Notes to Sense Data

1. Broad (1923: 240) used instead the term “sensa” (singular “sensum”).

2. Firth (1949–50 [1976: 220]) suggests that, prior to Price, sense-data theorists agreed with Locke and Berkeley in positing flat or planar sense data (Firth has vision in mind). See Section 2.1.1 for an exception in Descartes.

3. It is a vexed question to what extent the notion of sensory impression or bare sensation is present in various ancient and medieval authors. Hamlyn (1961: 28) finds that Aristotle “was on the verge” of distinguishing sensation from perception. Bynum (1987: secs. 4, 8, 9) accepts a standard view on which Aristotle distinguishes between what is passively received by the senses (the proper objects such as color or sound) and subsequent acts of judgment and interpretation by the common sense and phantasia, which make for perceptions of objects. Gregoric (2007: pt. 3, ch. 5) qualifies this standard view but accepts a role for the “common sense” in perceiving objects. Lesses (1998) conveys the Stoic distinction between impression and assent. Løkke (2008) examines the Stoic distinction between passively received sense impressions and further perceptual cognitive acts that yield perception of objects and conceptual knowledge. Robinson (1994: ch. 1.2) finds a dominant theme in ancient and medieval theories of perception to be the distinction between a passively received sense impression and an active, perhaps interpretive, response. Pasnau (1997) and Adriaenssen (2017) argue that a “veil of species” problem arose in medieval philosophy, with authors such as Thomas Aquinas being accused by subsequent theorists of abetting skepticism about our knowledge of the external world by making “sensible species” the immediate objects of perception (even though the latter position was rejected by Aquinas). Pasnau (1997: ch. 3.1) suggests that William Crathorn posited intervening species that manifest natural instances of red in the case of our seeing a red thing, so that the intervening medium and the eye actually turn red (consonant with item 3 of the Classical Notion). By contrast, most adherents of species theories held that the quality of red in things causes intervening species that have a diminished existence in the medium, eyes, and sensory nerves, which receive the species without turning red, allowing the species to cause a visual perception of red as a quality of the distal object. Typical species theories thus do not affirm item 3. More generally, the presence of a distinction between the reception of sense impressions and further perceptual acts depending on interpretation or judgment is not equivalent to the positing of classical sense data.

4. Lewis (1929), for example, while rejecting traditional sense data (1929: 61), attributes to sensory experience two elements, sensuous and conceptual:

There are, in our cognitive experience, two elements: the immediate data, such as those of sense, which are presented or given to the mind, and a form, construction, or interpretation, which represents the activity of thought. Recognition of this fact is one of the oldest and most universal of philosophic insights. (1929: 38)

5. Keeling (1968: 177; also, 160) ascribes to Descartes “sensa” that are not ideas but objects of ideas. Firth (1949–50 [1976: 215–216]) finds that Locke and Berkeley posited sense data. Mundle (1971: 27, 38–44, 64–67, 72) ascribes the concept of sense data to Descartes, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. Yolton (1996: 26–27) notes that these authors have been read as predicating sensory qualities “of the mind”, which matches his conception of what “sense-datum philosophers” maintain. Yolton himself resists this reading (although he finds the position present in Hume’s philosophical persona, but not his common-sense persona: 1996: 134). Williams (1986) reads Descartes as forcing perceivers to infer the external world from a sensory given that shares many of the features of classical sense data. Robinson (1994: ch. 1.4) describes Locke, Berkeley, and Hume as sense-data theorists; so does Bennett (1971), but in ways that differ from the Classical Notion.

6. The question is debated of whether early moderns such as Descartes and Locke held that sensory ideas are the direct object of perception to the exclusion of direct perception of external objects (a version of item 1). Adriaenssen (2017: ch. 4.1) describes interpretations in which Descartes makes ideas the exclusive object of sense perception and those in which he does not, siding with the latter. He interprets passages about immediate awareness as describing an immediate awareness of the very ideas that also are direct perceptions of external objects. Rogers (2004) offers a reading of Locke as a direct realist. Newman (2009) argues that both Descartes and Locke adhere to indirect accounts of the perception of external objects.

7. On the contemporary notion of intentionality, which is related to Descartes’ notion, see Jacob (2003 [2019]: sec. 10). The notion of intentional content can include nonconceptual content. Thus, in Descartes, the intentional being of a sensory idea might present objects as being a certain way, without including the judgment that they are as they appear. This echoes Descartes’ conceptual distinction between sensation and perception.

8. An adherent of the view that Berkeley attributes red as a property to ideas might argue that this passage only indicates that the mind is not extended and colored, not that ideas are not extended and colored. The point is made difficult because Berkeley never fully articulates his notion of an idea, so that when he says that “qualities are in the mind ... by way of idea”, we cannot appeal to his theory of ideas to aid our interpretation. In the present entry, Berkeley is taken to treat ideas and sensations as presenting appearances by way of intentional content, so that item 3 is not ascribed to Berkeley. In virtue of having various contents, sensory ideas present a world as having shaped areas of extension bearing color, but we need not think of these ideas as being literally extended and colored. This interpretation of Berkeley is similar to Yolton’s (1984: 134–136, 209–210).

9. Berkeley, in his discussions of the variability of sensory ideas, having noted that perceptions of heat and cold, or figure and extension, vary with the state and spatial position of the observer and, accordingly, having concluded that such perceptions exist only in the mind, observed that, in fact, “this method of arguing doth not so much prove that there is no extension or colour in an outward object as that we do not know which is the true extension or color” (Principles, pt 1, art. 15; see also Three Dialogues, First Dialogue [2008: 188]). Hume replied to this challenge to arguments from variability at Treatise, I.4.4.4, arguing that if some impressions presented external things directly and others through a mental variant, there should be some phenomenal difference between the different types of perception; there being none, if some instances of sensory qualities are in the mind, all of those that are phenomenally similar should be as well. A related argument is found in Price (Sec. 2.2.3, below).

10. Interestingly, while affirming a material entity (the retinal image) as the perceptual datum, his position also preserved the idea that perception of the distant material object requires a further psychological act. In this sense, he does not violate the spirit of item 5 of the Classical Notion. But the retinal image, as a physical pattern of light, is not private, hence Hamilton does not endorse item 7.

11. In fact, the term had appeared in British and American philosophy, e.g., Sidgwick 1883 and James 1887; see Hatfield 2013a: 951–952.

12. The next three sections draw on research reported in Hatfield 2013a and 2013b.

13. Moore introduced the concept of sense data without the term in “The Nature and Reality of Objects of Perception” (1905–06). The paper offers a minimum characterization of what is “actually observed” or “directly perceived” in experience, which includes color patches and their spatial relations (1905–06: 101).

14. It differs from standard representative realism in not regarding the representing datum as mental.

15. In offering a fuller account of physical theory in the Analysis of Matter, Russell did not alter his basic position (1927: 10, 382), but he provided a finer-grained analysis of the unsensed momentary particulars that occupy places without perceivers. These momentary particulars, whose intrinsic properties are reached through analogy with perceived momentary particulars, are projected to exhibit structures as described in physical theory—the hypothetical entities of physics, such as electrons, being constructions from these particulars together with the sensed ones (1927: 227, 271, ch. 38). For additional discussion and references, see Banks 2014 (ch. 4).

16. Price (1932: 218–220) holds that many visual sense data are three dimensional and he effectively endorses size and shape constancy for objects near at hand, out to a “few feet”.

17. In his statement of the argument, Price (1932: 32) uses a cricket ball as his example; I’ve altered it to a soccer ball to accommodate a broader audience.

18. Price (1932: 30–32) also offers a simpler version of the argument (without continuity), which moves from premise 4 to the assertion that non-illusory experiences, as perceptual experiences, do not differ phenomenally from illusory experiences, and then uses 9 and 10 to reach 11. This simpler formulation is closer to Hume’s version of Variation (see note 9).

19. A good sense of the place of sense data in epistemology with attention to implications from psychology can be found in Firth (1949–50); Robinson (1994) also offers an historical overview.

20. Robinson (1994: 32) has labelled this the “Phenomenal Principle”, which he states as follows:

If there sensibly appears to a subject to be something which possesses a particular sensible quality then there is something of which the subject is aware which does possess that sensible quality,

and ultimately endorses (1994: ch. 7).

21. Firth (1949–50 [1976: 219–222]) groups James and the Gestalt psychologists with the American philosopher John Dewey as upholders of a “percept theory”, according to which perceptual consciousness is unified in its awareness of an external object, rejecting on phenomenal grounds the splitting of sensory consciousness into sense data and material objects.

22. Note that in his investigation of the composite nature of white light, Newton was guided by the perceived qualities of light (red, yellow, etc.). Having separated white light into homogeneal lights of various colors, he posited light rays differing in color and refractive properties (Newton 1718: bk I, pt I, def. 8; prop. 2). As he explained, the rays themselves were not colored but were called “red-making” (etc.) because of the color experiences they caused in observers (1718: bk I, pt II, prop. 2, Definition). Observations based on those experiences supported his findings about the relations between colors and refractions; he had no access to spectrophotometers or the like.

23. Jackson 1977 (ch. 4) seeks to undermine appearance theories. If that argument were successful, it would block the particular criticism of Jackson’s sense-data theory noted here.

24. Empirical support for Price’s claim for shape can be found in Howard et al. (2014), and, more generally, for size constancy, in Granrud (2012) and Hatfield (2016). Nonetheless, the interpretation of phenomenal and cognitive factors in reports of shape and size constancy remains contested (see Wagner 2012).

Copyright © 2021 by
Gary Hatfield <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free