Friedrich Schiller

First published Fri Apr 21, 2017

Johann Christoph Friedrich Schiller (1759–1805) is best known for his immense influence on German literature. In his relatively short life, he authored an extraordinary series of dramas, including The Robbers, Maria Stuart, and the trilogy Wallenstein. He was also a prodigious poet, composing perhaps most famously the “Ode to Joy” featured in the culmination of Beethoven’s Ninth Symphony and enshrined, some two centuries later, in the European Hymn.[1] In part through his celebrated friendship with Goethe, he edited epoch-defining literary journals and exerted lasting influence on German stage production. He is sometimes referred to as the German Shakespeare; his are still among the most widely produced German plays both in Germany and internationally.

In addition to his literary accomplishments, Schiller was a formidable philosophical thinker. Between 1791 and 1796, he authored a range of theoretical works that are both sophisticated and original. These writings primarily concern aesthetics, but they stake out notable positions on ethics, metaphysics, ontology, and political theory as well. Together, his essays helped shape one of the most prolific periods of German philosophizing; since then, they have served as a significant source of philosophical insight from an aesthetic practitioner of the highest standing.

1. Early Life and Literary Beginnings

Born in 1759 in Marbach am Neckar, Schiller showed such early intellectual promise that he was recruited by Karl Eugen, Duke of Württemberg, to attend his military academy. There Schiller was broadly educated, including in medicine, and became an army doctor in 1780. But his interests always lay in more humanistic subjects. Already in 1777, he had published his first poem; soon thereafter, he began composing dramas. The revolutionary mood of the age, combined with his deep objections to the Duke’s tyrannical rule, prompted a passion for freedom already evident in his first play, The Robbers [Die Räuber], whose protagonists defy social norms at the expense of their own lives. The play premiered in Mannheim in 1782, achieved instant success, and quickly earned Schiller international fame. The Duke, alarmed at Schiller’s revolutionary tendencies, had him arrested and forbade further playwriting. Schiller responded by fleeing to Mannheim to begin his literary career in earnest (Martinson 2005a: 2; Sharpe 1991: viii).

In the succeeding decade, Schiller authored plays and other literary works, composed dozens of poems, and authored two major histories, one of the Dutch rebellion against the Spanish and one of the Thirty Years’ War. As his fame grew, Schiller was appointed professor of history at the University of Jena where he lectured on both history and aesthetics. The Robbers’ message of liberation from political corruption had meanwhile been so influential that the new French Republic made Schiller an honorary citizen in 1792. But like many of his contemporaries, Schiller’s enthusiasm for the French Revolution turned to horror as the Terror began. His political disillusionment was coupled with both a serious illness and a crisis of self-confidence in his playwriting. Schiller had already experimented with philosophical prose, but this crisis inspired him to turn his attention fully to philosophy in the hopes of both recovering his health through quiet contemplation and of gaining philosophical insights that would reignite his literary talents. [2] A small pension provided by the Duke of Sachsen-Weimar made his temporary withdrawal from the theater and academic life financially possible, and it was during this period that most of Schiller’s remarkable theoretical output took place.

2. Philosophical Works

2.1 Kallias Letters

Schiller began his philosophical retreat with a thorough study of Kant and was immediately inspired by Kant’s description of human freedom. In 1793, he wrote to his friend Christian Gottfried Körner: “It is certain that no mortal has spoken a greater word than this Kantian word … determine yourself from within yourself” (NA XXVI, 191/KL 153). But Schiller was left dissatisfied with two of Kant’s claims as regards aesthetics: one, that there could be no objective principle of beauty, and two, that aesthetic experience refers only to pleasure felt by the subject, not to any property of the object. In letters to Körner, which he never published but after his death became known as the “Kallias Letters” [“Kalliasbriefe”], he set out to correct these Kantian claims and to place aesthetics on a more secure, independent, and critical foundation.

Schiller proposes to discover the objective principle of beauty following the procedure of Kant’s transcendental deduction: by asking what our ability to perceive beauty reveals about our mental faculties. He concludes that humans must possess two forms of reason: theoretical and practical. Theoretical reason connects “representation with representation to gain knowledge” (NA XXVI, 179/KL 149). If theoretical reason is applied to concepts, it produces logical judgments. If it is applied to intuitions, it produces teleological judgments. Practical reason, by contrast, connects “representation with the will in order to act” (NA XXVI, 179/KL 149). Its principle is autonomy or freedom. If practical reason is applied to free actions, it produces moral judgments. If it is applied to “unfree effects”—in other words, to objects in the world—it produces aesthetic judgments (NA XXVI, 183/KL 152). Judging something beautiful implies that we have encountered the appearance of freedom in empirical experience. As Schiller puts it: since practical reason’s principle is freedom, beauty is “thus nothing less than freedom in appearance” (NA XXVI, 183/KL 152; Schindler 2008: 93–4).

But what would freedom in appearance actually look like, and how could we identify it? Schiller names two qualities that appear in the object itself that prompt us to judge it beautiful. The first, he says, is the “being-determined-through-itself of the thing”: a sense that it is not determined by outside forces but is rather self-determining, existing only “through itself” (NA XXVI, 192/KL 154). As an example, Schiller contrasts a workhorse to a Spanish palfrey. The workhorse

trots just as tiredly and clumsily as if it were still pulling a wagon, even when it is not pulling one. Its movement no longer springs from its nature but rather reveals the pulled weight of the wagon. (NA XXVI, 204/KL 163–4)

The palfrey, by contrast, moves lightly and appears to weigh nothing: its movements are “an effect of its nature than has been left to itself” (NA XXVI, 205/KL 164). This, Schiller says, is a kind of autonomy: the palfrey is determined by its own nature, not by gravity or function. The beauty of animals generally decreases the more they appear determined by gravity, not form: in the case of a light-footed horse, form masters matter; in the case of a duck, matter masters form (NA XXVI, 205/KL 164). This analysis allows Schiller to extend his claim that aesthetic judgments are, like moral judgments, a product of practical, not theoretical, reason. Moral actions are self-determining because they follow the form of the moral law, never accounting for external factors. If something in the sensible world appears to be similarly self-determining, it will be “an analogy of the pure determination of the will” and so an “exhibition of freedom” (NA XXVI, 192/KL 154). Schiller concludes that

[s]elf-determination of the rational is pure determination of reason, morality; self-determination of the sense-world is pure determination of nature, beauty. (NA XXVI, 195/KL 156)

But such self-determination is not yet enough to distinguish the highest beauty: the beautiful object’s form must not only be self-determining according to some external form but determine that form as well. Schiller articulates this distinction in Kantian terms: acting freely according to one’s form is autonomous; being the source of the form according to which one acts is heautonomous, literally self self-governing (Beiser 2005: 67; Roehr 2003: 120; Schindler 2008: 95). Heautonomy in other words occurs when the rule in question is “both given and obeyed by the thing” (NA XXVI, 208/KL 167). Beauty is thus found in a landscape “if all of the particular parts out of which it is constituted play along together so well that they set their own limitations” (NA XXVI, 213/KL 171), or in a dance in which dancers interact “so skillfully and yet so artlessly that both seem merely to be following their own mind” (NA XVI, 216-7/KL 174). The qualities of being autonomous and heautonomous, Schiller claims, persist in the object whether it is being observed or not. This assertion allows Schiller to achieve his second goal of locating beauty in the object rather than only in the observing subject.

Schiller also suggests that when we call an action beautiful, it is because it too exhibits a spontaneous self-determination that seems to spring from the actor’s essence. To illustrate this claim, he offers five variations on Jesus’ parable of the Good Samaritan. A man has been beaten, robbed, and left to die on the side of the road. Four strangers offer assistance, but in each case, their offer is badly motivated: by prudence or greed or out of a tortured sense of duty. The fifth man by contrast offers, of his own accord, to abandon his own belongings and carry the wounded man to safety. We call this man’s action beautiful, Schiller says, because he “forgot himself in his action” and “fulfilled his duty with the ease of someone acting out of mere instinct”. In a word, Schiller concludes,

a free action is a beautiful action, if the autonomy of the mind and autonomy of appearance coincide. For this reason the highest perfection of character in a person is moral beauty brought about by the fact that duty has become its nature. (NA 198/KL 159; Schindler 2008: 93–4; Winegar 2013: 283–4)

Schiller himself did not consider this deduction of beauty a success, and most of his critics have agreed (Beiser 2005: 61). The status of his claim that beauty is freedom in appearance is also not clear: Beiser for instance claims it is regulative since neither autonomy nor heautonomy can appear in the natural world, while Houlgate claims that the quality of being “not-determined-from-the-outside” can actually be found in the object (Beiser 2005: 63; Houlgate 2008: 37–49; Schindler 2008: 87). But Schiller’s contention that aesthetic judgment falls in the provenance of practical rather than theoretical reason laid the groundwork for his later depiction of aesthetic aspects to moral action, and his use of form as a dynamic concept is credited with offering a plausible alternative to Kant’s subjectivist description of aesthetic experience (Schindler 2008).

2.2 “On Grace and Dignity”

Schiller’s “Kallias Letters” left many themes unresolved, but the possibility of an aesthetic aspect to moral action, articulated in the fifth variation of his Good Samaritan story, became the major subject of his 1793 essay “On Grace and Dignity” [“Über Anmut und Würde”]. Using grace and dignity as concepts capable of bridging the divide between morality and aesthetics, Schiller in this essay grapples with a question formulated by Kant, namely how duty and inclination can combine in our assessment of moral worth.[3]

Schiller begins the essay with an analysis of an ancient Greek myth depicting Venus, the goddess of beauty. According to this myth, Venus possesses a belt that could impart grace to those who wore it, even if they themselves were not beautiful (NA XX, 252/GD 124). Grace is thus associated with but not synonymous with beauty: a person need not be beautiful to be graceful. Since the belt is a transferable accessory, the grace it bestows, Schiller continues, is contingent, not part of the wearer’s essence. But it is also objective; it exists whether or not it is being perceived. Since “movement is the only change an object can undergo without altering its identity”, Schiller concludes that grace must designate “beauty of movement” (NA XX, 253/GD 125; Curran 2005: 26). The Greeks also restricted grace to humans, meaning to those capable of moral sentiments (NA XX, 254/GD 126). Whereas natural objects cannot take credit for their beauty, then, grace implies an expression of human freedom and is an instance of “personal merit”. Grace, Schiller concludes, is “beauty of form under freedom’s influence” (NA XX 264/GD 133–4).

Graceful actions, Schiller claims, present us with a paradox. On the one hand, as instances of freedom, they are deliberately undertaken movements. On the other hand, they appear to be natural and even instinctive. Schiller accounts for this paradox by distinguishing between two kinds of action. Our rational natures allow us to engage in voluntary actions in direct response to our free will. But we also undertake actions that, despite being directed by the will, appear involuntary. These actions Schiller calls “sympathetic”: they occur “at the behest” of moral sentiment as opposed to natural instinct (NA XX, 266/GD 135–6; Deligiorgi 2006: 13). Acting according to the objectively determined moral law still determines an action’s moral worth, according to Schiller, who describes himself as “completely of one mind with the most rigorous moralists” (NA XX, 283/GD 149). But an action can be graceful in addition to being morally worthy if it seems to follow naturally from an agent’s disposition, motivated by feelings that are themselves the product of her character. Grace thus describes the way we act as opposed to the reasons we give for our actions: it is an expression of our “moral attitude” (NA XX, 272/GD 140). Being determined in this way by disposition allows an action to appear both necessary and natural to the point that the person does not seem “conscious of possessing grace” (NA XX, 269/GD 138).

Schiller calls a person who lives in this state of grace a “beautiful soul”. In such a case,

the ethical sense has at last so taken control of all a person’s feelings that it can leave affect to guide the will without hesitation and is never in danger of standing in contradiction of its decisions. (NA XX, 287/GD 152)

A beautiful soul “carries out humankind’s most exacting duties with such ease that they might simply be the actions of its inner instinct” (NA XX, 287/152); it can obey reason “with joy”, not “discard it like a burden” (NA XX, 283/GD 149). Grace, in short, bridges the Kantian divide: “It is in a beautiful soul that sensuousness and reason, duty and inclination are in harmony, and grace is their expression as appearance” (NA XX, 288/GD 153). Because we recognize in the beautiful soul an image of human perfection, such harmony elicits our approval and love (NA XX, 302/GD 165).

In embodying this kind of perfection, grace provides evidence of a unity of the moral and aesthetic that Kantian philosophy, in the process of making its conceptual distinctions, provisionally disrupts. Once we understand the underlying unity that grace suggests, however, we can correct the excesses brought about by Kant’s rigorous separation of reason and inclination. In addition to better reflecting metaphysical truth, emphasizing the unity of the moral and the aesthetic, Schiller thinks, will produce better results. Brutally suppressing our sensual side will not be successful in the long run:

The enemy who has been merely laid low can get up again, but the one who is reconciled has been truly overcome. (NA XX, 284/GD 150)

Although Schiller describes the beautiful soul as an ideal of human harmony, he acknowledges that circumstances sometimes make that harmony impossible. Because humans are natural creatures, they are susceptible to pleasure and pain. But whereas other animals are motivated solely by this susceptibility, humans in addition have reason. We also have a “suprasensual faculty”, namely the will, which is subject neither to nature nor to reason (NA XX, 290/GD 155; Roehr 2003: 126).[4] This means that while animals must fight to free themselves from pain, humans “can decide to hold on to it” (NA XX, 290/GD 155). When pain threatens to force a human to act against reason, her ethical nature must resist (NA XX, 293/GD 157–8). In such a moment, harmony is impossible and the person in question cannot achieve moral beauty. But such a moment also creates the possibility of a “moral greatness” that gives “evidence of superiority of the higher faculties over the sensuous” (NA XX, 294/GD 158). In refusing to succumb to pain, “the beautiful soul becomes heroic” and “transforms into a sublime soul” (NA XX, 294/GD 158). The appearance of such a soul, its embodiment in action, is not grace but dignity.

As an example, Schiller imagines someone whose extreme physical pain is evident in his body. His “veins swell, his muscles become cramped and taut, his voice cracks, his chest is thrust out, and his lower body pressed in”. By contrast, however, “his intentional movements are gentle, the facial features relaxed, and the eyes and brow serene” (NA XX, 296/GD 159). This composure in the midst of pain gives us evidence of “a power independent of suffering” and even “peace in suffering”. It is this peace, Schiller says, that defines dignity (NA XX, 296/GD 160). Schiller here qualifies his earlier claim that the beautiful soul represented humans’ highest achievement: when grace and dignity are united in the same person, he now claims, “then the expression of humanity is complete in that person” (NA XX, 300/GD 163).

Schiller’s response to Kant’s depiction of duty and inclination was taken up by none other than Kant himself, who in Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason devoted a footnote to clarifying his position (48–9). “On Grace and Dignity” has thus been much discussed in Kant scholarship both as a possible contribution to Kantian theories of moral psychology and as supporting the possibility of a Kant-based ethics of character (Baxley 2010; Deligiorgi 2011; Winegar 2013). The essay has also been praised for further developing the possibility of an aesthetic aspect to moral action; Schiller’s attention to ways moral action might appear is credited with foregrounding the role of appearances in our acquisition of knowledge (Curran and Fricker 2005: 4; Deligiorgi 2006).

2.3. The Pathetic, The Sublime, and the Tragic

In several essays on tragedy, some of which predate his period of intense philosophical engagement, Schiller continued to refine his thoughts on human dignity in the face of suffering. In “On the Art of Tragedy” [“Über die tragische Kunst”], published in 1792, Schiller begins with a fact about humans, namely that we sometimes derive pleasure from witnessing others’ suffering.[5] Again Schiller asks: what must be true of us in order for this fact to be possible? In answer, Schiller draws on the Kantian distinction between reason and sensibility. The moral law, he continues, is objectively true and autonomously constructed, whereas our senses produce states we passively suffer. Because we know this, instances in which we respond to conflict by mastering our emotions in deference to the moral law give us pleasure. Struggle against our sensuous natures in order to act autonomously, in other words, allows us to witness what is most impressive about humans, namely our free will. That experience gives us pleasure: “the very assault on our sensuous life”, Schiller says, “is the condition for igniting that power of mind whose activity produces the pleasure” (NA XX, 152/E 5).

Because we recognize our ability to overcome our sensuous nature as the highest expression of our humanity, observing someone else struggle and triumph over her emotions makes us sympathize with her, and this sympathy also gives us pleasure. In this early essay, then, Schiller defines tragedy as the art that imitates nature in those actions most apt to arouse sympathy. In other words, it is the art form that evokes the universal pleasure humans experience when triumphing over their sensuous nature (NA XX, 153–4/E 6).

Schiller follows these philosophical considerations with advice to fellow tragedians, promising to isolate the “conditions under which the pleasure of the emotion would be produced with the most certainty and the greatest force” (NA XX, 154/E 6). A tragedy will fail both if the audience’s sympathy is too weak and if it is too strongly aroused and replaced by outrage at the instigator of the suffering (NA XX, 154/E 7). The best tragedies will evoke both an unavoidable moral conflict and the hero’s willing embrace of it (NA XX, 156–7/E 9). The images of suffering that tragedy presents should be lively and vivid; they should strike us as universally true; the plot must allow the suffering to build momentum but also be balanced and varied (NA XX, 159–164/E 11–14). The most successful tragedian will use these and other principles to stimulate compassion with suffering that gives evidence of humans’ highest calling (NA XX, 165–67/E 16–18).

“On the Sublime: Toward the Further Development of Some Kantian Themes” [“Vom Erhabenen: Zur weitern Ausführung einiger Kantischen Ideen”], published in 1793, takes, as promised, a decidedly Kantian turn. Building on distinctions made in “On Grace and Dignity”, Schiller here abandons sympathy as tragedy’s defining characteristic and replaces it with a version of Kant’s sublime. Kant describes the sublime as an essentially mixed emotion: it combines humans’ fear in the face of infinite power with pride in their ability to conceptualize that infinity or withstand that power. Schiller similarly reports that we call an object sublime if

our sensuous nature feels its limits, but our rational nature feels its superiority, its freedom from limits. Thus, we come up short against a sublime object physically, but we elevate ourselves above it morally, namely, through ideas. (NA XX, 171/E 22)

Roughly tracking Kant’s distinction between the mathematically and dynamically sublime, Schiller divides the sublime into the theoretical and the practical. The theoretical sublime presents nature as an object of knowledge and indicates that we “can think more than we know”; it describes for instance the mixture of fear and awe we experience when conceptualizing infinity (NA XX, 173/E 24). The practically sublime, by contrast, concerns nature as an object of feeling, specifically as a source of danger and fear. But in being confronted by a storm or natural disaster, we also become aware of our power to remain calm in the face of danger. Such experiences isolate moments at which the individual has recourse only to his “intellectual self, to the inner self-sufficiency of his rational powers” (NA XX, 177/E 28). They allow resistance on a “completely different order”, showing our sensuous being to be an “external, natural thing that has no effect at all on what we genuinely are as persons, our moral selves” (NA XX, 185/E 35). They thus allow us to acknowledge that as sensual beings, we are never safe from disease, loss, and death, but we know that we can face even our own annihilation with dignified calm. Human beings can also be what Schiller calls magnificent: they can, through physical or mental prowess, defeat what they fear. The sublime, by contrast, shows humans succumbing to the fearful but not fearing it. Because of what it says about our moral selves, observing such dignified defeat somewhat paradoxically inspires us even more than the magnificent human’s triumph. Schiller further distinguishes between the “contemplative sublimity of power”, which includes our terror in the face of silence or the dark, and “the pathetically sublime”, which requires us to witness suffering. But the basic requirements for a representation of the sublime remain the same: it must include an objective, physical power; subjective, physical impotence; and subjective or moral security in the face of that impotence (NA XX, 186/E 36).

In “Concerning the Sublime” [“Über das Erhabene”], drafted between 1794 and 1796, Schiller continues to develop his claim that the sublime displays humanity at its most noble. Nothing, he says, “is so beneath the dignity of human beings as to suffer violence, for it destroys the individual’s humanity”; the person who, confronting violence, “cowardly suffers it, tosses his humanity aside” (NA XX, 38/E 70). But despite the fact that the forces that can inflict violence on humans are legion, resistance is possible: even when the agent cannot surmount these forces physically, he can resist them “idealistically, when he takes a step beyond nature and thereby negates the concept of brute force in regard to himself” (NA XX, 39/E 71). Counterintuitively, this means accepting the suffering and, in the process, transforming it into voluntary submission. Such a moment is a mix of anguish and happiness which is “preferred by noble souls over all pleasure” since it “establishes our moral self-sufficiency in an irrefutable manner” (NA XX, 42/E 74). The “capacity to feel the sublime”, Schiller concludes, “is thus one of the most glorious dispositions in human nature” (NA XX, 52/E 83).

The fact that the sublime can provide this evidence of our autonomy, Schiller continues, means that it offers something beauty cannot. The beautiful character lives in harmony with herself, finding “pleasure in the exercise of justice, charity, temperance, fortitude, and fidelity” (NA XX, 39/E 75). But such a person, if never tested, may never become aware of her moral powers. We should, then, be grateful for personal or historical events that disrupt beauty and produce the sublime since without sublime experiences, “beauty would make us forget our dignity” (NA XX, 53/E 84). Here Schiller reiterates his claim that the beautiful and the sublime together complete human nature:

Only if the sublime is married to the beautiful and our sensitivity to both has been shaped in equal measure, are we complete citizens of nature, without on that account being its slaves, and without squandering our citizenship in the intelligible world. (NA XX, 53/E 84)

Achieving this completeness requires practice, and art can provide us with that practice. When we encounter actual misfortune, we may find ourselves defenseless and easily overwhelmed. By contrast, “the artificial misfortune of the pathetic”—in other words, witnessing suffering in an artistic context—“finds us fully equipped, and, since it is merely imagined, the self-sufficient principle in our minds gets room to assert its absolute independence” (NA XX, 51/E 82). The more we practice this independence aesthetically, the more adept we will be at executing it in real life: witnessing tragedy as an art form, in short, is an “inoculation against unavoidable fate”; it allows us to practice sublime emotions such that when confronted with actual tragedy, we can react to it as if it were a performance and moderate our emotional responses accordingly. Of such an accomplishment, Schiller enthuses that “a human being can soar no higher!” (NA XX, 51/E 83).

Schiller takes up the question of the aesthetic value of suffering more specifically in “On the Pathetic” [“Über das Pathetische,” sometimes translated “On Tragic Pity”]. “Portrayal of suffering—as mere suffering—is never the end of art”, he says, “but as a means to this end it is of the utmost importance to art” (NA XX, 196/E, 45). This is again because suffering facilitates the moral response that reveals humans’ freedom. The more suffering we see, the more freedom we stand to witness: Schiller writes that tragedy thus requires a “full salvo of suffering” (NA XX, 197/E 46). Once the pathetic becomes sublime by eliciting this response of freedom, it ceases to be merely pathetic and becomes aesthetic.

To provide an example of aesthetic suffering, Schiller refers to Johann Winckelmann’s famous description of the ancient statue of Laocoön. Even as serpents slay both him and his sons, the battle between his sensuous self and his spiritual self is visible on Laocoön’s brow, signaling that he has not abandoned himself to fear. The Aeneid’s evocation of the serpents that pursue and ultimately overpower Laocoön provides another example: their approach is terrifying, but if

in the course of this trembling we feel ourselves elevated, then it is because we become conscious that, even as a victim of this power, we would have nothing to fear for ourselves insofar as we are free. (NA XX, 208/E 56)

Evocations of the sublime can be more or less effective: the most powerful instances, Schiller says, are when a character chooses suffering out of duty or as a means of atoning for a failure of duty (NA XX, 212/E 60). In such cases, it is not just the general human capability for free action but “the use of this capability that warrants our respect” (NA XX, 212/E 61).

Any display of freedom in the face of suffering, even if that suffering is for an immoral cause, elicits our admiration. This fact, Schiller submits, explains the possible disjunction between moral and aesthetic judgment (NA XX, 213/E 61). The self-sacrifice of Leonidas at Thermopylae, for instance, elicits both a positive moral and a positive aesthetic judgment:

Judged from a moral perspective, this action portrays for me the moral law being carried out in complete contradiction of instinct. Judged aesthetically, it portrays to me the moral capability of a human being, independent of all coercion by instinct. (NA XX, 213/E 61)

The unnecessary self-immolation of Peregrinus Portheus, by contrast, elicits a negative moral judgment by needlessly violating the duty of self-preservation, but it generates a positive aesthetic judgment because “it testifies to a capacity of the will to withstand even the mightiest of all instincts, the instinct for self-preservation” (NA XX, 215/E 64). Moral and aesthetic judgments will, in any event, often conflict since moral rigor generally is in tension with the freedom we value both in artists and their creations (NA XX, 217/E 65). The more morally a character acts, in other words, the more she adheres to a law; the more she adheres to a law, the less freely she acts and the less aesthetic interest she generates. As audience members, we would rather, Schiller concludes, “watch power and freedom expressed at the cost of lawfulness than watch lawfulness expressed at the cost of power and freedom” (NA XX, 220/E 68).

Schiller’s depiction of tragedy as the triumph of the will over the senses is echoed perhaps most famously in the struggle between the Apollonian and Dionysian forces Nietzsche credits with producing tragedy in the first place (The Birth of Tragedy; Martin 1996: 179–187). It has also generated praise and critique in more contemporary theorizing. Hughes argues that Schiller’s description of the pleasure we take in tragedy successfully accounts for several other theories, including that tragic heroes must show courage (Walter Kaufmann); that tragedies foreground “comings-to-knowledge” and tragic flaws (Aristotle); that they showcase conflict between two morally justified positions (Hegel); and that they include some kind of renunciation (Schopenhauer) (see Hughes 2015). By contrast, Gellrich suggests that Schiller’s use of the Kantian sublime to characterize tragedy places undue emphasis on the individual to the detriment of other factors that should characterize tragedy (1988: ch. 4). Indeed, Schiller’s focus on the individual’s struggle as tragedy’s focal point puts him at odds with theories that emphasize either social aspects of tragedy or the political upheaval that makes moments of sublime resistance more likely (Eagleton 2003: 19, 110; Williams 1966: 44). Gardner in addition criticizes Schiller’s rationalized view of tragedy as a refusal to accept suffering on its own terms and so as a denial of suffering’s significance (2003: 235).

2.4. Letters on Aesthetic Education

Schiller’s “Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Man” [“Über die ästhetische Erziehung des Menschen in einer Reihe von Briefen,” often referred to simply as “Aesthetic Letters”] is perhaps his best-known theoretical work. Published in his journal Horen in 1795 and written in the form of letters to his new patron, the Prince of Schleswig-Holstein-Augustenburg, they are dauntingly ambitious, encompassing a diagnosis of the French Revolution, a critique of the Enlightenment, a transcendental account of beauty, an analysis of human psychology, an assessment of art’s psychological and political importance, and an image of a new, ideal form of government designed to allow humans to reach their full potential.

The “Aesthetic Letters” begin with an almost despondent analysis of the modern human condition.[6] The state is tottering, its “rotting foundations giving way”. Hopes for freedom and progress prove to be vain in the face of “crude, lawless instincts” among some citizens and a “repugnant spectacle of lethargy” among others (NA XX, 96/E 96). Schiller lauds the Greeks for their simple, harmonious relation to their world and laments modern society’s enslavement to its manufactured needs. Recent history had shown with painful clarity that if the moral character of the people is not developed, even the most idealistic revolution will fail. A vicious cycle suggests that without the state there can be no morality and without morality there can be no state. Despite the Enlightenment’s lofty goals, Schiller laments,

we see the spirit of the age wavering between perversity and brutality, between unnaturalness and mere nature, between superstition and moral unbelief; and it is only through an equilibrium of evils that it is still sometimes kept within bounds. (NA XX, 320–21/E 97)

The “moral possibility”, Schiller simply concludes, “is lacking”.

Among the culprits to be blamed for this condition are the Enlightenment’s over-emphasis on reason and its eschewing of sentiment—factors that Schiller suggests led to the French Revolution’s barbaric excesses. “The development of man’s capacity for feeling”, Schiller concludes, “is, therefore, the more urgent need of our age” (NA XX, 332/E 107). What more specifically is needed is an instrument that can develop this capacity for feeling without neglecting humans’ rational capacities. In Letter Nine he offers his solution: “This instrument is fine art” (NA XX, 333/E 108). The artist, then, is called upon to influence the world for the good, resisting the distractions of the present in the interest of humanity itself. Schiller exhorts his fellow artists to surround their contemporaries with

the great and noble forms of genius, and encompass them about with the symbols of perfection, until semblance conquer reality, and art triumph over nature. (NA XX, 336/E 111)

At this point, however, Schiller admits a problem: historically speaking, art has often had a corrupting effect. Perhaps we should resist being “delivered up to her enervating influence” (NA XX, 340/E 114). Before we draw this conclusion and abandon art as a solution to the modern world’s ills, however, we must assess what definition of art we are using to evaluate its failures. But against what are we to assess historical definitions of art? Such an inquiry would seem to presuppose a concept of beauty; if that concept itself comes from historical examples, the question of how to evaluate art objectively remains unresolved. An adequate analysis of art’s potential, then, would seem to require an ahistorical definition of beauty. Again channeling Kant’s transcendental method, Schiller then suggests that “perhaps experience is not the judgment seat before which such an issue can be decided” (NA XX, 340/E 114). Instead, any definition of beauty would “have to be deduced from the sheer potentialities of our sensuo-rational nature” (NA XX, 340/E 115); the pursuit of beauty requires a “pure concept of human nature as such”. Since this concept in turn cannot be derived from experience, we must follow “the transcendental way” to truth (NA XX, 341/E 115).

Schiller thus begins, in Letter 11, with an examination of human nature. At the highest level of abstraction, he suggests, we find in humans a distinction between the person and his condition or “the self and its determining attributes” (NA XX, 341/E 115). The self Schiller associates with autonomous personhood, independence, and form; our condition he associates with embodiment, dependence, and matter. These two fundamentally opposed sides do, however, coexist in humans, resulting in the imperative that they be brought into harmony: each person is to “externalize all that is within him and give form to all that is outside him” (NA XX, 344/E 118).

In Letter 12, Schiller claims that humans are impelled towards the fulfillment of this imperative by two corresponding drives, the form drive [Formtrieb] and the sense drive [Sachtrieb].[7] The sense drive “proceeds from the physical existence of man” (NA XX, 344/E 118). It situates the human within time and so within change:

man in this state is nothing but a unit of quantity, an occupied moment of time—or rather, he is not at all, for his personality is suspended as long as he is ruled by sensation. (NA XX, 345/E 119)

The form drive by contrast affirms the person as constant throughout change; it

annuls time and annuls change. It wants the real to be necessary and eternal, and the eternal and the necessary to be real. In other words, it insists on truth and on the right. (NA XX, 346/E 120)

In action, the form drive is concerned with dignity; the sense drive is concerned with self-preservation. In politics, the form drive results in abstract principles; the sense drive results in lawlessness.

In Letter 14, Schiller suggests that when a human experiences both these drives in balance—when he is “at once conscious of his freedom and sensible of his existence” and can “feel himself matter and come to know himself as mind”—a new drive is awakened, namely the play drive [Spieltrieb] (NA XX, 353/E 126). In the play drive, both other drives “work in concert”: they are “directed toward annulling time within time, reconciling becoming with absolute being and change with identity” (NA XX, 353/E 126). In holding the first two drives in harmony, the play drive frees humans of the domination of each:

To the extent that it deprives feelings and passions of their dynamic power, it will bring them into harmony with the ideas of reason; and to the extent that it deprives the laws of reason of their moral compulsion, it will reconcile them with the interests of the senses. (NA XX, 352/E 127)

If this can be achieved, the human will be given “an intuition of his human nature, and the object that afforded him this vision would become for him a symbol of his accomplished destiny” (NA XX, 353/E 126).

What, then, can awaken the play drive? In Letter 15, Schiller suggests that each drive also has an object. The object of the sense drive is life; the object of the form drive is form. Because the play drive allows these drives to act in concert, its object is living form [lebende Gestalt] (NA XX, 355/E 128). Living form, in turn, is nothing less than beauty. Beautiful objects, then, can put humans in the state in which we realize our highest potential. When, to use Schiller’s example, we contemplate the Juno Ludovisi, we feel our sense drive and our form drive perfectly equalized. In such a moment, “we find ourselves at one and the same time in a state of utter repose and extreme agitation” (NA XX, 360/E 132).

Since the contemplation of beauty leaves us dominated neither by the sense drive nor by the form drive, the play drive “gives rise to freedom” (NA XX, 373/E 143); it allows the will, which exists independently of both drives, to choose between them (NA XX, 371/E 142). This freedom does not correlate to our ability to articulate and follow the moral law. Freedom is rather the ability to survey both this law and our sensuous desires and choose between them. In facilitating this ability and so enabling freedom, the contemplation of beauty completes the concept of human nature (NA XX, 355/E 128). So as soon as reason “utters the pronouncement: let humanity exist, it has by that very pronouncement also promulgated the law: let there be beauty” (NA XX, 356/E 129). Play, Schiller then reiterates, allows humans to fulfill their very natures: “man only plays when he is in the fullest sense of the word a human being, and he is only fully a human being when he plays” (NA XX, 359/E 131).

Beauty’s ability to free our minds of determinations explains an apparent paradox. On the one hand, beauty does not produce knowledge or build character (NA XX, 377/E 147). But on the other hand, precisely because beauty accomplishes nothing, “something is achieved”; when our drives are brought into harmony, our will can actually choose freely. So defined, the aesthetic state is “the most fruitful of all in respect of knowledge and morality”; by committing neither to form nor to matter, it contains maximum potential for both (NA XX, 379/E 148). “This lofty equanimity and freedom of the spirit, combined with power and vigor”, Schiller says, “is the mood in which a genuine work of art should release us”; after witnessing such art, we “shall with equal ease turn to seriousness or to play, to repose or to movement, to compliance or to resistance” (NA XX, 380/E 149). In facilitating this condition, beauty gives us the “gift of humanity itself”, Schiller says; it is our “second creatress” (NA XX, 378/E 147–8). Our status as finite creatures means that this state will remain only an ideal that each particular art—music, painting, sculpture, etc.—must struggle to approach in its own way (NA XX, 380–1/E 149–50). But all genuine art will produce a state of equilibrium that puts the will in a position of maximum power and self-determination (Beiser 2005: 155).

The kind of experiences required for each human to reach the aesthetic condition will vary. To address this fact, Schiller postulates a dichotomy within beauty itself. Energizing beauty, he says, tenses us: it braces our nature and encourages prompt reaction. Such beauty is necessary for the “sensuous man” who feels too much and can be brought to equilibrium by exposure to form or thought. Melting beauty, by contrast, releases: it relaxes our natures and is especially necessary for the “spiritual man” who thinks too much and needs to be brought to beauty by his senses. Both kinds of beauty can be dangerous: energizing beauty can become extravagance, and melting beauty can result in stifled energy or emptiness (NA XX, 360–2/E 133–4). But when they combine to produce a harmony that cancels their respective extremes, they can allow individual humans to reach their highest potential.

Building on these distinctions, Schiller claims in Letter 24 that both individual humans and humanity in general must follow three developmental stages: physical, aesthetic, and moral (NA XX, 388/E 156). In their initial natural state, humans are ruled by nature. When reason begins to stir, “man leaves the narrow confines of the present in which mere animality stays bound, in order to strive towards an unlimited future” (NA XX, 390/E 159). But because reason seems entirely opposed to natural life, its unconditional laws are experienced as only coercive: humans then either resist reason’s law, resorting to eudaemonism, or enslave themselves to it, denying their sensuous natures entirely (NA XX, 390–1/E 158–9). Beauty, by contrast, can unite humans’ natural and rational sides; it can facilitate our entry into the “world of ideas” but without leaving behind “the world of sense” (NA XX, 396/E 163). It can, then, convince us that the moral law is not a foreign imposition and allow us to live in harmony with its dictates.

In Letters 26 and 27, Schiller imagines the circumstances that must have been necessary for early humans to develop an aesthetic sense. Traces of play can be found in nature whenever there is an abundance of resources: lions play when they have excess energy and are not under threat; plants send out more shoots than necessary when they are adequately nourished, squandering energy “in a movement of carefree joy” (NA XX, 406/E 173). Similar abundance among humans inspires “indifference to reality and interest in semblance [Schein]”: interest, that is, in a new layer of meaning and significance that humans recognize as their own creation. Semblance is positioned between “stupidity” and truth, both of which “seek only the real” (NA XX, 399/E 165). A nature that delights in semblance, by contrast, is “no longer taking pleasure in what it receives, but in what it does” (NA XX, 399/E 167; Sharpe 2005: 161–2). Semblance is evident in adorned weapons, the transition of movement into dance, and the evolution of desire into love. When we find such “traces of a disinterested and unconditional appreciation of pure semblance”, the people in question have “started to become truly human” (NA XX, 405/E 171–2).

In a final set of distinctions, Schiller somewhat suddenly applies his tripartite analysis to political states. In the “dynamic state of rights”, humans limit each other’s behavior through force. In the “ethical state”, humans curb their desires out of respect for an abstract moral law. The third option Schiller calls “the aesthetic state”, which, he claims, has the highest potential since it “consummates the will of the whole through the nature of the individual” (NA XX, 410/E 176). In the aesthetic state, citizens do their duty out of inclination, encourage the balancing of their fellow citizens’ rational and sensual capacities, and act as unified, harmonious human beings (Beiser 2005: 163; Dahlstrom 2008: 101–2). In such a state, no privilege or autocracy can be tolerated. Schiller admits in the last paragraph that “such a state of aesthetic semblance” is rare but exists in “a few chosen circles” in which humans are governed by their aesthetic nature and so exist in freedom and cooperation with others (NA XX, 412/E 178).

The ending to the Letters has left many readers confused and dissatisfied, as evidenced by its mostly unfavorable reception among Schiller’s contemporaries (Wilkinson and Willoughby cxxxiii ff). Schiller seems to be unclear regarding whether the aesthetic state is the means to the achievement of full humanity or whether it is an end; he seems, in short, not to have answered one of his original questions, namely which must come first, a good state or good citizens (Roehr 2003: 133–4; Sharpe 2005: 160). Schiller has also been accused of encouraging elitism and a retreat into apoliticism through his image of an aesthetic state, a charge most powerfully leveled in the next century by Marxist critics (Sharpe 1995: 91). Others by contrast see the Letters as a testament to Schiller’s political engagement and republicanism (Beiser 2005: 123 ff; López 2011; Moggach 2008; Schmidt 2009). There is, in any case, no doubt that the Aesthetic Letters were enormously influential. The concept of play has been taken up and developed by philosophers such as Charles Sanders Peirce and Hans-Georg Gadamer (Wilkinson and Willoughby 1967: clxxxviii–ix; Gadamer 1975: 101–34). The idea of play specifically as a cure for alienation influenced the Frankfurt School through the writings of Herbert Marcuse: indeed, according to Terry Eagleton, “[t]he whole radical aesthetic tradition from Coleridge to Herbert Marcuse … draws sustenance from [Schiller’s] prophetic denunciation” of the modern condition (1990: 118; Marcuse 1955: 185–196; Guyer 2008; Sharpe 1991: 90–92; Saranpa 2002: 70–8). Jürgen Habermas found in Schiller’s idea of an aesthetic state a vision of a “communicative, community-building, solidarity-giving force of art” (1985: 59–64), in which art is capable of “revolutionizing the conditions of mutual understanding” (1985: 46, 49): a vision that, however problematic, he sees as a source of insight into the nature of modern politics.

The title of Schiller’s essay “On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry” [“Über naïve und sentimentalische Dichtung”] (1795–6), articulates another distinction Schiller uses to explore and define the modern human condition. To ground the essay’s fundamental dichotomy, Schiller again takes a fact of human experience and then asks what else must be true of humans in order for this fact to be possible. This time his subject is the pleasure humans take in nature. What explains our “many fondnesses for flowers and animals, for simple gardens, for walks, for the land”? (NA XX, 413/E 179). Schiller agrees with Kant that our pleasure cannot be only a response to their beauty since our delight in a birdsong is destroyed if we discover that it was produced by human imitation. This reaction suggests, Schiller thinks, that our enjoyment of nature is not aesthetic but moral. It is not the flower or animal itself that gives us pleasure but

an idea portrayed by them that we cherish in them. We treasure the silent creativity of life in them, the fact that they act serenely on their own, being there according to their own laws; we cherish that inner necessity, that eternal oneness with themselves. (NA XX, 414/E 180)

In other words, natural objects display a harmony and unity that we feel we once enjoyed and, as rational creatures, have lost. Our pleasure mixed with melancholy indicates that “they are what we were; they are what we should become once more”. The resulting emotion is sublime since it mixes the pain of longing for lost unity with the pleasure of having “an advantage that they lack”: their natures are determined, whereas humans are self-determining (NA XX, 414–15/E 180–1).

This sublime response is not, however, limited to our experience of nature but can be prompted by interactions with humans as well. When our reaction to another human’s behavior combines melancholy at what we have lost with the pleasure of superiority, we call that person naïve. A child who responds to an impoverished stranger by offering her father’s wallet makes us both smile at her basic goodness and ashamed of our lost innocence (NA XX, 421/E 186). When even adults act according to pure ideals despite evidence of the world’s corruption, we also call them naïve, reflecting both amusement at their ignorance and respect for their purity. The artistic genius also exhibits a kind of naïveté: she is “guided solely by nature or instinct” and acts with “simplicity and ease” that seems out of place in the cruel, calculating world (NA XX, 424/E 189). The naïve artist names things “by their right name and in the most straightforward manner” (NA XX, 427/E 191), unconcerned with social connotations or norms. Naïveté generally, then, is characterized by purity, simplicity, directness, and ease.

Although naïveté exists in the modern world, it was much more prevalent among the ancient Greeks. This fact again relates to conceptions of nature. The naïve poet simply imitates nature. This unreflective response means the poet “can have only a single relation to his object and, in this respect, he has no choice regarding the treatment” (NA XX, 440/E 204). Modern humans, by contrast, have a more developed sense of self and are therefore keenly aware of their separation from nature. When we compare modern depictions of nature to those of the ancient Greeks, what strikes us is that the Greek poet’s portrayal “contains no more special involvement of the heart”; he “does not cling to nature with the fervor, sensitivity, and sweet melancholy that we moderns do” (NA XX, 429/E 194). The reason, Schiller says, is that in the divisiveness of the modern world, nature “has disappeared from our humanity, and we reencounter it in its genuineness only outside of humanity in the inanimate world” (NA XX, 430/E 194). The ancient poet by contrast had not lost nature and so felt no need to rediscover it. Ancient poets, Schiller concludes, “felt naturally, while we feel the natural” (NA XX, 431/E 195).

In contrast to the naïve poet’s direct relation to nature, the sentimental poet foregrounds her own perspective and reflection, precipitating a shift from objects to thought: whereas naïve poets “touch us through nature”, modern poets “touch us through ideas” (NA XX, 438/E 201).[8] The sentimental poet communicates not his feelings but his thoughts about his feelings: he “reflects on the impression the objects make upon him” (NA XX, 441/E 204). Contrasting Homer, Schiller’s paradigmatic example of a naïve poet, with sentimental poets makes this distinction clear. A modern sentimental poet, having recounted a heroic deed, “would hardly have waited … to testify to his delight at this action”; we, as his sentimental audience, would “also pause in our hearts while reading and eagerly distance ourselves from the subject matter in order to look at ourselves” (NA XX, 435/E 199, italics mine). There is, by contrast, “not a trace of any of this in Homer”, who simply recounts events directly, leaving his own response aside (NA XX, 435/E 199). Because they are dealing with the object on the one hand and their own ideas on the other, sentimental poets are always divided. They thus lack the easy, peaceful confidence of their naïve counterparts. Of his sentimental contemporaries Kleist and Haller, for instance, Schiller writes:

it is not their distinctive and dominant character to feel with a calm, uncomplicated, and easy sensibility and to exhibit the feeling in just this way. The imagination involuntarily crowds the intuition, the power of thought anticipates the feeling, and they close eyes and ears in order to sink, meditating, into themselves. (NA XX, 452/E 214)

Although the sentimental disposition is more prevalent in the modern world, some of modernity’s finest poets were, Schiller argues, actually naïve. Shakespeare, for example, does not allow himself to “be grasped” in his work (NA XX, 433/E 197). Goethe likewise manages to foreground the object rather than ideas, achieving a sturdy cheerfulness mostly unencumbered by modern anxieties. It is even possible for a modern naïve poet like Goethe to treat a sentimental topic: Goethe’s fictional character Werther “ardently embraces an ideal and flees the actual world” (NA XX, 459/E 220), but Goethe’s treatment of this archetypical sentimental character nevertheless succeeds in being naïve.[9] Ultimately, Schiller thinks poets should follow their dispositions: if a modern poet feels enough of an affinity for the Greek spirit “despite all the intractableness of his material”, he should pursue it “wholeheartedly and do it exclusively, disregarding every demand made by a sentimental age’s tastes” (NA XX, 471/E 231). It will be difficult and the effort will be noticeable, but it may work. If the poet is instead drawn to the ideal “then let him pursue this totally … without looking back to see whether the actual world might follow him” (NA XX, 472/E 232).

Despite our longing for the simplicity represented by the naïve view, the sentimental view represents the higher development of human potential. “[T]he goal for which the human being strives through culture”, Schiller says,

is infinitely superior to the goal that he attains through nature. Thus the value of the one consists in absolutely reaching a finite greatness, while the value of the other lies in approaching an infinite greatness. (NA XX, 438/E 202)

Schiller exhorts his readers not to mourn for lost unity but instead to

take nature up into yourself and strive to wed its unlimited advantages to your own endless prerogatives, and from the marriage of both strive to give birth to something divine. (NA XX, 429/E 193)

The ultimate ideal is a kind of unity of unity and division, a “structure of immediacy, its negation, and their unity” that approaches the complex harmony that is a perpetual aspiration in Schiller’s worldview and is also a precursor of Hegel’s dialectic (Dahlstrom 2008: 91; Hinderer 1991: 206).

The sentimental poet’s divided consciousness opens up new possibilities for poetic genres, depending on what relation between the two components of poetry—the actual world and the poet’s idea—is predominant (NA XX, 442/E 205). When poets take the “contradiction between the actual and ideal” as their subject matter, the result will be satire. Given the division inherent in the modern world, Schiller suggests that satire is a paradigmatically modern literary genre. Because comedy and tragedy also foreground incongruities, Schiller considers them related forms. Ironically, given his status as one of Germany’s most accomplished tragedians, Schiller identifies comedy as the higher of the two. While in a tragedy, the subject matter generates what happens, in comedy “everything happens because of the poet” (NA XX, 445/E 208). This in turn means that the subject matter is more free, making comedy the more free art. This freedom extends to the comic poet who must only “remain himself” and “be at home” in his production. Comic characters are then beautiful, as opposed to tragic characters, who are sublime: comic characters are always free and at ease, “while the sublime character is free only by fits and starts and with a struggle” (NA XX, 445/E 208). Comedy’s goal, in fact, tracks

the supreme goal of human striving: to be free of passion, to look around and into oneself always with clarity and composure, to find everywhere more chance than fate, and to laugh more about absurdity than rage and whine about maliciousness. (NA XX, 446/E 209)

If, instead of foregrounding contrasts as do satire, tragedy, and comedy, a work portrays harmony between the actual and the ideal, two further genres are possible. If the harmony is mourned as lost, the poem will be an elegy; if it is celebrated as achievable, it will be an idyll. Idyllic poetry in particular has the potential to heal humans’ divided selves: it should serve as a “tangible confirmation of the plausibility of realizing that idea in the world presented by the senses” (NA XX, 468/E 228). Executed correctly, the idyll is composed but expansive; it is still but includes movement; it is both a unity and a manifold; it depicts

the concept of a free union of inclinations with the law, the concept of a nature purified to the point of supreme moral dignity. In short, it is nothing other than the ideal of beauty applied to actual life. (NA XX, 472/E 232)

Schiller suggests, in other words, that idyllic poetry might allow the modern human to “see the legislation of nature in a pure exemplar once again, and, in this faithful mirror, to be able once again to purify himself” (NA XX, 468/E 229; Hinderer 1991: 204; Sharpe 1991: 181–9).

Schiller is not, however, content to confine his distinction between the naïve and sentimental to art. In the essay’s final section, he sketches a portrait of these two sensibilities divorced from their aesthetic application. Here the naïve person becomes the realist; the sentimental character becomes the idealist. The realist has a “knack for sober observation and a firm adherence to the uniform testimony of the senses”; as far as action goes, he submits to natural necessity, “yielding to what is and must be” (NA XX, 492/250). He aims at happiness and prosperity and views morality not as encompassed in an individual deed but in the sum of a life. He can “proceed splendidly” this way but “would not be able to lay claim, in any particular case, to greatness and dignity” (NA XX, 494/E 252). The idealist instead exhibits a “restless spirit of speculation that presses on towards what is unconditioned”, drawing “upon himself and reason alone for his knowledge and his motives” (NA XX, 494/E 252). In moral evaluation, he will exhibit a “purer morality on an individual level, but much less moral uniformity on the whole” (NA XX, 496/E 253). Since humans are not capable of consistent idealism, the idealist can be judged only by particular acts. The general public, then, will often not have much to say about the realist’s everyday behavior, but “it will always take a position on the idealists, and will be torn between reproach and amazement” (NA XX, 497/E 254).

Realists and idealists’ attitudes towards their fellow humans will also differ:

[t]he realist proves himself to be a friend of the [particular] human, without having a very high conception of human beings and humanity [in general]; the idealist thinks of humanity in so grand a manner that he comes dangerously close to despising human beings. (NA XX, 498/E 255–6)

The realist will want to make the person he loves happy, while the idealist will “seek to ennoble what he loves” (NA XX, 397/E 255). In politics, the realist will aim at prosperity and the idealist at freedom. Schiller then suggests but does not explain that both realism and idealism can, in the political sphere, be either “true” or “false”. If realism is kept true, its effects are modest but beneficial; the effects of true idealism “are, by contrast, uncertain and often dangerous”. While false realism is only somewhat pernicious, false idealism is nothing less than “terrifying”; it will lead, Schiller says in a clear reference to the French Revolution, “to an infinite fall into a bottomless depth and can only end in complete annihilation” (NA XX, 503/E 259–60).

Not surprisingly, the ultimate goal must be the achievement of a disposition that balances these extremes. The ideal of human nature, Schiller writes, “is divided up between the realist and the idealist, without being fully attained by either of them” (NA XX, 500/E 257); “only by means of the perfectly equal inclusion of both can justice be done to the rational concept of humanity” (NA XX, 493/E 250). In letters to Wilhelm von Humboldt, Schiller suggests that when the sentimental stage of humanity is overcome, ideal humanity will be achieved, and the goal articulated at the essay’s beginning will be realized: “our culture should lead us along the path of reason and freedom back to nature” (NA XX, 414/E 181; Hinderer 1991: 206). The essay concludes, then, with another tripartite development that leads from unity through division to a unification of both.

“On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry” played a distinctive role in Friedrich Schlegel’s intellectual development and so in the entire German romantic movement (Lovejoy [1920] 1947; Beiser 2005: 116ff). It likely shaped Hegel’s distinction between ancient and modern art, most notably his discussion of modern tragedy and comedy. The essay’s vision of art’s role in modernity has also been influential: Nietzsche makes use of Schiller’s definition of the naïve in The Birth of Tragedy’s analysis of Greek culture (24–6; Martin 1996: 29–44); Georg Lukács found in Schiller’s portrait of the artist a potent description of art’s task in the modern world (Lukács 1953: 111ff; Sharpe 1991: 194–6).

3. Later Life and Influence

In 1796, Schiller’s intensive period of philosophical output ended and he returned to playwriting. For his first dramatic work in ten years, the tragic trilogy Wallenstein, Schiller chose a historical topic with the explicit goal of shifting his writing from the sentimental towards the naïve (Berman 1986; Moland 2011). The plays were widely hailed as a success and were followed by four other major dramas, among them Maria Stuart and Wilhelm Tell. Schiller continued to write poetry and intensified his collaborations with Goethe, including the co-production of a series of epigrams, entitled Xenien, whose sardonic critique of their contemporaries ignited a widespread literary feud (Mohr 2007: 217). This extraordinarily productive period, however, lasted less than a decade, at which point Schiller’s always weak health failed him, and he died at the age of forty-five.

Since his death, Schiller’s thought has steadily influenced some of philosophy’s most prominent debates. Hegel and Wilhelm von Humboldt were early promoters of Schiller’s aesthetic and political theorizing (Hegel Aesthetics, 89–91/62; Humboldt, “Über Schiller”; Price 1967). His influence on British Romanticism especially through the enthusiasm of Samuel Taylor Coleridge was also substantial (Kooy 2002). Marx and Engels praised his revolutionary spirit and diagnosis of the modern age but criticized his perceived idealism (Kain 1982: chs. 3, 4; Saranpa 2002: ch. 5). Schiller’s reputation suffered greatly from its deployment in the 1914 “War of the Intellectuals” between England and Germany and from misuse of his thought by National Socialists in subsequent decades (Koepke 2005: 276–279; Martin 2011; Sharpe 1995: chs. 2 and 3; Sponsel 2011). A divided post-war Germany saw Schiller’s fame employed in support of competing political philosophies in the German Democratic Republic and the Federal Republic of Germany (Sharpe 2005: 58; Saranpa 2002: ch. 6). More recently, his vision of an “aesthetically permeated culture” has been cited as a predecessor to “modern mass-media studies” (Fischer 2011: 133). His was, in short, a vision of the centrality of aesthetic experience to daily and political life that has resonated through the centuries since his death and continues to shape philosophical thought today.


Primary Sources in German

  • [NA] 1943 ff., Schillers Werke, Nationalausgabe, Julius Petersen et al. (eds.), 43 vols., Weimar: Hermann Böhlaus Nachfolger. Cited NA followed by volume and page number, then by English translation abbreviation and page number.

Primary Sources in Translation

  • [KL] 2003, “Kallias or Concerning Beauty: Letters to Gottfried Körner”, Stefan Bird-Polan (trans.), in J. M. Bernstein (ed.), Classic and Romantic German Aesthetics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: pp. 145–183. Cited KL followed by page number.
  • [GD] 2005, “On Grace and Dignity”, Jane V. Curran (trans.), in Jane V. Curran and Christophe Fricker (eds.), Schiller’s ‘On Grace and Dignity’ in Its Cultural Context: Essays and a New Translation, Rochester, NY: Camden House: pp. 123–170. Cited GD followed by page number.
  • [E] 1993, Essays, Daniel O. Dahlstrom and Walter Hinderer (eds.), New York: Continuum. Cited E followed by page number.
    • “On the Art of Tragedy”, Daniel O. Dahlstrom (trans.)
    • “On the Sublime”, Daniel O. Dahlstrom (trans.)
    • “On the Pathetic”, Daniel O. Dahlstrom (trans.)
    • “Concerning the Sublime”, Daniel O. Dahlstrom (trans.)
    • “Letters on the Aesthetic Education of Man”, Elizabeth M. Wilkinson and L. A. Willoughby (trans.)
    • “On Naïve and Sentimental Poetry”, Daniel O. Dahlstrom (trans.)

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  • –––, 2003, Sweet Violence: The Idea of the Tragic, London: Blackwell Publishing.
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