Until fairly recently, secession has been a neglected topic among philosophers. Two factors may explain why philosophers have now begun to turn their attention to secession. First, in the past few decades there has been a great increase not only in the number of attempted secessions, but also in successful secessions, and philosophers may simply be reacting to this new reality, attempting to make normative sense of it. The reasons for the frequency of attempts to secede are complex, but there are two recent developments that make the prospect of state-breaking more promising: improvement in national security and liberalization of trade. As the fear of forcible annexation diminishes and trade barriers fall, smaller states become feasible, and independent statehood looks more feasible for regions within states. Second, in roughly the same time period, the idea that there is a strong case for some form of self-government for groups presently contained within states has gained ground. Once one begins to take seriously the case for special group rights for minorities—especially if these include rights of self-government—it is difficult to avoid the question of whether some such groups may be entitled to full independence.
- 1. Philosophical Issues of Secession
- 2. Theories of the Right to Secede
- 3. Secession and Just War Theory
- 4. Secession and the Philosophy of International Law
- 5. Conclusion
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1. Philosophical Issues of Secession
Political scientists, sociologists, and political economists attempt to describe and explain the causes and effects of secessionist movements and of states’ reactions to them. Philosophers focus on the moral issues and on clarifying the conceptual framework for thinking about secession. Philosophical work on secession can be divided into three categories: (1) attempts to articulate the conditions under which a group has the moral right to secede; (2) examinations of the compatibility or incompatibility of secession with constitutionalism, (3) attempts to determine what position international law should take regarding secession. Thus far, philosophical theories of secession have not been integrated with two areas of normative theorizing that are directly relevant to them. The first is just war theory. This is surprising, since part of what motivates systematic thinking about secession is a realization that attempts to secede often involve or provoke large-scale violence. The second is theories of territorial justice. This, too, is surprising, because ideally a theory of secession would be situated within a broader normative theory of a range of claims to territory, including, but not limited to claims to sovereign jurisdiction of the sort now associated with statehood.
It is useful to distinguish secession from other ways in which “separation” or “state-breaking” can occur. In what might be called secession in the classic sense, a group in a portion of the territory of a state attempt to create a new state there; secessionists attempt to exit, leaving behind the original state in reduced form. Second, there is irredentist secession, wherein the attempt is not to create a new state, but to merge the seceding territory with a neighboring state. This typically occurs when the majority in the seceding area are of the same ethno-nationality as that which is predominant in the neighboring state. A third case, exemplified by the dissolution of Czechoslovakia, occurs when there is agreement between the populations or at least the leaders of two regions (which together comprise the whole territory of the state), to split the state into two new states. A fourth case is that of externally imposed partition of an existing state into two or more new states. In the past partition usually occurred when a deal was struck between two powerful neighboring states at the expense of the state that was partitioned, as with the partitioning of Poland between Nazi Germany and the Soviet Union. At present, externally imposed partition is more likely to be considered as a last resort for dealing with intractable ethno-national conflict within a state. In what follows, the focus is on secession in the classical sense, but with some attention also to irredentist secession.
1.1 The distinction between a (mere) justification and having a claim-right
We begin with a distinction between unilateral and consensual secession. The former is secession without the consent of the state from which a portion of territory is taken by the seceding group or without constitutional sanction. A theory of the right to unilateral secession is most urgently needed, not only because unilateral secession occurs more frequently than consensual secession, but also because it is both more controversial and more likely to result in large-scale violence.
Consensual secession results either from a negotiated agreement between the state and the secessionists (as occurred when Norway seceded from Sweden in 1905) or through constitutional processes (as the Supreme Court of Canada recently envisioned for the secession of Quebec). Constitutionally sanctioned secession is achieved either by the exercise of an explicit constitutional right to secede (which only a few constitutions currently contain) or by constitutional amendment.
A second important distinction is between being justified in seceding unilaterally and have a (claim-) right to unilateral secession. It is not always clear whether a theorist is advancing a theory of the conditions under which secession is morally justified (that is, the conditions under which a group has a moral liberty-right or mere moral permission to secede), or a theory of the conditions under which a group has the claim-right to secede unilaterally. Talk about “the right to secede” is often ambiguous between these alternatives. A claim-right includes not only a liberty-right or mere permission (i.e., that a group is justified in seceding in the sense that if they do so they do not thereby act impermissibly), but also a correlative obligation on the part of others not to interfere with the attempted secession.
The distinction between establishing that a group is morally justified in unilaterally seceding (in the sense of having a liberty-right) and establishing that the group has a moral claim-right to unilaterally secede is crucial, though it is rarely explicitly drawn by philosophers writing about secession. Having the liberty-right does not imply having the claim-right: a group might be morally justified in seceding and yet it might not be the case that others (including the state from which the group is seceding) are obligated to refrain from interfering with the group’s attempt to secede.
Therefore, an argument that suffices to establish that a group is justified in seceding under such and such conditions may not suffice to establish that the group has a (claim-) right to secede under those conditions. Yet when philosophers attempt to develop a moral theory of secession by appealing to intuitions about hypothetical examples of secession, it is often unclear whether the intuition elicited is about the moral justifiability of the secession (the mere permissibility) or about the existence of a moral claim-right.
1.2 Constitutional theorizing about secession
Some philosophers have distinguished between the question of whether and, if so, under what conditions a group has a moral claim-right to secede and the question of whether and, if so, under what conditions a constitution ought to or may permissibly include a right to secede. For example, while acknowledging that secession may sometimes be morally justified (where this presumably means the group in question has the claim-right to secede), Cass Sunstein has argued that constitutional recognition of a right to secede is incompatible with the principles of constitutionalism (or at least democratic constitutionalism) (Sunstein 1991). Sunstein argues that a basic principle of constitutionalism is that political institutions, including the constitution itself, must be designed to encourage citizens to engage in the hard work of democratic politics, where this means competing in the public forum on grounds of principle, with a minimum of strategic bargaining. Following Albert O. Hirschman (1970), he then contends that if the constitution acknowledges a right to secede, then discontent minorities will be tempted to shirk the hard work of principled, democratic politics either by seceding when the majoritarian decisions go against their preferences or by using the threat of secession as a strategic bargaining tool as a de facto veto over majority rule. In either case, democracy will be undermined.
However, as Buchanan has argued (1991: 132), Sunstein fails even to consider the possibility that a constitution could so hedge the right to secede as to reduce the threat of exit by minorities to acceptable proportions. The analogy here is with the right of constitutional amendment as found in the United States Constitution. This right is significantly hedged: two super-majorities, one in the Congress, the other among the States, are required for amendment. Similarly, an appropriately hedged right to secede is not incompatible with the principles of constitutionalism: well-designed procedural hurdles (super-majorities, waiting periods, etc.) can make secession sufficiently difficult as to avoid an unacceptable risk of premature exit or strategic bargaining by minorities, while still making secession possible under appropriate conditions. The current Ethiopian Constitution in fact includes such a hedged right to secede, requiring not only two super-majorities in favor of secession, but also a waiting period. So, although appropriate constitutional design regarding secession must cope with the risks that secession will impair democratic processes, constitutional recognition of a right to secede does not appear to be incompatible with constitutionalism.
Wayne Norman goes further, arguing that there are significant advantages to constitutionalizing conflicts over secession (Norman 2003). The Supreme Court of Canada recently took the same position, arguing that the potentially disruptive process of secession by Quebec can be subjected to the rule of law by a process of negotiation and constitutional amendment.
There is yet another argument for including a right to secede in a constitution. In some cases, when a new political entity is being created out of two or more independent or semi-autonomous entities, including a right to exit in the constitution of the new entity may be necessary as an inducement to join the new union. Under conditions of uncertainty as to how the new union will work, constitutional recognition of a “bail out” option may be necessary to get the new union going (Buchanan 1991: ch. 4).
There is much philosophical work to be done on the question of when and, if so, how the right to secede might be constitutionalized. It will require both an account of the principles of constitutionalism and of the morality of secession and an empirically based knowledge of the conditions under which various constitutional arrangements can be reasonably expected to realize the principles of constitutionalism in a manner that is consistent with secession.
2. Theories of the Right to Secede
In the philosophical literature a putatively exhaustive distinction is drawn between two theories of the right to secede (understood as a unilateral claim-right): Remedial right only theories and primary right theories. Remedial right only theories analogize the right to secede to the right to revolution, understanding it as a right that a group comes to have only as a result of violations of other rights. On this view secession is justified only as a remedy of last resort for persistent and serious injustices. The right to unilateral secession thus understood is not primary, but rather derivative upon the violation of other, more basic rights; hence the label “remedial right only.” Sometimes the term “just cause theories” is used to refer to remedial right only theories and the term “choice theories” to refer to primary right theories.
Different versions of remedial right only theories specify different lists of the injustices that can ground the remedial right. Consider, for example, a remedial right only theory that includes among the grounds for the (unilateral) right to secede the following: (a) large-scale and persistent violations of basic human rights, (b) unjust taking of the territory of a legitimate state (where secession is simply the taking back of wrongly taken territory, as with the secession of the Baltic Republics from the Soviet Union in 1991), and (c) in certain cases, the state’s persisting violation of agreements to accord a minority group limited self-government within the state (Buchanan 2004) or perhaps even refusal to enter into negotiations aimed at agreement on an intrastate autonomy regime. A more austere remedial right only theory would recognize only (a), persistent, large-scale violations of basic human rights (in the most extreme case, genocide or other mass killings) as sufficient to justify unilateral secession.
Primary right theories of the unilateral right to secede recognize that a group can have a right to secede on remedial grounds, but they contend that the (unilateral) right to secede can exist even when the group has not been subject to any injustice. This second type of theory thus holds that there is a right to unilateral secession over and above whatever remedial and hence derivative right there may be.
Primary right theories are of two types: Ascriptivist (predominantly nationalist) theories and plebiscitary (or majoritarian) theories. The former hold that certain groups whose memberships are defined by what are sometimes called ascriptive characteristics, simply by virtue of being those sorts of groups, have a unilateral (claim-)right to secede. Ascriptive characteristics are those that are attributed to individuals independently of their choice and include being of the same nation or being a “distinct people.” The most common form of ascriptivist theory holds that nations as such have a right of self-determination that includes the right to secede in order to have their own state.
Plebiscitary theories, in contrast, hold that the (pro tanto) unilateral moral claim-right to secede exists if a majority residing in a portion of the state chooses to have their own state there, regardless of whether or not they have any common characteristics, ascriptive or otherwise, other than the desire for independence. They need not be co-nationals or members of a distinct people or culture. Rather, they need only constitute a group that is capable of establishing an autonomous government with the capacity to fulfill the political functions necessary for legitimacy.
What the two types of primary right theories have in common is that they do not require injustice as a necessary condition for the existence of a unilateral (claim-)right to secede. They are primary right theories because they do not make the unilateral (claim-)right to secede derivative upon the violation of other, more basic rights, as the remedial right only theories do. No attempt will be made here to provide a comprehensive comparative evaluation of these rival theories (see Buchanan 1997). Instead, we will only identify their major strengths and weaknesses.
2.1 Remedial Right Only Theories
Remedial right only theories, as their designation suggests, hold that secession is justified as a remedy of last resort against injustices perpetrated against the aspiring secessionist group by the state. Remedial right theorists assume that a sufficiently just state has legitimate jurisdiction over the people within its territory. This legitimacy confers on the state permission to rule over its all citizens—including those members of aspiring secessionist groups. Matters can change only if the state violates the conditions of its legitimacy, which requires that the state commit injustices that are sufficiently weighty so as to undermine the state’s claim to legitimate rule. Various remedial right only views have different views as to what types of injustices are of sufficient weightiness to ground the right to secede. The most prominent view of this sort, advanced by Allen Buchanan, identifies three particular kinds of injustices for which secession can be a remedy: 1) genocide or other large-scale violations of basic human rights; 2) unjust annexation; and 3) the persistent violation of intrastate autonomy agreements (Buchanan 2003: p. 351). Recently, Buchanan has also considered the possibility of another condition: failure to enter into negotiations with the possible outcome of an intrastate autonomy regime in the case of any group that has a reasonable claim to such autonomy (Buchanan, personal communication, August 2021).
Given the tendency for unilateral secession to provoke massive violence, the obvious strength of the remedial right only approach is that it places a significant constraint on unilateral secession—namely, the requirement of a serious and persistent grievance of injustice suffered by the secessionists. To that extent, it captures the intuition that nonconsensual state-breaking, like revolution, is a grave affair requiring a weighty justification. More specifically, this view provides a plausible explanation of how the state can come to lose its entitlement to the territory: it does so by failing to do what gives states a moral claim to control territory in the first place, namely, providing justice for those within its jurisdiction.
Another strength of the remedial right only approach is that it appears to provide the right incentives: States that are just (or at least do not persist in very serious injustices) are morally immune to unilateral secession and entitled to international support in maintaining their territorial integrity. On the other hand, if, as the theory recommends, a unilateral right to secede as a remedy for serious and persistent injustices is acknowledged, this will give states an incentive to act more justly.
Some critics have objected that the remedial right only approach to unilateral secession is disturbingly irrelevant to the concerns of many groups seeking self-determination. They say that in most cases it is nationalism that fuels the quest for self-determination, not grievances of injustice per se (Moore 1998a). An advocate of the remedial right only view might respond that the latter is only an account of unilateral secession, not a comprehensive theory of self-determination. Thus, the remedial right only approach to unilateral secession is compatible with a fairly permissive stance toward intrastate autonomy, including various forms of self-government for national minorities within the state. The point is to uncouple the unilateral (claim-)right to secede from the various legitimate interests that groups—including national minorities—can have in various forms of self-determination short of statehood.
Moreover, the remedial right only approach need not reject claims to independence on the part of nations; it only rejects the much stronger assertion that nations as such have a unilateral right to secede. In many cases the groups that suffer persistent grave injustices are in fact nations, and therefore would be accorded the right to secede by the remedial right only theory. To that extent it is inaccurate to say that this type of theory ignores the realities of national self-determination movements. But just as important, the remedial right only theory, when integrated into a comprehensive theory of self-determination that includes a principled account of when intrastate autonomy arrangements warrant international support, will address the concerns of national minorities in cases in which they do not have a unilateral right to secede.
What the remedial right only approach does not do is concede that nations as such—independently of any persisting pattern of grave injustices—have a unilateral right to secede. But it can be argued that this is a virtue of the account, not a defect. It thereby avoids the objection to which ascriptivist theories are vulnerable, namely, that they endorse a unilateral right to secede for all nations in a world in which virtually every state contains more than one nation and in which nations are not neatly sorted into discrete regions of the state’s territory, but instead claim the same territories. The point is not simply that the ascriptivist view is unfeasible; its support for the idea of the ethnically exclusive state is an incitement to ethnic cleansing if not genocide. However, this line of argument can supply an effective reply to the objection that remedial right only theories neglect the importance of nationalism only if the account of the right to secede a remedial right only theory advances is properly situated in a plausible, more comprehensive theory of self-determination.
2.2 Plebiscitary Theories
Plebiscitary (or voluntarist) theories are more permissive than remedial right only theories and ascriptivist theories: they permit unilateral secession in the absence of injustice and do not require that the members of the seceding group share any characteristic other than the desire to form their own state. Plebiscitary theorists ground the right to secede in the right to self-determination (Wellman 2005: ch. 3). For them, self-determination is in itself of such great value that it can ground a right to complete political autonomy given certain conditions. The most prominent proponent of the plebiscitary view, Christopher Wellman, argues that the right to self-determination generates a right to secede if and only if (a) any group that constitutes a majority within a portion of some given territory votes in favor of secession, (b) that group is willing and able to establish a well-functioning independent state, and (c) its secession will not undermine the remainder state’s ability to function as well (Wellman 1995; Wellman 2005: ch. 3; Altman and Wellman 2009: ch. 3). Let us call (a) the majority vote condition and the conjunction of (b) and (c) the state viability proviso. Satisfying the state viability proviso is not likely to be easy in most cases, particularly where the establishment of a new set of institutions is concerned. The viability proviso, then, limits the permissiveness of the plebiscitary view.
Plebiscitary theories have many appealing features. First, they are able to avoid some of the problems that afflict the other main type of primary right theory, ascriptivist theories, because they do not require either an account of what constitutes a nation nor an explanation of why nations have a right to their own state. In addition, if a plebiscitary right to secede is widely acknowledged, those wishing to secede need not frame their case in nationalist terms, which can provoke sometimes violent nationalistic responses from those who oppose them. Second, they are less conservative than remedial right only theories, as they permit a democratic redrawing of state boundaries—which, in theory, allows for a greater degree of self-determination for the people that reside within them. This appeal to a democratic determination of state boundaries rather than the maintenance of the status quo also advances an admirable commitment to democracy, understood as majority rule.
This view, like the others, faces many objections. One worry is that the plebiscitary theory licenses morally problematic secessions of the “haves” from the “have-nots:” well-off majorities in resource-rich portions of the state might divest themselves of obligations to redistribute wealth to their less fortunate fellow citizens. In response, Wellman might appeal to the viability proviso: a secessionist party may not secede with the commodities necessary for the continued functioning of the remainder state. If they are located in a region that has the greater amount of natural resources, for example, their right to secede is conditional on their willingness to share at least some of those resources with the citizens of the remainder state. On this view, richer groups may secede from poorer groups—however, the poorer group’s reliance on the resources held by the richer group establishes the terms by which the secession may occur (Wellman 1995: p. 145).
Whether this reply works depends on how much Wellman is willing to pack into the requirement that the remainder state must still be able to “function.” Wellman’s account is somewhat vague in this regard, but it appears that he only includes the requirement that the state be able to perform the functions needed to secure basic rights and justice, maintain order, and provide essential infrastructure. If that is the case, then those who worry about licensing the secession of the haves from the have-nots might argue that the plebiscitary view permits the destruction of the modern welfare state, a form of polity that often requires significant redistribution of wealth from better-off regions to less well-off ones. Though Wellman is not clear about precisely what functions are necessary for the viability of a state, it is probable that the functions of a welfare state exceed the more minimal ones Wellman’s view likely requires. Thus, critics might argue, Wellman’s plebiscitary view is either a) too austerely libertarian or b) requires a modification and expansion of the viability proviso that the secession not seriously damage the welfare functions of the remainder state.
Wellman, however, takes another approach. He argues that the continued sharing of resources from a newly created independent state with the remainder state need not be limited to instances in which the poorer region would be left unviable without the seceding region’s support. Thus, his view leaves room for the possibility that the people in the poorer region may still be entitled to some share of the resources that is greater than what they need for mere viability- however that may be construed. Here, Wellman makes a distinction between what he takes to be two separate questions: 1) what do the citizens of the richer region owe to the citizens of the remainder state as a matter of justice? And 2) are the citizens of the richer region entitled to self-determination? As he would argue: wealthy spouses divorce their less wealthy spouses all the time. We don’t think that this inequality prohibits them from divorcing; rather, it establishes the terms by which they may permissibly do so—and these terms more often than not require continued support of the less well-off spouse beyond what is minimally required for his subsistence (Wellman 2005: p. 142–3).
The question of maintaining the wealth distribution of a welfare state, then, is one of distributive justice, and does not immediately bear on the issue of whether or not a richer group has the right to secede beyond a more minimal interpretation of the viability proviso. That is to say that the richer group’s right to self-determination is of sufficient weight to justify their secession (given the satisfaction of the requisite conditions), but it does not necessarily outweigh any commitment to satisfying the welfare expectations of those in the remainder state. The claims of distributive justice may well require continued support of the worse-off beyond mere subsistence or viability claims. One difficulty with this response is that it appears unrealistic under current conditions: once a region has achieved full independence, it will have little incentive to continue to share its resources with the remainder state in order to preserve its welfare functions and there is no effective international agency to ensure that it does so.
Critics of the plebiscitary theory raise the further objection that views like Wellman’s would result in a proliferation of secessions. The domino effect objection, as it might be called, refers to the concern that, if all that is needed to establish a potentially viable secessionist group is a mere majority vote in any plebiscite, then the institutionalization of this view will license the secessions of increasingly numerous and subsequently smaller and smaller groups. This would likely be disastrous for political and economic stability in the given regions and internationally. Again, plebiscitary theorists refer back to the viability proviso in response. The successful creation of a fully autonomous state that can both maintain political legitimacy (through the satisfaction of its political functions) and that can be reasonably expected to persist over time is a tall order—one that many (if not most) aspiring secessionist groups are not likely to meet. Indeed, Wellman argues that the likelihood of a secessionist group’s ability to achieve such an ambitious and complex task decreases as its population and resources dwindle in size (Wellman 2005: p. 7–8). The viability proviso, then, serves as a practical limitation on the kinds of plebiscites that can in fact form viable secessionist groups, which significantly decreases the likelihood that an international splintering of states will occur if the plebiscitary view were implemented.
The right to secede, of course, necessarily entails a right to the territory on which the secessionists intend to establish their own independent state. This territory will be taken, without consent, from the original state. What gives the secessionists a stronger claim to territory than that of the original state? How can the right to self-determination plus the desire of the majority for independent statehood both general a territorial claim and cancel a legitimate state’s claim to the same?
Instead of asking how the separatist group gains the right to territory, Wellman starts by asking why the original state has territorial claims in the first place (Wellman 1995). He argues that the state owes us an explanation as to why it can claim unilateral coercive authority over us and the territories on which we live. The only plausible explanation, he concludes, is functionality. So, Wellman has a distinctly functionalist view of state authority—the authority of a state over its territory and people is legitimate insofar and only insofar as it performs its necessary political functions to some satisfactory degree. A state’s claim to sole authority over a territory is thus generated by the use of that territory to the performance of its political functions (Wellman 2005: ch. 2).
In the context of this view, the existence of a politically viable and motivated internal separatist group calls into question the state’s claim to territory on which said group exists because a) its political viability proves that the state does not, in fact, need control over that territory and population to maintain the requisite degree of functionality (per the viability proviso); and b) the majority of the people in that region prefers another political arrangement by which they can satisfy the functionality requirements on their own. Given the fact that the original state does not need the contested territory to create a politically secure and decently well-functioning environment for its own citizens, the state’s claim to the disputed territory is not justified on the functionalist view (Altman and Wellman 2009: 47). The specific scenarios in which this plays out will depend on how we construe political viability, but the overarching argument from functionality remains the same: if the disputed territory is not necessary for the proper functioning of the state, then the state’s claim to that territory and those who live on it is (at the very least) vulnerable to being overridden by the self-determination claims of the aspiring secessionists.
Wellman’s view on the potentially opposing territorial claims is thus grounded in his functionalist understanding of state legitimacy and his strong interpretation of the right to self-determination. According to the prevalent understanding of self-determination in mainstream political philosophy and international law, however, the right to self-determination includes only two features: freedom from external interference in self-governance and some minimally democratic form of government such that each member of the polity enjoys equal political participation rights. On this understanding, it appears that the right to self-determination could only ground a right to territory if possessing their own territory is the only way in which a group could be free of external interference or could achieve democracy. It does not encompass a right to take a portion of the territory of a state that satisfies these two requirements. To respond to these criticisms, the plebiscitary theory needs to be supplemented with a plausible theory of territorial rights that explains how the right to self-determination can generate a claim to territory in a portion of a legitimate state in which all citizens already enjoy some sufficient degree of self-determination. More on this in §2.4.
2.3 Ascriptivist Theories
Ascriptivist theories, like their plebiscitary counterparts, hold that secession rights are ultimately grounded in the value of self-determination and thus need not only be conferred on those who have suffered severe injustice. Unlike plebiscitary theorists, however, proponents of ascriptivist views do not extend the right of self-determination to just any group. They argue instead that self-determination extends only to those groups that can be distinguished by certain defining features- such as nationality, religion, ethnicity, or other identities shared by the individuals that constitute each group (Margalit and Raz 1990; Moore 1997; Miller 1995; Miller 1998). Though various ascriptivist theories insist on different criteria that are used define the “people” or “nation” in question, they share the underlying claim that the right to secede is motivated by the right to some kind of national self-determination grounded in the unique moral claims of individuals belonging to particular identity groups.
This approach to unilateral secession has a long pedigree, reaching back at least to Nineteenth Century nationalists such as Mazzini, who proclaimed that every nation should have its own state. Critics of the ascriptivist variant of primary right theory (Buchanan 1991, Gellner 2008) argue that it would legitimize virtually unlimited unilateral, forcible border changes because it confers an entitlement to its own state on every nation (or “people” or distinct society). For reasons noted above this appears to be not only unfeasible, but a recipe for increasing ethno-national conflict.
However, those who advocate for the ascriptivist view reply that it does not require every nation (or distinct people) to exercise its unilateral right to secede and have conjectured that were their theory generally accepted not every group upon which it confers this entitlement would choose to secede. Nevertheless, given the historical record of ethno-nationalist conflict, the worry remains that institutionalizing the principle that every nation is entitled to its own state would exacerbate ethno-national violence, along with the human rights violations it inevitably entails. Thus, the moral costs of incorporating the ascriptivist version of primary right theory into international law may appear prohibitive—especially if there are less risky ways to accommodate the legitimate interests of nations, such as better compliance with human rights norms and recourse to intrastate autonomy arrangements.
There are variants of the ascriptivist theory that go some distance toward allaying the worry that acceptance of the theory would add fuel to the fires of ethno-national conflict by qualifying the unilateral right of secession for nations (or distinct peoples) in various ways. For example, the ascriptivist may hold that there is a presumption in favor of each nation or distinct people having a right to its own state if it so desires, or a prima facie unilateral right to secede for all such groups, but acknowledge that the international legal system is justified in requiring some groups to settle for autonomy arrangements short of full independence to avoid dangerous instability or to accommodate similar claims by other groups to the same territory. This way of responding to the worry about adding fuel to ethno-national conflicts comes at a price: What was originally billed as a unilateral right of every nation as such to its own state now looks more like a highly defeasible presumption in favor of independence for nations. And unless a fairly concrete account of the conditions under which the presumption is not defeated is provided, it is hard to know what the practical implications of this qualified ascriptivist view are. What is needed is an account of how the putative presumption in favor of statehood for nations is to be weighed against competing claims and values. So far, proponents of ascriptivist theories have not provided this.
Earlier, we observed that critics of the ascriptivist version of primary right theories tend to focus on the potential costs in terms of exacerbated ethno-national conflict of incorporating the view into international law. However, it is not enough to note the potential costs of acceptance of the ascriptivist theory and its incorporation into international law. It is also necessary to understand the putative benefits of having a system in which the rights of nations to their own states are acknowledged. Accordingly, David Miller has usefully distinguished two ways in which ascriptivist theories can be supported: by arguments to show that nations need states or by arguments to show that states need to be mono-national (Miller 1995).
The first type of argument has two variants: One can argue that nations need to have their own states, either (1) in order to be able to protect themselves from destruction or from forces that threaten their distinctive character, or (2) in order for co-nationals to have the institutional resources to be able to fulfill the special obligations they owe one another as members of an “ethical community”, in Miller’s phrase. Both of these considerations can, under certain circumstances, weigh in favor of some form of political self-determination for nations, but it is not clear that either is sufficient to ground a general right of all nations to full independence and hence a unilateral right to secede. Indeed, Miller marshals them in support of a weaker conclusion: that nations have a “strong claim” to self-determination but does not specify when the claim constitutes a full-fledged right.
The second type of justification for the view that nations are entitled to their own states also has two variants: The first, which dates back at least to John Stuart Mill’s Considerations On Representative Government (Mill  1991), asserts that democracy can only flourish in mono-national states, because states in which there is more than one nation will be lacking in the solidarity, trust, or shared sentiments and values that democracy requires. The second, advanced by David Miller, asserts that states need to be mononational in order to achieve distributive justice, because distributive justice requires significant redistribution of wealth among citizens and the better off will only be willing share their wealth with their less fortunate fellow citizens if they see them as co-nationals (Miller 1995). Both forms of the “states need to be mononational” argument raise very interesting questions about the motivational conditions necessary if crucial state functions are to be successfully performed.
Mill apparently based his judgment that multination states are incompatible with democracy on historical experience. However, some would argue that there are cases of multinational democratic states: Canada, Belgium, and perhaps Switzerland (depending upon whether one regards the last as multinational or merely multi-ethnic). One might also add the United States, since most Indian tribes have a legal status that approaches sovereignty.
Of course, modern proponents of Mill’s argument would be quick to point out that the continued existence of Belgium and Canada are in doubt due to nationalist secession movements. (However, at present the secession of Quebec seems very unlikely). On the other hand, it could be argued that Mill’s generalization is prematurely pessimistic: genuine democracies are a very recent phenomenon and until even more recently there have been almost no serious attempts, even on the part of democratic states, to recognize the claims of nations within states, through various forms of autonomy arrangements. So as a justification for acknowledging a right to independent statehood for all nations, with the risk of instability and violence this might entail, Mill’s pessimism about multinational democracies may seem to some to be premature. The most reasonable strategy would seem to be to do more to ensure that states respect the human rights of their minorities and to encourage intrastate autonomy agreements rather than giving up on the idea of multinational states.
The second version of the “states need to be mono-national” argument also faces serious objections. First, whether or not nationalism will facilitate or instead block large-scale redistribution of wealth will depend upon the character of the nationalism in question. Nationalist solidarity may not extend to willingness to redistribute wealth. As socialists from Marx onward have observed, the privileged minority has often been quite adept at appealing to nationalism to counteract the redistributive impulse. Second, even in cases where nationalist sentiment facilitates redistribution, one must ask: what else does it facilitate? Miller appears to argue from the fact that a morally pristine, highly idealized nationalism would facilitate distributive justice (or democracy) to the conclusion that nations as such are entitled to their own states or at least to a presumption thereof. But there are many historical instances in which the national unity that Miller assumes will be harnessed for the pursuit of distributive justice has been ferociously directed toward conquest and against non-nationals and dissenting members of the nation itself.
2.4 Situating theories of secession within theories of territory and territorial justice
As Lea Brilmayer has rightly stressed, secession is not simply the formation of a new political association among individuals or the repudiation by a group of persons of their obligation to obey the state’s laws (Brilmayer 1991). It is the taking of a part of the territory claimed by an existing state. Accordingly, rival theories of secession must be understood as providing alternative accounts of what it takes for a group to come to have a claim to territory that is at the time included in the territory of an existing state.
The remedial right only approach to unilateral secession recognizes at least two ways a group can have the requisite valid claim to territory: (a) by reclaiming territory over which they were sovereign but which was unjustly taken from them (as with the Baltic Republics’ secession from the Soviet Union in 1991); or (b) by coming to have a claim to sovereignty over the territory as a result of availing themselves of a last resort remedy against serious and persistent injustices in the form of violations of basic human rights. A more expansive reading of (b) would include among the injustices that can ground a unilateral right to secede, not only the violation of basic human rights, but also the state’s major violations of, or unilateral revocation of, intrastate autonomy agreements (as with Milosovic’s destruction of Kosovo’s autonomy in 1989) and perhaps also refusal to negotiate regarding intrastate autonomy with groups that have a reasonable claim to it.
With respect to (a), the basis of the secessionists’ claim to territory is straightforward: they are simply reclaiming what was recognized by international law as theirs. With respect to (b), the remedial right only theory begins with the presumption that existing states that are accorded legitimacy under international law have valid claims to their territories but then argues that such claims can be overridden or extinguished in the face of persistent patterns of serious injustices towards groups within the state. The idea is that the validity of the state’s claim to the territory cannot be sustained when secession is the only remedy for serious injustices.
While primary theorists like Christopher Wellman have not yet published their own replies to the objections that his plebiscitary view lacks a much-needed theory of territory, some developments in the literature on territorial rights might be used in defense of the plebiscitary view (though the way in which they do so is considerably less straightforward than is the case with remedial right only theories). Anna Stilz argues that a state has territorial rights if and only if it protects basic rights and claims of justice and reflects the shared will of the population within that territory (Stilz 2019, p. 90). She calls these the values of basic justice and collective self-determination. Stilz also claims that a state can gain the right to rule over a particular territory that is not already subject to the territorial rights of another entity when it is able and willing to satisfy these values. Wellman could use this combination of basic justice and collective self-determination to claim that a separatist group driven by majority vote that is willing and able to satisfy basic rights and justice for its members can gain rights to the territory it needs to form its own independent state—while denying the original state’s territorial claim at the same time. Whether this appropriation of Stilz’s view works depends on whether the conditions that enable the initial acquisition of territorial rights—the establishment of a valid claim to territory over a region that at the time is not the object of a valid claim by any other entity—are the same as those which establish a claim to territory over which some entity has hitherto held valid territorial rights. One might argue that the conditions for the latter are more demanding than for the former.
Stilz’s conception of the value of basic justice can be satisfied by Wellman’s viability proviso, and his simple majority vote requirement bears directly on the way in which she conceives the value of collective self-determination, namely, in terms of a shared will. Wellman could say that a group that has voted to leave the state and be independently self-determining no longer shares the relevant political will with the broader citizenry of the original state. Stilz holds that an important part of the political will is a willingness and/or desire to engage (or continue engaging) in a political project with members of the greater state. A vote in favor of secession is a clear indication that such a desire is no longer shared by a majority of that plebiscite—they do not affirm existing institutions and do not share a commitment to cooperating with them. In this way, the original state can no longer be taken to reflect the population’s shared will. Using Stilz’s theory of territory, then, Wellman could argue that the separatist group has a clearly stronger claim to the disputed territory than the original state does. Whether this appeal to Stilz’s view works will depend on whether the notion of a shared will can be spelled out and shown to be of such crucial importance that the absence of it on the part of some groups within the state defeats a legitimate state’s claim to territory.
The plebiscitary view also faces the criticism that it cannot defend the attribution of territorial rights to the particular group that seeks independence. Here, too, plebiscitary theorists might borrow from Stilz. In addition to the values of basic justice and collective self-determination, she places considerable emphasis on occupancy rights. On her view, a group must have occupancy rights to the particular territory over which they seek to claim sovereignty (Stilz 2019, ch. 2). Wellman has previously acknowledged that his position requires occupancy rights, but he has not yet elaborated on what these occupancy rights consist in. His view might be bolstered by emphasizing Stilz’s notion that occupancy rights are grounded in the importance of a region to the life-styles and culture of a group. Such an account of occupancy rights might be utilized to explain how the boundaries of the plebiscite on secession ought to be drawn.
The plebiscitary theorists appeal to occupancy rights may turn out to be a double-edged sword, however. Those who oppose a particular secession might argue that they have occupancy rights in the whole territory of the state in which they are citizens and that to have occupancy rights to a particular portion of it they need not actually be present in it. If a state has a valid claim to a territory and it allows freedom of movement within its boundaries, all citizens are usually understood to have occupancy right to the whole extent of the territory, not just that portion in which they presently reside.
The plebiscitary rights theorist could reply as follows. Even if all the citizens of the state have occupancy rights regarding the seceding region, surely those residing in that region have weightier occupancy rights, at least if being in that region is important for their individual and collective projects.
The discussion in this entry thus far indicates that all three types of the most prominent theories (remedial rights only, plebiscitary, and ascriptivist) suffer a serious incompleteness: they do not situate their views on secession within the context of a comprehensive theory of territorial justice. A theory of territorial justice aims to do at least the following four things, all of which are relevant to theories of secession. First, it should provide a coherent account of valid moral claims to territory of various types, from claims to full sovereign jurisdiction, to claims to the more limited jurisdictional control needed for various forms of intrastate autonomy (modes of self-determination short of full independence), to claims to participation in various forms of joint jurisdiction. Second, and relatedly, it should offer a coherent explanation of which elements of control over territory can be justified. A theory of territory is not only a theory of the geographical domain of jurisdictional authority but also must the right to control resources within a territory, the right of defense against the taking of territory, the right to control over the movement of people and good across borders, and so on.
Third, it should explain which groups are connected, in which ways, to which territories. That requires offering principles to guide the drawing of boundaries and to adjudicate disputes over boundaries. Finally, it would need to have a theory of what kind of agent has rights over territory (a nation? – as in Miller’s (2007) theory; an ethno-geographic group? as argued by Kolers (2009); a people? as in Moore (2015) and Stilz (2019)) and how these groups relate to the state.
For each type of theory of secession, there are unanswered questions and potential objections regarding territorial justice. For example, remedial right only theories that include unjust annexations of territory among the injustices that ground a unilateral (claim-)right to secede must provide a satisfactory solution to what has elsewhere been called the moral statute of limitations problem (Buchanan 1991: 88): how durable are claims to independence based on past unjust takings—how far back in history may a group go in making the case that they are entitled to their own state because they previously had one?
Importantly, a remedial right only theory of the unilateral right to secede will only be defensible in the end if it rests upon a plausible account of what entitles a state to control over a territory in the first place. Without such an account the remedial right only view appears arbitrarily to privilege the status quo by requiring secessionists to bear the burden of showing that they have suffered serious and persistent injustices in order to establish their claim to territory. To answer this objection, the remedial right only theorist would have to provide and defend a justice-based theory of legitimacy, arguing that what grounds the state’s claim to territory is its provision of justice, and that it is for this reason that only serious injustices can void that claim (such an account of legitimacy is in Buchanan 2013). To avoid the charge that its theory of territorial rights gives short shrift to the value of self-determination, a remedial right theory would have to show that in some cases at least a secessionist group’s claims to self-determination can be adequately accommodated by intrastate autonomy arrangements that do not erase the state’s claims to its entire territory. And it would have to provide a principled account of when claims to self-determination are adequately satisfied through intrastate autonomy arrangements short of full-independence.
2.5. Narrowly versus Widely Institutional Theories
There is another illuminating way of sorting theories of secession. As noted in subsection 2.3, some theories assume that only certain facts institutions are relevant for determining when a group has the right to secede.. The plebiscitary theory developed by Altman and Wellman (2009), assumes that the only institutional facts that matter are these: will the seceding group be able to create the institutions needed for it to function and will the remainder state’s institutions allow it to continue to function. In other words, on their view, the only institutional interests relevant to determining whether a right to secede exists are the interest in the functioning of the new state and the remainder state. In effect, this theory treats secession as strictly a two-party affair, so far as the interest relevant to determining whether a group has the right to secede is concerned. Buchanan’s theory, in contrast, argues that other parties can have legitimate interests that are relevant to determining what the rights of the primary parties are. In particular, he contends that international institutional interests are relevant, including the interest in preventing human rights violations that predictably occur in contested secessions and the interest in sustaining stable and peaceful relations among states.
Altman and Wellman might reply that their State Viability Proviso does take the interests of third parties into account. More specifically, the fulfillment of the Proviso serves the interests of third parties in having viable states and in the provision of justice that comes with the discharging of basic state functions.
The problem with this reply is that, while acknowledging that third-party interests can be relevant to determining whether a group has the right to secede, it offers no reason as to why legitimate third-party interests should be thus restricted. Why aren’t the interest in sustaining a stable order of states and in avoiding security crises of the sort that secessions—especially irredentist secessions--can create also relevant to determining the contours of the right to secede? After all, whether a group has the (claim-)right to secede depends on whether other parties have sufficient reason to refraining from trying to prevent the secession and that in turn can depend on whether the secession is likely to have a negative impact on various legitimate interests, including, but not limited to the interest in the remainder state and the new state being viable.
This leaves plebiscitary theories vulnerable to the following objection: Suppose that a group within a legitimate, reasonably just state, is a majority in a portion of the state’s territory and prefers to have its own state. Whether they have the right to secede depends on whether there are sufficient reasons for other states to refrain from interfering with their attempt at secession (because the right in question is a claim-right, which features a correlative obligation not to interfere with the secession). But whether other states ought to refrain from interfering with a secession or not interfere with the state’s attempt to prevent a secession can depend on whether behaving in this way is likely to help establish a new norm of customary international law that permits territorially-concentrated majorities unilaterally to form their own states without interference. In the absence of impartial institutions to determine when the conditions for justified secession according to the plebiscitary theory are met, such a new, much more permissive norm of customary international law would be dangerous—it might encourage secessions that do not meet the plebiscitary theories’ own criteria. So, as in the case of irredentist secessions noted above, it appears that in these circumstances as well, whether other states ought to interfere with an attempted secession, and hence whether a group has the right to secede, can depend on factors other than those the plebiscitary theory allows to count.
If it is true that a range of legitimate interests is relevant to determining the nature of the moral right to secede, and if the extent that these interests are impacted by secession depends on the existing institutional resources, including not just those of the remainder state and the new state, but also those of regional and international organizations, then it follows that a theory of the moral right to secede must take into account existing institutional realities at all levels. Buchanan’s latest work on secession delves into just this—he argues that the moral right to secede is institution-dependent in the sense that whether a group has the moral right to secede depends on the nature of existing institutions and whether or not they can adequately mitigate the risks that secession would pose to various morally important interests. This means that properly theorizing the right to secede requires empirically-backed premises that characterize a) the range of morally significant interests at risk in various cases of secession and b) the ability or inability of existing institutions to mitigate those risks. If this is true, then it seems that both remedial right only and primary right views are incomplete, as neither provide these important empirical premises.
2.6 Comparing Theories of Secession
At present it is fair to say that none of the rival types of theories is sufficiently worked out for a definitive comparative evaluation to be possible. For each type of theory there are unanswered questions and potential objections.
All three types of theories must address satisfactorily what may be called the problem of authentic voice. For ascriptivist and remedial right only theories, this means providing a reasoned answer to the question “what counts as an authentic decision to attempt to secede?” (Is there some nonarbitrary way of specifying what sort of majority is required in favor of secession before it can be said that the group in question has chosen to exercise its right to secede?). Similarly, plebiscitary right theorists must provide a principled account of how large a majority in favor of secession must exist, before it can be said that the right to secede exists.
In addition, all three types of theories must articulate a plausible account of the rights of those within the seceding territory who oppose secession. For example, are there circumstances in which the anti-secessionists should be granted dual citizenship, so that they can preserve their citizenship in the state from which the secession is occurring? Are there circumstances in which they deserve compensation for losses they incur when a new state, perhaps with different property laws, is created?
Finally, as suggested earlier, the implications of each type of theory for international law regarding secession should be explained. In the next section, we explore briefly the relationship between views about the moral (claim-)right to unilateral secession and the question of what position international law should take on unilateral secession.
3. Secession and Just War Theory
A more serious lacuna in the philosophical literature on secession than the failure to integrate it into a comprehensive theory of territorial justice is the absence of a connection with just war theory. In real-world conflicts in which a group asserts the right to secede and the state denies the validity of the claim, either one or both of the parties often resorts to force. But merely establishing that a group has the right to secede does not settle whether it is justified in using force to achieve its goal of independent statehood. (In general, merely having a right to X does not entail being justified in using force to secure X). Similarly, if the group does not have the right to secede, it may still not be justifiable for the state to use force to prevent it from seceding. Remarkably, philosophical theories of secession have not distinguished between having the right to secede and being justified in using force to exercise the right. Nor have they discussed the conditions under which states have the right to use force to resist secessions when the secessionists have no moral right to secede. This is especially surprising, given the resurgence of philosophical theorizing about just war.
The key point here is that mainstream just war theory does not endorse the assertion that the violation of any right can justify force nor the assertion that force is justified if it is required for the successful exercise of any right. Instead, the dominant view is that the list of just causes (legitimate ends to be served by going to war) is more constrained than that and should reflect the conviction that the use of force is only justified if it is required to remedy very serious injustices or for the exercise of very important rights and also satisfies a proportionality requirement.
It is far from obvious how just war theory and the theory of secession should be connected. It appears, however, the use of force by secessionists would be more problematic on some theories of secession than on others. Suppose, for example, that a majority of the people in a portion of a legitimate state’s territory decide that they want their own state there, in spite of the fact that they are not victims of any injustices at the hands of the state. On the plebiscitary theory, they have the right to secede (so long as the new unit and the remainder state will be able adequately to perform the basic functions of government). If the state refuses to vacate its facilities in that region, turn over control over that portion of the border to the secessionists, etc., is it justifiable for the secessionists to use force against the agents of the state? Does the mere preference for their own state justify engaging in a course of action that is likely to result in large-scale violence? The problem here is that the purpose the secessionists can invoke to justify a course of action seems not to fit well with the usual understandings of just cause. In contrast, remedial right only theories would seem to be consistent, at least in principle, with mainstream just war theory, because the latter recognizes redress of serious injustices (and not the mere desire to have one’s own political unit) as a just cause.
Nonetheless, a fully-developed remedial right only theory would have to provide an account of when injustices are sufficiently serious to warrant secession under conditions in which there is a significant risk of large-scale violence. Regardless of which type of theory one embraces, one would also need an account of the conditions under which the state would be justified in using force to block secession. For as we have already noted, the mere fact that the group attempting to secede does not have a right to secede does not imply that it is justifiable for the state to use force to prevent them from seceding. A moral theory of secession should not be limited, then, to articulating and defending characterization of the moral right to secede. It should also provide an account of the morality of using force in conflicts over secession and one that is consistent with its view of the right to secede.
4. Secession and the Philosophy of International Law
There is yet another desideratum for a theory of secession: As suggested earlier, the implications of each type of theory for international law regarding secession should be explained. And presumably an account of the morality of secession should provide some guidance for determining what the posture of international law should be regarding secession. In the next section, we explore briefly the relationship between views about the moral (claim-)right to unilateral secession and the question of what position international law should take on unilateral secession.
The deficiencies of existing international law regarding secession motivate the project of developing principled proposals for reform. At present international law recognizes only a very narrow set of circumstances under which the unilateral right to secede exists as an international legal right, namely, when a group is subject to colonial domination or is the victim of an unlawful occupation by a foreign entity or is subjected to an Apartheid-like regime. The difficulty with this conception of the international legal right to unilateral secession is that, while clearly embodying the idea that serious and persistent injustices can generate a right to unilateral secession, it arbitrarily restricts the injustices that generate the right.
Another difficulty is that while international legal doctrine with an arbitrarily restricted conception of the situations that generate a unilateral right to secede, several important international legal documents include reference to an apparently much broader “right of self-determination of all peoples” which is said to include the right to choose full independence, and hence the right to secede. One way to conceive of the chief task for a moral theory of international law regarding secession is that it must provide a reasoned basis for removing the arbitrary restriction from which the current law suffers, while avoiding the dangerously expansive notion that all “peoples” are entitled to their own states, in a world in which virtually every existing state includes more than one “people”, in which several “peoples” claim the same territory, and in which there are no international institutional principles or mechanisms for sorting out these conflicting claims.
An important choice for the moral theorist of international law regarding secession regards the scope of the right itself. On one view, international law should simply acknowledge, under certain conditions to be specified by the theory, a group’s right to its own state; on the other view, international law should distinguish between (a) the conditions under which a group should be accorded the right to repudiate the jurisdiction of the state over a portion of the state’s territory and to attempt to establish its own control there and (b) the conditions under which international law should recognize the secessionist entity as a legitimate state, with all the rights, immunities, privileges, and obligations this entails.
The difference between these two options can be appreciated if we take the example of a remedial right only approach to proposals for reforming international law regarding secession. For simplicity, suppose that the remedial right only theory under consideration recognizes only large-scale and persistent violations of basic human rights as grounding the unilateral right to secede, and suppose that group G has suffered such violations. On the first view, the proposal is that international law should simply acknowledge that G has the right to its own legitimate state if forming a new state is the remedy of last resort for large-scale, persistent violations of the basic human rights of members of G, where this means that other states should recognize the new entity as having all the rights, privileges, immunities, powers, and obligations this status entails. On the second view, there are two distinct questions the international law of secession should address: First, has G suffered large-scale and persistent violations of basic human rights and second, does G satisfy the conditions for recognitional legitimacy, for being recognized as a legitimate state? The second view would maintain that although the group’s having suffered large-scale and persistent violations of basic human rights is sufficient for acknowledging its right to repudiate the state’s jurisdiction and attempt to set up its own state, something more is required before international law should recognize the new entity as a legitimate state; in particular, the new state should provide credible assurances that it will respect the rights of minorities within its territory.
Making recognition of legitimate statehood dependent in this way upon satisfying basic requirements of justice coheres with the remedial right only theory’s approach to secession, which involves rewarding states that respect rights. But there is much to be said for distinguishing, regardless of which theory of the right to secede is adopted, between the right to secede (understood as the right to repudiate the state’s authority over a portion of its territory and to attempt to set up a new state there) and the right to recognition as a legitimate state. New entities created through secession typically are keen to receive recognition of their legitimacy because of the benefits this confers, including access to favorable trade regimes, loans and credits from international agencies such as the World Bank and International Monetary Fund, and the ability to participate as an equal with other states in the making of international law. Distinguishing between whether a group has the right to secede (to repudiate the state’s jurisdiction and attempt to establish its own state) and whether it has the right to recognition as a legitimate state enables the international legal system to impose normative conditions on recognition in circumstances in which new states have strong incentives to satisfy them.
A fully-developed philosophical theory of what the international law of secession ought to be would be quite ambitious and complex. It would have to include not only an account of the connection between the right to secede and the right to recognition, but also a theory of justified intervention in support of or against secession that would cohere with a more general position on the legitimate use of force across borders.
Philosophical work on secession falls into three main categories: (1) attempts to develop an account of the moral right to secede (understood either as a claim-right or as a mere liberty), (2) investigations of the compatibility or incompatibility of secession with constitutionalism, and (3) attempts to determine what posture international law should adopt concerning secession. In each of these areas of inquiry, as well as in the connections among them, exploration of the moral issues of secession provides a powerful lens through which to examine some of the most important issues of moral-political theory, including perhaps the most fundamental issue of all: what gives a state a valid claim to its territory?
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- The Liechtenstein Institute on Self-Determination,
[This site links to numerous academic centers, think tanks, international organizations, government agencies, NGOs, journals and news organizations dealing with self-determination and secession.]