible states of affairs into those that render any statement like these “correct and those that render it incorrect, may be said to know the assertoric content of the sentence” (1991, p. 48). And we might also acknowledge a distinct phenomenon that is responsible for different contributions (1)–(4) make to larger sentences in which they are embedded: Dummett calls this distinct phenomenon a sentence’s “ingredient sense.” “Ingredient sense is what semantic theories are concerned to explain” (p. 48).
Armed with the distinction between assertoric content and ingredient sense, we might reject the Rigidity Thesis. We might maintain that (1)–(4) have the same assertoric content and hence that they say the same thing: anyone who asserts one of these (or believes it, rejects it, and so on), also asserts the others. Where they differ is in ingredient sense.
There are a number of lines of thinking that converge on the conclusion that (1)–(4) share the same assertoric content even though they differ in ingredient sense. As already suggested, some might find it natural to take (1)–(4) as expressing the same “semantic content” in some meaningful sense (perhaps the only meaningful sense): if so, Dummett’s distinction indicates how one might coherently maintain that position. Such a position might be especially natural in view of “descriptive names,” like Evans’ famous ‘Julius’, which is a rigid designator for whoever invented the zipper (Evans 1979). It might seem natural to say that ‘Julius is an inventor’ has the same content as ‘Whoever invented the zipper is an inventor’, even though the former is contingent and the latter necessary. Evans himself suggests that such pairs of sentences “have the same content, despite their modal differences” (Evans 1979, p. 187n.10).
There are other related considerations in favor of saying that (1)–(4) share the same assertoric content even though they differ in ingredient sense: here is a sketch of a couple of considerations from Stanley, who develops Dummett’s suggestion in admirable detail in a series of interesting papers (1997a, 1997b, 2002). First, one might maintain that what one asserts, when one asserts (1), is simply true or false, and not true now but false later, true here but false in some other community where Valla is more highly esteemed than Petrarch, true in α but false in other possible worlds. Yet what (1) contributes to the likes of (2)–(4) is not simply true or false: it is rather something like a function from times, places, or worlds, respectively, to truth values. That function generates a different truth value depending on the argument (Stanley 1997a, p. 577; see also King 2003 §1; for related claims, see Lewis 1998). Hence, the line of thinking concludes, what is asserted, when one asserts (1), is assertoric content and not ingredient sense.
Another line of thinking by which one might argue that (1)–(4) share the same assertoric content even though they differ in ingredient sense starts from general considerations about what kind of animal “content” is. For Stanley, the content of a statement is closely tied to what it is used to communicate in normal contexts, where “normal” has to do with the competence of speakers, their intentions to use words as others do, and so on (1997b, 136; 2002). In such contexts, he says, (1)–(4) are used to communicate the same thing. So they have the same content, the same meaning. Meaning, which facilitates communication in the right contexts, is constituted by presuppositions on the part of speakers. In contexts of modal evaluation, two sentences asserting the same thing can diverge in their contribution to larger sentences or diverge in truth value with respect to counterfactual worlds under consideration because “meaning-constituting presuppositions are irrelevant for modal evaluation. It is the purpose of modal evaluation to suspend presuppositions,” on this way of thinking about content (Stanley 2002, p. 338; see also 1997b, p. 155).
If the distinction between assertoric and ingredient sense is tenable, and if (1)–(4) share the same assertoric content even though they differ in ingredient sense, so that the Rigidity Thesis is false, then this opens the door to holding that proper names share the same content as ordinary, non-indexed descriptions after all, even though names are rigid and ordinary, non-indexed descriptions are not rigid. In that case, something along the lines of the venerable descriptivism associated with Frege and Russell (see the subsection on description theories in the entry on reference and the section on descriptive theories of proper names in the entry on descriptions), which Kripke is widely thought to have devastated, survives. One way to develop a descriptivism along these lines would be to say that a name like ‘Petrarch’ is something like a disguised description that is shorthand for ‘the famous humanist most closely associated in α with the Italian Renaissance’. Although this description for which ‘Petrarch’ is shorthand is world-indexed, it shares the descriptive content of the non-indexed ‘the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance’. On this suggestion, since ‘Petrarch’ shares the content of the rigid description, it also shares the content of the nonrigid description.
Kripke’s reservations about descriptivism go deeper than arguments from rigidity or indeed arguments from any considerations pertaining to the metaphysics of modality: there are quite distinct worries about whether speakers would have to be in possession of the relevant descriptive information to use ‘Petrarch’, for example. Could not someone refer to Petrarch by ‘Petrarch’ if she supposed that Valla were the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance and she associated with ‘Petrarch’ only the description ‘a clergyman who criticized the Avignon papacy’? If so, a standard argument runs, the content of ‘Petrarch’ cannot be the same as that of ‘the famous humanist most closely associated with the Italian Renaissance’. There may be a few descriptive names of the relevant variety in natural language: Dummett adduces ‘St. Joachim’, which he takes to have been “introduced as denoting the father of the Blessed Virgin, whoever that may have been” (1991, p. 48), and Kripke adduces ‘Jack the Ripper’, introduced for the murderer of so and so (1980, 79–80; for doubts, see Devitt 2020, 414–415). But it is unlikely that there are many such descriptive proper names in natural language. Still, it may be that more sophisticated descriptivisms appealing to more sophisticated descriptions could overcome worries like these further, non-metaphysical worries about typical names (see, e.g., Nelson 2002).
220.127.116.11 Descriptivism, Anti-Descriptivism, and the Importance of Rigidity
None of the foregoing considerations in favor of the fruitfulness of distinguishing assertoric content and ingredient sense is beyond controversy. One might resist (critics include Everett 2005, pp. 125–38; King 2007, pp. 168–196; Shieh 2001, pp. 379–80; Soames 2005, pp. 321–3n.; defenders include Ninian 2012; Stalnaker 2014, pp. 23–24; Yalcin 2014). But the question of whether the foregoing descriptivist line of thinking is sound, or whether any descriptivist line is sound, is less important here than the question of what rides on the answer for rigidity.
If the Dummettian line of thinking about assertoric and ingredient sense is sound, does rigidity lose its interest? It would appear that the answer is No. The fundamental work for rigidity sketched already seems largely independent of these issues.
The fundamental work in question concerns the metaphysics of modality, for the most part. But assertoric content does not have much to do with the metaphysics of modality, so the claim that apparently rigid designators as well as nonrigid designators have a descriptive assertoric content seems not to threaten the extent or significance of rigidity: “the propositional content of a sentence in a context is not its modal content” (Stanley 2002, 338).
Some of the fundamental work concerns epistemology: e.g., the issue of whether a sentence like ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is a posteriori as well as necessarily true. Would the above considerations in favor of distinguishing assertoric from ingredient sense undermine Kripke’s ideas here, at least, even if the considerations do not undermine Kripke’s ideas about modality? That seems unlikely. On the contrary, the claim that names, though rigid, share the semantic content of descriptions seems likely to vindicate Kripke’s claims about the epistemic status of statements like the above, if anything. That is because one could say that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ differ in assertoric content (in an extended sense, applied to designators rather than statements) but they do not differ in ingredient sense or modal content. Because they do not differ in ingredient sense or modal content, being rigid designators for the same thing, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true. Because they do differ in assertoric content, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is a posteriori; ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’, by contrast, is a priori since both occurrences of ‘Hesperus’ have one and the same assertoric content. So descriptivism of this sophisticated sort suggests one means to retain Kripke’s epistemic claims. Anti-descriptivism in the form of direct reference, by contrast, is incompatible with at least one interpretation of the claim that ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is “a posteriori”, because on the theory of direct reference, ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ just share the same content, end of story: so ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ shares the same content as ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’, which is a priori just in virtue of content (again, on one interpretation of the claim that the statement is “a priori”).
Rigidity’s work is compatible with descriptivism. Although some philosophers seem to have the impression that the important work that rigidity performs is to refute descriptivism, this seems to be a mistake. A related impression is that the important work that Kripke performs is to refute descriptivism: the rigidity of terms and more just falls out of anti-descriptivism, so anti-descriptivism is what really matters at bottom (see below, §4.2). But there are strong reasons to resist this assessment of rigidity’s importance or lack thereof, too.
First, it might be replied that even if names are non-descriptive, directly referring terms, it might not follow that they are rigid: a directly referential designator can be nonrigid, at least in principle (see note 5). If this thought is right, then the work that rigidity performs for names does not follow from anti-descriptivism. More is required.
Further, even if rigidity does follow from anti-descriptivism, anti-descriptivism does not follow from rigidity: so rigidity’s work is not limited to that of direct reference. We have seen that descriptive designators may be rigid: e.g., world-indexed designators. But rigidity performs much of the same work on these as on arguably nondescriptive expressions like names. For example, ‘The evening star in α = the morning star in α’ would seem to be a necessarily true, a posteriori statement whose necessity and aposteriority cannot be explained in terms of the nondescriptive nature of the designators flanking the ‘=’ sign.
Suppose we limit our consideration to names. By ignoring non-names, we can ignore descriptive designators that are rigid, provided that names are nondescriptive, directly referring designators: suppose again that they are. Still, it might be wise to distinguish sharply the significance of rigidity from that of the theory of direct reference. That is because rigidity’s importance does not hang on the outcome of controversies surrounding the theory of direct reference (a controversial theory, as proponents concede: Salmon 2003, p. 475; Soames 2005, p. 3). Where direct reference is called into question, it should not be thought that rigidity is thereby called into question. The fate of rigidity’s significance is distinct from the fate of direct reference’s significance.
Finally, even if direct reference is to be taken for granted and rigidity for names does follow from direct reference, one might not draw the conclusion that rigidity loses interest. Here is an analogy. Few would say that if the theory of special relativity, with all of its claims about the relativity of space and time, follows from the theory of general relativity, then special relativity loses interest because in that case, general relativity is what really matters: special relativity and much more just follow from it. There is evidently something wrong with this attempt to devalue the theory of special relativity. It would be better to say that part of what is interesting about general relativity concerns its implications for the relativity of space and time, as explained by the theory of special relativity: special relativity retains its interest as part of a larger, more fundamental theory. In the same way, rigidity might be said to lose no interest even if it is explained by something more fundamental.
It might be tempting, then, to think that if descriptivism survives, then rigidity is useless because its work, which is to refute descriptivism, is left unperformed. It might also be tempting to think that if descriptivism is defeated but by considerations that are more fundamental than rigidity and that give rise to rigidity, then rigidity is superfluous because its work is performed but by other phenomena. The foregoing paragraphs offer reasons for thinking that these tempting lines of thought are erroneous. If these reasons are sound, then unless there are other, quite unheralded ties between rigidity and descriptivism or its opposition, rigidity’s interest would seem to be largely independent of the fate of these rival theories about semantic content.
3. Philosophical Work for Rigidity.
As already indicated, rigidity does interesting epistemological and metaphysical work. Sections (3.1)–(3.5) below discuss various areas of work.
3.1 The Necessary A Posteriori
Because of the rigid designation of the names it contains, ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true. Since empirical work on the part of astronomers was required to determine that the statement is true, we seem to have an illustration of necessary, a posteriori truth. Thus, rigid designation seems to play a crucial role in securing necessity with surprising epistemological significance. Prior to discussion about rigid designation, the necessary a posteriori was generally thought to be an empty category. Rigid designation, along with other referential mechanisms discussed in connection with it, has changed all that, going “against the assumption of centuries of philosophers,” as Linda Zagzebski relates (Zagzebski 2017, p. 213). Thus, Putnam observes that rigidity has “startling consequences for the theory of necessary truth” (1975, p. 232).
Since Kant there has been a big split between philosophers who thought that all necessary truths were analytic and philosophers who thought that some necessary truths were synthetic a priori. But none of these philosophers thought that a (metaphysically) necessary truth could fail to be a priori (Putnam 1975, p. 233).
There is no question that a major reason for excitement about rigidity is that it underwrites the necessary a posteriori (see also Schwartz 2002, pp. 270ff.). However, in light of the theory of direct reference, this apparent coup may have been overstated or misunderstood. As we observed, direct reference theorists insist that ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ and ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’ express the same proposition or share the same content even though these statements have the appearance of saying different things. For direct reference theorists, to say that Hesperus = Phosphorus is to say no more and no less than to say that Hesperus = Hesperus. Since it is a priori that Hesperus = Hesperus, it is a priori that Hesperus = Phosphorus. For this reason, the claim that rigidity presents propositions that are necessarily true and a posteriori might be disputed (Soames 2002, pp. 240, 243; Salmon 1986, pp. 133–42; Fitch 1976; for further discussion, see Fitch 2004, pp. 110–13; Hughes 2004, pp. 84–108).
So it is controversial, though common, to say that rigidity assures that the proposition Hesperus = Phosphorus is necessarily true and a posteriori. On the other hand, it may be less problematic or less controversial to say that rigidity assures that the sentence or statement (interpreted sentence) ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true even though we can find this out only a posteriori (Fitch 2004, pp. 110–13; Hughes 2004, pp. 106–7; cf. Kripke 1980, pp. 20–1). If it is tenable to say that rigidity assures that some sentences or statements like this are necessarily true though a posteriori, further questions immediately impose themselves. Here is a salient question: Does the aposteriority that characterizes the necessarily true statements retain its epistemological significance and surprise, given that it is associated with statements rather than propositions? The question carries some importance in view of the popularity of Millianism; yet despite all of the debate about the correctness of Millianism, the question has been neglected.
Here is one challenge to the proposal that the relevant statements are necessarily true and a posteriori in any interesting respect. The proposal apparently amounts to this: the sentence ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is necessarily true as it is used by English speakers and it is an a posteriori matter to determine that it is. But if this is all that the a posteriori necessity of ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ amounts to, then all necessary statements are a posteriori in the relevant way. So, the necessary a posteriori loses its interest. To find out how English speakers use any sentence at all, one needs an empirical look at the world. Even ‘The circle cannot be squared’, which is generally regarded as a priori, seems to come out a posteriori on the account. It is an a posteriori matter to determine that ‘The circle cannot be squared’ is necessarily true as used by English speakers. The reader is invited to think over whether the intended position lacks interest in this or other ways (there is room in the literature for contributions: for discussion, see LaPorte 2020, p. 326).
3.2 The Contingent A Priori
According to Kripke, a proper understanding of rigidity also reveals that some contingent statements are a priori. Kripke considers the standard meter stick, which has been used to define the length of one meter. Someone decreed that the expression ‘one meter’ is to be used for the unit of length of that stick, perhaps at a certain time in the stick’s existence. The stick, S, might not have been the length that it was at the time ‘one meter’ was coined: had it been heated or cooled it might have been longer or shorter. As things are, it was not heated or cooled. So the sentence ‘One meter = the length of S (at time t0)’ is true in the actual world but it is false in some possible worlds: it is contingently true. Yet S has been used to define ‘one meter’, in the sense that it fixes the reference (see above), so the definers of ‘one meter’ know a priori the truth of the sentence ‘The length one meter is instantiated by S (at time t0)’. The reason that the sentence is contingently true is that ‘one meter’ is a rigid designator for the length one meter. ‘The length of S (at time t0)’ is, on the other hand, a non-rigid designator for one meter; in this world it designates one meter but in other worlds, those in which S is heated or cooled, ‘the length of S (at time t0)’ designates other lengths.
The contingent a priori has not been as widely discussed as the necessary a posteriori. The introduction of the contingent a priori is perhaps less surprising than the introduction of the necessary a posteriori, in view of the plausible contingency of a priori statements that philosophers all along recognized, like the plausible contingency of the statement, as uttered in a context, ‘I exist’. Further, Kripke’s examples of the contingent a priori are perhaps more controversial than his examples of the necessary a posteriori. Many dispute that the examples really are examples of the contingent a priori (Donnellan 1977; Hughes 2004, pp. 84–107; Plantinga 1974, pp. 8–9n.; Salmon 1987–1988; cf. Kripke 2019, Other Internet Resources for a defense; Oppy 1994; Salmon 2020 distinguishes an interesting notion related to the contingent a priori that Kripke has allegedly identified). And even if they are contingent and a priori, many feel they lack much significance. They are not “scary,” as Donnellan puts it (also Fitch 2004, p. 121). On the other hand, confusions are like loose threads: they sometimes work their way to apparently remote material. Confusion about the contingent a priori can and arguably does lead to confusion and apparent paradox in unsuspected areas of philosophy (an alleged example is discussed in LaPorte 2003). Kripke (1980, pp. 14–15) recalls that considerations about the contingent a priori led in his mind to a number of clarifications concerning designation, which again is hardly surprising given the interconnectedness of different issues in a fabric.
3.3 Theoretical Identities
The statements of necessity associated with rigid designation are interesting from an epistemological standpoint, as just indicated. They are also interesting from a metaphysical standpoint.
Rigid designation seems needed on the part of both designators if there are to be true “theoretical identity statements”: statements in which a designator designates by way of expressing explicitly in some manner one of the designatum’s theoretically interesting essences. The argument is not often put explicitly. It is helpful to outline explicitly the line of reasoning in order to bring out more clearly what stands or falls with rigidity.
Not all identity statements widely accepted as necessary specify a theoretically interesting essence in the relevant respect. ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ or ‘Cicero = Tully’ do not; each sentence contains only names for an object. But take, on the other hand, ‘Cicero = the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’, where ‘s’ and ‘e’ are names for the right sperm and egg. Many regard this sentence as necessarily true and revealing of a theoretical essence of Cicero: roughly, a theoretically interesting property possessed by Cicero in all possible worlds and never possessed by anyone else (bear in mind, for this example, limited demands of weak necessity). In order for any identity statement to be true of necessity, both designators must be rigid if either is. And if ‘the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’ indeed expresses an essence of Cicero, it must designate just Cicero in all possible worlds, and hence rigidly: so, given that the statement at issue is necessarily true, ‘Cicero’ must be rigid, too. Alternatively, if ‘Cicero’ is rigid, as is widely acknowledged, then in order for the statement at issue to be necessarily true, ‘the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’ must be rigid and so express an essence of Cicero.
The foregoing paragraphs address a line of reasoning according to which rigid designation is needed for certain statements to come out necessarily true. Usually, rigidity is discussed with a view not to its being necessary for the completion of a job but rather with a view to its being sufficient for the completion of a job. The rigid designation of both designators flanking an identity sign in a true theoretical identity statement is sufficient to establish the necessity of the statement. If we acknowledge that ‘the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’ is rigid, and we acknowledge that ‘Cicero’ is rigid, then we are committed to the necessity, in case of truth, of ‘Cicero = the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’. The reasoning is parallel to that given for the case of ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ above.
‘Cicero = the organism descended from sperm s and egg e’ shows that statements about individuals can, in effect, be theoretical identity statements. The most commonly discussed theoretical identity statements concern kinds. They include ‘Gold = the element with atomic number 79’ and ‘Water = H2O’ (Kripke 1980, pp. 138–40, 148). Similar reasoning might apply. Here the reasoning is again nearly always left implicit; one must fill in gaps to present a general line of thought that seems to accord with a widely held, if not widely articulated, tradition. For that tradition, in order for it to be the case that ‘Water = H2O’ is necessarily true, both designators must be rigid if either is. So if the statement is necessarily true and either ‘water’ is rigid by virtue of being a name for a substance or else ‘H2O’ is rigid by virtue of expressing an essence, both designators need to be rigid. And again, the rigidity of designators in a true theoretical identity statement is sufficient for the statement’s necessity. If ‘H2O’ is a rigid designator of a substance, and ‘water’ is a rigid designator of a substance, and ‘Water = H2O’ is true, then that statement is necessarily true.
Theoretical identity statements are of interest across the gamut of philosophy. Various writers appeal to rigid designation to support views about the essences not only of kinds from chemistry or biology but also kinds from philosophical subdisciplines apparently far removed from empirical science: ethics and aesthetics, for example (see, e.g., Carney 1982; Funkhouser 2014, pp. 4, 164; Gampel 1997; Leddy 1987; Noonan 2020). The reader interested in pursuing any of these traditions should beware that attempts to apply rigidity in the foregoing subdisciplines, especially early attempts, sometimes confuse rigidity with other phenomena recognized by popular theories of reference: see clarifications in section 2.2.
By far, the most attention concerning theoretical identity statements has focused on the area of philosophy of mind. That is next on the agenda.
Kripke appeals to rigid designation in arguing against the identity theory of mind, which is really a constellation of theories. A broad division between identity theories can be drawn between type identity theories and token identity theories: here is a standard Kripkean argument against token identity theories, which are often thought to be more compelling than type identity theories. Kripke is typically understood to put forward something like this argument.
The Argument Against Token Identity: Suppose that every particular mental event is identical to some particular brain event. Then we can take some pain and name it ‘P’, and we can do the same for the corresponding brain event, calling it ‘C’ (for “c-fiber firing,” assuming for the sake of argument that that is the corresponding brain event). According to the identity theory, P = C. But in reality, P ≠ C. C could have existed without P: that very c-fiber firing could have obtained even while there was no corresponding P. Your c-fibers could have been blasting away even as you felt nothing at all. In the same way, P could have existed without C. You could have felt that same dull, throbbing sensation in your forehead without the corresponding c-fibers having ever acted up. Now, merely showing that C could have existed without P and that P could have existed without C does not yet belie ‘P = C’. For this statement might be true necessarily or contingently. Since P and C could each exist without the other, the statement cannot be necessarily true. But there is still the possibility that the statement is contingently true. There are contingently true statements, as we have seen: e.g., ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’. However, it cannot be that ‘P = C’ is contingently true, as ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is. ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is contingently true because ‘Hesperus’ is a rigid designator and ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is non-rigid. Because ‘Hesperus’ and ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ designate the same object at the actual world, ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is true; because ‘Hesperus’ and ‘the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ designate different objects at some other worlds, ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is false at those other worlds. That is why ‘Hesperus = the brightest non-lunar object in the evening sky’ is true but contingently so. ‘P = C’, on the other hand, contains two rigid designators. ‘P’ is a name for that very pain, and so rigidly designates it. ‘C’ is a name for that very brain event, and so rigidly designates it. Because ‘P’ and ‘C’ are both rigid designators, ‘P = C’ has to be true of necessity if it is true at all. Since it is not true of necessity, it is not true at all.
Some premises in this bare-bones argument are in obvious need of support, like the modal intuition that P and C could have existed each in the absence of the other. Support has been provided and rejected by different writers. Many philosophers who reject anti-materialist arguments along these lines nevertheless make use of rigid designation as a resource in order to frame materialist views that recognize a parallel between ‘P = C’ and ‘Water = H2O’.
Kripke’s views concerning the philosophy of mind could hardly be called popular. But, as the introduction to an edited volume covering the topic says, “Even authors who disagree with Kripke’s fundamental picture tend to present their arguments against an implicitly or explicitly Kripkean backdrop” (Gendler and Hawthorne 2002, p. 26).
4. Objections to Rigidity
Various objections to the coherence or usefulness of rigidity have been put forward by specialists in the philosophy of language, though the objections do not seem to have done much to damage the widespread appeal of rigidity, which is commonly taken for granted in mainstream literature from various areas of philosophy. (Whether your typical philosopher is entitled to embrace rigidity is another matter: so there is a case for saying, on grounds independent from the foregoing objections, that rigidity and the necessity accompanying it stand or fall with a robust version of the analytic-synthetic distinction (see note 4). If that case is solid, then either popular Quinean antagonism toward analyticity should prompt the rejection of rigidity or else the appeal of rigidity should prompt the rejection of the familiar antagonism toward analyticity.) What resistance to rigidity there is may be addressed in general terms first, in order to save for its own subsection (§4.2) treatment of objections specifically directed at the application of rigidity to terms for properties, which are especially contended.
4.1 Objections to Rigidity in General
There are arguments against the coherence or applicability of rigidity for concrete-object designators (for discussion, see Fitch 2004, pp. 102–10), but here we find relative calm. As Hughes says, the position “that proper names are rigid, and that identity statements involving only proper names are accordingly necessarily true or necessarily false,” is “as close to uncontroversial as any interesting views in analytic philosophy” (2004, p. vii).
Still, in saying that rigidity is widely favored, we should be prepared to qualify in view of those I’ve called “serious counterpart theorists,” who must adopt a revisionist understanding of what it is for a designator to designate “rigidly” (or alternatively, they can just frame their position as a rejection of rigidity: e.g., Varzi 2003, already quoted). Usually, counterpart theorists are motivated by objections to some of the necessity that rigidity secures, according to the usual understanding. It appears to some (e.g., Gibbard 1975) that not all identity statements containing just names are necessarily true. Consider this scenario: you mold one chunk of clay into the top half of a statue, and another chunk of clay into the bottom half. You stick the halves together, thus bringing into existence both a statue, call it ‘David’, and a large lump of clay, call it ‘Lumpl’. Suppose, next, that you explode the statue: both David and Lumpl go out of existence. It is tempting to say that ‘David = Lumpl’ is true, but not necessarily true. It could have been that: David exists and Lumpl exists but ‘David ≠ Lumpl’ is true. This would have been the case had Lumpl survived David: e.g., had you squeezed the clay statue into a ball, thereby changing the shape of the relevant lump of clay, instead of exploding it, thereby bringing an end to the lump of clay.
If both ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ are rigid designators, then ‘David = Lumpl’ is necessarily true if it is true in any possible world at all. So, if it is even possible that David ≠ Lumpl, then David ≠ Lumpl. David and Lumpl are distinct, however intimately related, because they have different modal properties: Lumpl could instantiate ballhood, while David could not. The rigidity of ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ evidently requires as much. In order to say that ‘David = Lumpl’ is contingently true, Gibbard gives up the thesis that ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ are rigid designators in the usual respect. He maintains that designators are “rigid,” very loosely speaking, only with respect to a sortal: ‘David’ is statue-rigid, always referring to the same statue, while ‘Lumpl’ is lump-rigid, always referring to the same lump. Accordingly, ‘Possibly, David is no statue’ is false, while ‘Possibly, Lumpl is no statue’ is true. What about the object that is, as a matter of fact, both a statue and a lump? For Gibbard, objects have no modal properties and it makes no sense to say that an object in some other possible world is identical to an object in the actual world. This is counterintuitive, but again Gibbard does offer a non-standard semantics to accommodate modal talk.
David Lewis (1986, chap 4) offers a similar strategy for maintaining that ‘Possibly, David is no statue’ is false, while ‘Possibly, Lumpl is no statue’ is true. For Lewis, what makes a sentence like the above true or false is whether counterparts in other possible worlds associated with ‘David’ or ‘Lumpl’ are all statues. The use, in discourse, of different names like ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ can create different contexts, thus altering the counterparts that come into play in determining the truth of sentences containing the names. The sentences ‘Possibly, David is no statue’ and ‘Possibly, Lumpl is no statue’ can vary in truth value because the counterparts relevant to the truth value of the former sentence are all statues but the counterparts relevant to the truth value of the latter sentence are not.
Orthodox rigidity proponents who distinguish between the referents of ‘David’ and ‘Lumpl’ say that there is more than one object at the same place and time where the statue stands. The intimate relationship between David and Lumpl is usually understood as one of constitution: David is constituted by Lumpl. Constitution has been championed by various philosophers to address a variety of related issues (see, e.g., Baker 2000 on personal identity).
Another possibility, which avoids commitment to constitution, is to maintain an eliminativism about statues or clay lumps. One might maintain that there is no real entity to name “David,” in the way that the story above requires; there is only Lumpl in a statuesque form. Accordingly, the problem of accounting for the modal status of a sentence to which ‘David’ contributes, like ‘David = Lumpl’, never arises. (For an appeal to eliminativism to handle various candidates for constitution, see Fitch 2001, pp. 382–3, 391n.5; Hershenov 2005; Merricks 2001.) In order to work as a general alternative approach, eliminativism would have to work for all of a wide variety of would-be cases of constitution.
Notice that the unintuitive idea that more than one object can exist in the same place at the same time is not necessarily removed if we accept contingent identity. Gibbard, for example, acknowledges that Lumpl and David are distinct objects in any world w in which David but not Lumpl comes to an end by being squeezed into a ball; but despite the failure of identity to hold between David and Lumpl in w, the two share one spatiotemporal location before David is destroyed because the material of the clay lump that is Lumpl is precisely the material of David.
A good collection of papers on this topic is Rea (1997), and a good introduction is his “Introduction.”
4.2 Objections to the Application of Rigidity to Terms for Kinds and Properties
Both Kripke (1980) and Putnam (1975) famously extend the notion of rigidity to terms for natural kinds. Here controversy has ensued. Let us begin with a singular term as an example; general terms introduce additional complications (for discussion, see Linsky 1984; Soames 2002; Salmon 2003; 2005).
What is rigidly designated by a kind term like ‘Apis mellifera’? Apparently it can not rigidly designate a scattered object comprised of all particular honeybees, say, since those honeybees that presently go about their work might not have existed. And others that do not exist might have existed instead (but controversy and complications attend this observation: see, e.g., Gómez-Torrente 2006; Zouhar 2009, p. 211). To be rigid, a term has to designate the same thing in all possible worlds.
Some philosophers have proposed that ‘Apis mellifera’ rigidly designates an abstract object, a kind or property. One might say that ‘Apis mellifera’ designates the honeybee kind in every possible world: it never designates any other kind, like the bumblebee kind, say. That might be said to make the term rigid. Something similar could be said for ‘water’, ‘heat’, and ‘redness’. But a number of objections have been issued.
One broad sort of objection, if it should be called that, is that rigidity does, in some respect, the work attributed to it; but rigidity is superfluous to the task of explaining that work because the work is the result of other, more fundamental phenomena (for different approaches along these lines, see Jylkkä 2008, pp. 69–72; Schwartz 2002; Soames 2002, e.g., pp. 310–11). For all this objection tells, rigidity might remain interesting as a special case of more fundamental phenomena. More damaging for property rigidity would be its rejection in favor of competing mechanisms alleged to do comparable work (Haukioja 2012; Nimtz 2019).
An objection more specifically directed toward efforts at extending rigidity to expressions for just kinds and properties, is that such efforts would also have to extend the status of rigidity to terms for artificial kinds or properties (see, e.g., Glüer and Pagin 2011; Haukioja 2012; Nimtz 2019; Schwartz 2002; 2018; 2020; whether this vast application of rigidity should be thought problematic might be questioned: see e.g., Salmon 2005). The singular terms ‘soda pop’, ‘bachelorhood’, ‘livestock’ and so on, would also seem to designate an abstract object rigidly (soda pop, bachelorhood, livestock, respectively), if terms for natural kinds and natural properties do so. So the foregoing proposal for the rigidity of kind and property terms might be thought to be too indiscriminate in what it allows to be rigid—maybe even so indiscriminate that it mistakes sameness of meaning across possible worlds, which every meaningful expression enjoys, for sameness of designation, which only rigid designators are supposed to have (Schwartz 2002, p. 272; 2020, p. 263n.).
The basic objection here to our counting certain singular terms to be rigid designators for properties might also tell against counting certain general terms to be rigid designators. The thesis under fire is that according to which certain general terms rigidly designate properties, by virtue of designating the right property in every possible world. So according to this thesis, ‘watery’, like its singular variant ‘water’, is rigid by virtue of designating water with respect to every possible world: and something similar can be said for ‘honeybee’, ‘hot’, and ‘green’. Again, the relevant objection would be that if the foregoing general terms were rigid for that reason, then something similar could be said for general terms that cut more artificially, like ‘bachelor’; and that is supposed to be a problem.
A second group of objections to extending rigid status to expressions for properties specifically (just tacitly include kinds with properties—kinds are often counted as a sort of property) centers around the idea that the proposal seems committed to substantive metaphysical positions about abstract objects like kinds or properties, concerning which a theory of language ought to remain neutral (Devitt 2005; Haukioja 2006; Martí 1998, p. 487). For example, the proposal seems committed to rejecting nominalism. Some defenders of property terms’ rigidity are happy so to commit (Linsky 1984). Other defenders of property terms’ rigidity seek ways of accommodating nominalism (Martí 1998).
Even if we are happy to commit to properties, problems remain. Just as a paucity of properties can create problems (nominalism), so can a plenum of properties. We’ve already seen that expressions for artificial kinds and properties like ‘livestock’ might create troubles. There’s a different sort of problem raised by still-more artificial properties: a worry arises that allegedly non-rigid designators for properties always end up rigidly designating some gruesome relational property or other in the plenum. Consider ‘the biological species typically farmed for honey’, which we might initially be inclined to take for a nonrigid designator of Apis mellifera. “In virtue of what,” as Devitt would ask (2005, p. 154; see also 2009, p. 240), does such an expression “nonrigidly designate that,” i.e., Apis mellifera, rather than rigidly designate the property being the biological species typically farmed for honey? This problem has been much discussed. Whether indeed there is a problem here might depend on whether expressions for properties are singular terms or whether they are predicative. Arguably the problem is more tractable for singular terms than for thoroughly predicative terms, which seem especially unaccommodating.
For related reasons, most workers reject any rigid–nonrigid distinction for purely predicative expressions. That would include ‘green’ and ‘honeybee’, on a nominalist’s approach according to which there is no property to designate and on some realist approaches, too, such as a Fregean approach according to which properties exist but cannot be named. Other still-more widely accepted candidates for purely predicative status would be the predicates ‘is green’, and ‘is a honeybee’.
‘Green’ and ‘honeybee’ are weaker candidates for purely predicative status than are predicates containing them, because according to a now-popular view, ‘green’ or ‘honeybee’ is “singular” in a broad sense. That popular view recognizes a “‘singular occurrence’ of a general term” like ‘green’ (Inan 2008, p.227), so that those holding the view do not count ‘green’ to be “purely predicative” in the strict respect of the foregoing paragraph, even though they might for all that count the containing expression ‘… is green’ as purely predicative (e.g., Soames counts ‘green’/‘… is green’ as singular/predicative respectively), and such theorists might accordingly apply the rigid–nonrigid distinction to the singular ‘green’ but not to ‘… is green’ (Soames 2010, pp. 90–91; 2006, p. 712; see also Robertson 2009, p. 136n.23).
How could ‘green’, a general term, have singular status too? According to the most commonly cited (but not the only) suggestion along these lines, although general terms are not first-order singular terms—on the contrary, they’re general terms precisely by virtue of being first-order general terms—they are higher-order singular terms (Linsky 1984; Salmon 2003; 2005).
A few workers maintain both that there are purely predicative general terms and that some of them, like ‘honeybee’, are rigid. According to a now-familiar suggestion along these lines, what makes the application of a general term F rigid is that any item x to which the term applies, in any possible world, is part of the extension of F in all worlds in which x exists, x being an F essentially (Cook 1980; Devitt 2005; Devitt and Sterelny 1999, pp. 85–6; Gómez-Torrente 2006). This notion of rigid application might hold some attraction for someone bothered by the objections just mentioned against the view that terms rigidly designate properties. It would appear that terms for natural kinds but not artificial ones come out rigid: thus, ‘honeybee’ is rigid because any particular honeybee is essentially a honeybee and could not have been something else like a dragonfly or a fir tree instead. But ‘livestock’ does not apply rigidly according to this account because animals that are livestock are not essentially so. Neither does ‘(is a member of the-/the-) species typically farmed for honey’ apply rigidly according to this account. Furthermore, the account appears to be open to nominalism (about properties): nominalists recognize the legitimate application of general terms.
However, even if rigid application evades the above difficulties, it has its limitations. One commonly noted problem is this: consider identity statements like ‘Water = H2O’, or ‘Red light = light with wavelength 680 nm’. Rigidity is apparently supposed to guarantee the necessity, in case of truth, of identity statements like these. Typically, fans of rigid application rewrite identity statements to have this form: ‘Anything is (an) F if and only if it is (an) F′’. But many philosophers, including proponents of rigid application, have pointed out that it could be the case for two general terms F and F′ that, (i) necessarily, every F is essentially F and every F′ is essentially F′, so that F and F′ are rigid appliers and (ii) in the actual world, ‘Anything is F if and only if it is F′’ is true, even though (iii) God might have created an F that is not an F′. In that event, ‘Anything is F if and only if it is F′’ comes out true with respect to the actual world but not necessarily true (for an attempt to get around this difficulty, see Gómez-Torrente 2006).
Apart from the foregoing minority suggestion of tying essentialism to rigidity, there has not been much done by way of articulating any purely predicative version of rigidity; again, prospects for any such account are generally thought to be grim. There is however at least one rival account of predicative rigidity to compete with the foregoing essentialism-centered account of predicative rigidity. The proposal follows a lead from Fregeans who recognize “definite ascriptions” (Heintz 1973) for properties corresponding to definite descriptions for entities they are willing to name. Thus, Geach indicates that he would recognize a proper answer to the question “what is the color of Antarctica?” to be “clouds, snow, etc.,” or that an English statement like the following is unobjectionable: “Honeybees are the species typically farmed for honey.” In sentences like the foregoing, seemingly singular talk about an abstract entity, such as a “color” or a “species,” would have to be interpreted as talk about concrete objects instead: clouds, bees, etc. (see, e.g., Anscombe and Geach 1961, pp. 155–6). Let us suppose, for the sake of argument, that expressions like ‘white’ and ‘the color of Antarctica’ are purely predicative, either because there are no properties to designate or because they cannot be designated by a singular expression: still, the contrast between a typical one-word predicate like ‘white’ and the foregoing definite ascription remains of interest for its bearing on the modal and epistemological status of biconditionals, in the ways relevant to rigidity, according to this line of thinking: compare ‘Something is the color of Antarctica if and only if it is white’ with ‘Something is albescent if and only if it is white’ (understand ‘albescent’ as a synonym for ‘white’). That contrast suggests that we might articulate an account of rigidity that does not presuppose singular designation of any sort (Haze 2021; LaPorte 2013, chapter 5).
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Other Internet Resources
- Kripke, Saul, 2019, “Naming and Necessity Revisited,” Address to School of Advanced Study, University of London.
- Comments on Nathan Salmon “Are General Terms Rigid” [PDF], by Robert May (text of presentation at the Princeton Semantics Workshop, May 2003.)
I am grateful to Jason Stanley and Edward Zalta for discerning comments that have brought about substantial changes for the better.