Supplement to Friedrich Daniel Ernst Schleiermacher

Schleiermacher’s Historiography of Philosophy

After eighteenth-century historians of philosophy such as Brucker and Tiedemann had written the history of philosophy in interpretively questionable, Whiggish terms as a march of progress toward the supposedly true Leibnizian-Wolffian philosophy, and in a context in which both Kant and Hegel themselves and their myriad followers were busy writing the history of philosophy in interpretively questionable, Whiggish terms as a march of progress toward their own supposedly true philosophical positions, Schleiermacher entered the scene as an important and influential champion of interpretive scrupulousness in the historiography of philosophy.

His hermeneutics developed a demanding general methodology for interpretation that proved very influential and beneficial for work on the history of philosophy in particular. As we have seen, that methodology was largely motivated by the problem of the intellectual distance that usually separates an interpreter from the interpretee, and the natural tendency to misunderstanding that this creates. In response, he recommends that the interpreter take a broad range of careful measures. These include keeping the question of the author’s meaning sharply separate from that of its truth; paying close attention to the author’s historical context; identifying the patterns of word-use in the author’s background language, as well as his own distinctive modifications of them (since patterns of word-use constitute meanings or concepts); hypothesizing the nature of the author’s distinctive psychology as an aid to understanding his text; and bringing several sorts of holism to bear in interpretation (for example, reading the parts of a text in light of the whole text, and the latter in light of the author’s whole corpus, as well as paying attention to the author’s whole psychology).

These hermeneutic principles were subsequently re-articulated and further elaborated by Schleiermacher’s students, often in application to work on the history of philosophy in particular. For example, C.A. Brandis in his On the Concept of History of Philosophy (1815) drew on Schleiermacher’s hermeneutic principles in order to develop a methodology for the historiography of philosophy, as did H. Ritter in his On the Education of the Philosopher through History of Philosophy (1817). Boeckh’s more general re-articulation and elaboration of Schleiermacher’s hermeneutics in his influential Encyclopedia and Methodology of the Philological Sciences was also relevant for the historiography of philosophy.

Through the combined influence of Schleiermacher himself, Brandis, Ritter, and Boeckh, the hermeneutic principles in question came to exercise a very strong and beneficial impact on the study of the history of philosophy in the nineteenth century. Not surprisingly, given the fact that their own work focused on ancient philosophy, this proved to be especially true in ancient philosophy. But it also proved to be true in other areas of the historiography of philosophy. For example, Schleiermacher’s follower, Dilthey, applied this sort of scrupulous interpretive method to the interpretation of modern philosophers such as Hamann, Hegel, and Schleiermacher himself. Moreover, most of the best work that has been done on the history of philosophy since the nineteenth century has to one degree or another been influenced and benefited by the Schleiermacher-Brandis-Ritter-Boeckh methodology of interpretation. Even to this day, it is one of the main virtues of German historiography of philosophy that it still tends to be strongly influenced by this methodology (despite the intervening influence of contrary, and inferior, hermeneutic principles deriving from Heidegger and Gadamer).

Schleiermacher himself was enabled by his scrupulous hermeneutic methodology to make several noteworthy specific contributions to the historiography of philosophy. First, he contributed greatly to the study of Socrates and Plato, not only by bringing to fruition his own and Friedrich Schlegel’s project of translating the Platonic dialogues into German, but also by offering scholarly commentary relating to them. He accomplished the latter task in the prefaces that he wrote for the translations; in lectures on the history of philosophy that he delivered from 1812 on, which were published posthumously by his student Ritter in 1839; and in an influential essay on Socrates from 1815.

His commentary on Socrates and Plato is an important achievement, albeit one with significant limitations. For one thing, he developed an illuminating and influential explanation of Socrates’—and by implication also Plato’s—importance as a philosopher. In the essay On Socrates’ Value as a Philosopher (1815) he argued that Socrates’ great merit was that he turned philosophy away from a concern with reality, or nature, toward a concern with knowledge, and that he introduced a method that focused on proper concept-formation and -combination. If properly construed, this interpretation is correct and important, as far as it goes. But it is not entirely satisfactory as an explanation either of why the ancient world found Socrates’ ideas so valuable or of why we should. It is only likely to seem so if one happens to be a Kantian and as a result construes it anachronistically, and is impressed by it, as a sort of description of Kantianism avant la lettre.

In the dialectics lectures Schleiermacher also implies a somewhat different case for Plato’s importance—a case that is heavily indebted to Friedrich Schlegel. In the lectures he himself conceives knowledge in quasi-Platonic terms as something that can only be approximated in a process of endless striving. Moreover, in later cycles of the lectures he accords real dialogue a central role in this process, just as Plato had done (having in earlier cycles, by contrast, envisaged something more like Aristotelian “dialectic”).

Schleiermacher also made numerous more specific interpretive suggestions concerning the Platonic dialogues that are genuinely illuminating. For example, he pointed out that Plato’s choice of the dialogue form should be understood in light of the views that he expresses in the Phaedrus and elsewhere concerning the superiority of the spoken over the written word.

Schleiermacher also made progress in connection with the question of the chronological order and development of the dialogues. In particular, he performed the important service of substituting for the traditional ancient divisions of the dialogues into groups according to content, a new focus on their order of composition; and of distinguishing between early, middle, and late sets of dialogues (as we still do today). However, his conception of which dialogues belonged to which periods, far from anticipating the broad consensus about this that we enjoy today (so that twentieth-century scholars as different in their approaches in other respects as Richard Robinson and Gregory Vlastos largely agree on which dialogues belong to which periods), looks bizarre by modern lights. For instance, he assigns the Phaedrus and the Parmenides to the early period, the Sophist to the middle, and the Republic to the late! This strange ordering was largely a result of a dubious assumption he made that Plato began writing the dialogues with a fixed philosophical position in mind which he merely unfolded over the course of successive dialogues rather than changing. (The credit for developing our modern chronological ordering of the dialogues belongs not to Schleiermacher or his followers but to a different group of nineteenth-century German scholars of ancient philosophy—especially, Hermann, Nitzsch, Stallbaum, Steinhart, and Susemihl.)

Second, Schleiermacher also contributed significant scholarship on further topics in ancient philosophy, both in the form of brief treatments in the lectures on the history of philosophy that he delivered from 1812 on and in the form of separate monographs on Heraclitus, Anaximander, and Diogenes of Apollonia. His scholarship on presocratic philosophy was especially important. One of his achievements here was a careful collation of sources. Another was a recognition of the frequent unreliability of Aristotle’s reports on the Presocratics (a subject that has since been explored and established more thoroughly by Harold Cherniss and others).

Schleiermacher’s work on ancient philosophy had an enormous influence on his successors in nineteenth-century Germany, as was widely acknowledged at the time. The two most influential historians of ancient philosophy in the next generation—Ritter, author of History of Philosophy (1829–53), and Brandis, author of Handbook of the History of Greek-Roman Philosophy (1835–66)—were both pupils of Schleiermacher’s. Moreover, they generally followed him not only in their general methodology (as already discussed), but also in their specific interpretations and evaluations of ancient philosophers. And they paid him warm public tribute. Similarly, the most important historian of ancient philosophy in the generation after them, Eduard Zeller, was strongly influenced by Schleiermacher’s work, and wrote a warm tribute to it, The History of Ancient Philosophy in the Last Fifty Years with Special Attention to the Most Recent Treatments of It (1843).

Third, together with Schlegel and Hegel, Schleiermacher contributed to the growth of interest in medieval philosophy. In particular, he treated this subject fairly extensively in his lectures on the history of philosophy. After him, and in part thanks to his influence, interest in medieval philosophy would develop further during the nineteenth century, especially with Victor Cousin and his school in France.

Copyright © 2017 by
Michael Forster <mnforster@uni-bonn.de>

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