Notes to Secession

1. Reference re Secession of Quebec. 1998. 2 S.C.R.

2. Sunstein does not distinguish between an explicit constitutional right to secede and a constitutional sanction for secession in the absence of an explicit constitutional right to secede, as when secession can be achieved through constitutional amendment.

3. Reference re Secession of Quebec. 1998. 2 S.C.R.

4. The perceived need to provide an inducement to join the new Ethiopian state by providing a “bail out” option may have been what led the Transitional Government of Ethiopia to include a right to secede in both the Transitional Charter and the new Constitution that followed it. At a constitutional consultation in April of 1993 in which a number of other scholars participated, this author advised the Transitional Government to hedge the right to secede if they chose to include it in the new constitution. They did so in the manner indicated above.

5. This section draws on Buchanan 2006.

6. It is important to emphasize that Remedial Right Only theories only concern the grounds for a unilateral right to secede; they can recognize that consensual secessions are morally permissible.

7. Both types of Primary Right Theory allow the possibility that injustice provides one type of justification for the unilateral (claim-right) to secede. They allow unilateral secession as a remedy for injustice, but deny that injustice is the only ground for a unilateral (claim-)right to secede. They are Primary Right Theories, not Primary Right Only Theories.

8. This and the next paragraph draw on Buchanan 1998b.

9. U.N. General Assembly Resolution 2625 (XXV). Annex, Declaration on Principles of International Law concerning Friendly Relations and Co-operation among States in accordance with the Charter of the United Nations, General Assembly Official Records: Twenty-fifth Session, Suppl. No 8 (A/8028), p. 121; United Nations Yearbook, 1970, p. 788. Also

Copyright © 2017 by
Allen Buchanan <>

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