Notes to Friedrich Schiller

1. In order to favor no single European language, the hymn itself, although based on Beethoven’s setting of Schiller’s poem, does not in fact include Schiller’s text, or indeed any text. Hart recounts the remarkable trajectory of this poem, including its relationship to censorship in Schiller’s time and its status, via Beethoven’s setting, in both contemporary popular and political culture (Hart 2008: 485, 490).

2. Beiser points out that Schiller’s medical dissertations had philosophical roots; he also published an epistolary philosophical treatise entitled Philosophische Briefe in 1786. See Beiser 2005:18–41; Hinderer 1991: 197; Deligiorgi 2013; Macor 2011: 111.

3. Schiller immortalized a caricatured misreading of Kant’s moral philosophy in an ironic and oft-quoted epigram:

Gladly I serve my friends, but alas I do it with pleasure
Hence I am plagued with doubt that I am not a virtuous person
To this, this answer is given:
Surely, your only resource is to try to despise them entirely
And then with aversion do what your duty enjoins.
(quoted in Baxley 2010: 1084–1085)

This epigram is sometimes used to suggest that Schiller himself interpreted Kant as claiming that duty and inclination were entirely incompatible, a view he almost certainly did not hold. For Schiller’s interpretation of Kant on this point, see Winegar 2013; Baxley 2010; Beiser 2005: ch. 5. On the question of duty and inclination in Kant’s theory of moral evaluation, see Baron 1993: ch.5; Allison 2011: ch. 4; Wood 2014: ch. 1.

4. Schiller’s account of the will here tracks Kant’s distinction in the Religion Within the Boundaries of Pure Reason between Wille and Willkür rather than his second Critique equation of freedom with acting according to morality (Beiser 2005: 224). For discussion of Schiller’s varied and evolving definitions of freedom, see Beiser 2005: ch. 7; Deligiorgi 2011; Roehr 2003.

5. Schiller’s 1791 essay, “On the Reasons for Taking Pleasure in Tragic Subjects,” omitted from this discussion for reasons of space, takes up similar themes. See Beiser 2005: 247–8, 253–7; Sharpe 1991: 126.

6. For attempts to organize the letters into thematic groups, see Beiser 2005: 136; Dahlstrom 2008: 94–5.

7. Schiller’s use of drives was inspired by K.L. Reinhold. See Roehr 2003; Deligiorgi 2011: 496.

8. Schiller’s choice of the word “sentimentalisch” to designate this mindset has proven so confusing that some translators have instead rendered it “reflective” (Sharpe 1991: 177).

9. Goethe himself perpetuated an oversimplified reading of this essay, claiming thirty years after Schiller’s death that Schiller had written it in order to vindicate his own poetic disposition against Goethe’s (Sharpe 1991: 189). As should be clear, Schiller’s distinction between naïve and sentimental is too multi-layered to reduce to a description of two people; he is also critical of his own sentimental tendencies and so hardly uniformly critical of Goethe.

Copyright © 2017 by
Lydia L. Moland <>

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