Sense Data

First published Mon Aug 2, 2021; substantive revision Thu Aug 19, 2021

“Sense data”, or “sense datum” in the singular, is a technical term in philosophy that means “what is given to sense”. Sense data constitute what we, as perceiving subjects, are directly aware of in perceptual experience, prior to cognitive acts such as inferring, judging, or affirming that such-and-such objects or properties are present. In vision, sense data are typically described as patches exhibiting colors and shapes. For the other senses, they would manifest sounds, tastes, odors, and tactile qualities. Suppose that you are looking at a brown table with a white coaster on it; your sense data would be a patch of brown corresponding to the brown expanse in your field of view, along with a roundish-shaped white patch. Based on such data, you might come to affirm that a brown thing and a white thing, or a table and a coaster, are present before you.

Starting in the early twentieth century, the notion of “sense data” played a central role in discussions of knowledge and of the ontology of perceptual experience. In epistemology, sense data were offered as a basis for all other sensory knowledge. They were epistemically privileged: many authors held that one could not be wrong about one’s sense data. Concerning what sense data are (their ontology), there has been a change of consensus. The early advocates of sense data (explicitly so-called) mainly considered them to be mind-independent, that is, to exist apart from the mind, perhaps as a special kind of thing, neither mental nor physical. In the latter part of the twentieth century, sense data came to be viewed most often as mind-dependent, as mental objects or contents of which we are directly aware in perceptual experience. Sense data dominated discussion of perception in the first half of the twentieth century. The notion is now frequently used as a stalking horse in the philosophy of perception, as an example of a position that should be avoided.

This entry first examines the classical meaning of the term “sense data” and the concept of a sensory given. It then pursues the history of these notions, from the early modern period to the mid twentieth century, before turning to major critical responses that led to a decline in the popularity of sense data. Finally, it considers recent arguments for sense data and concludes by placing sense-data theory within a larger genus of perceptual theories that distinguish having sense impressions from the perception of individual objects.

1. The Classical Notion of Sense Data: Term and Concept

Consider your present visual experience. Suppose that you are seated at a table in a garden. You are looking at objects on the table and at the vivid colors of flowers in nearby beds. Now focus on a particular static instance of your looking: the moment in which you see a white coaster on a brown garden table with a cut daisy lying just beyond the coaster. The sense data for this scene would be the particular shapes and colors as immediately experienced, e.g., a white patch as seen out in front of you. You are looking at the coaster from an angle of about forty-five degrees. At this angle, many observers report the momentary visual experience of an elliptical white shape. (Try to experience this for yourself by observing a round coaster on a table at the suggested angle. As we will discover, not everyone agrees that the patch looks elliptical: some find a circle at a slant.) The table top is small enough that you can take it in at one glance: at this angle, many describe their momentary visual experience as containing a trapezoidal brown expanse, with the larger base of the trapezoid toward them. The daisy presents sense data of a specific yellow and round shape, white petal-shapes, and green leaf- and stem-shapes.

These descriptions of sense data focus on the basic visual properties color and shape: the facts that we are seeing a table, a coaster, and a daisy are not, in the usual sense-data theories, part of what is given. Typically, the sense data are just patches with a shape and a color; thus, if the daisy were partly obscured by a mug that had been placed on the coaster, there would be two green shapes among the sense data, on either side of the mug-shape, with no notion that the one belonged with the other. Viewers typically are, of course, aware that specific objects are present. In that case, the theory says that they have gone beyond their sense data to perceive objects or things of various kinds (table, coaster, flower), as opposed to the bare shape and color of each sense datum.

The technical term “sense data” was made prominent in philosophy during the early decades of the twentieth century by G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell, followed by intense elaboration and modification of the concept by C. D. Broad,[1] H. H. Price, and A. J. Ayer, among others. Although the promoters of sense data disagreed in various ways, they mainly agreed on the following points:

  1. In perceiving, we are directly and immediately aware of a sense datum.
  2. This awareness occurs by a relation of direct mental acquaintance with a datum.
  3. Sense data have the properties that they appear to have.
  4. These properties are determinate; in vision, we experience determinate shapes, sizes, and colors.
  5. Our awareness of such properties of sense data does not involve the affirmation or conception of any object beyond the datum.
  6. These properties are known to us with certainty (and perhaps infallibly).
  7. Sense data are private; a datum is apprehended by only one person.
  8. Sense data are distinct from the act of sensing, or the act by which we are aware of them.

This list constitutes a basic analysis of the Classical Notion of sense data. Item (1) says that sense data are not perceived by the mediation of anything else. This was often put by saying that sense data are the immediate objects of acts of sensing. Item (2) states that our mental relation to sense data is one of direct acquaintance. (3) says that if we immediately sense a brown patch of a certain shape, we are acquainted with an item that has the phenomenal brownness and the shape as present in our experience. That is, however color may be considered in physical science (as a microphysical property of object surfaces, for instance), the sense datum possesses the phenomenally present color property. (4) indicates that such properties are experienced as determinate; for example, we experience a specific shade of brown. Item (5) distinguishes the awareness of sensory qualities such as color and shape from the judgment or affirmation that a material object (or other entity) might underlie the sense datum. (6) claims that each perceiver is certain about, and, in a stronger version, cannot err about, there being an instance of brown color of a certain shape that is experienced. (7) holds that sense data are private, or perhaps that they inhabit a private space, so that sense data can be related to one another for one perceiver, but the sense data of one perceiver are not in an immediate relation to the sense data of another. (8) says that sense data are distinct from the mental acts by which we perceive them; in the Classical Notion, this typically included that they are not mind-dependent but are independent items.

It may be helpful to mention several things that are not included in the above. Sense data are described as immediate objects of awareness, but there is no statement that we therefore only immediately perceive sense data and do not immediately perceive external objects, a conclusion which many theorists accepted. Further, there is no specification of whether sense data are two dimensional or contain depth. Early theorists are typically read as asserting two-dimensional data;[2] the second wave, including Price (1932: 3, 218–220), explicitly gave some of them depth. There is no statement about whether sense data persist beyond the momentary sensing of them, as there was disagreement on this point. There is no assertion of their origin, causal or otherwise. It is natural to think of sense data as caused by objects and as being related to those objects as appearance to reality, a position expressed by some authors (e.g., Russell 1912: ch. 1; Broad 1923: 237–240). But that conception is not included here in the agreed-upon attributes of sense data in their early history. Similarly, item 5 distinguishes the apprehension of a sense datum from that of a material object or other entity; it takes no stand on whether such objects are inferred from sense data, are affirmed by a cognitive act that is not an inference, or are treated in some other way. Nor does item 5 say whether sense data represent objects or their properties, independently of a further act of judgment or affirmation; some classical theorists denied that sense data are intrinscially representational. Further, sense data were not tied to specific neurophysiological processes, even if it was admitted by some authors that they are conditioned by neurophysiological states (such as those that produce afterimages). Finally, naïve realists sometimes described the immediate apprehension of a portion of the surface of an object as a perceptual datum. Present-day taxonomies of philosophies of perception typically contrast naïve direct realism with sense-data theory, an outlook that results in part from the present tendency to treat sense data as mental (Crane & French 2015 [2021]). But in the classical period, there were arguments to the effect that sense data are direct perceptions of a part of the surface of a material object (Moore 1918–19: 23–24), a position that Price (1932: chs. 2–3) described and sought to undermine.

In the above statement of the Classical Notion, nothing explicit is said about the metaphysical classification of sense data. They might be events, substances, states of substances; they might be either physical or mental. As mentioned, the majority of authors involved in the original discussion held that sense data are not mental. But some theorists advised that the term “sense data” in its basic meaning should be treated as neutral on ontology (e.g., Moore 1913–14; Price 1932: 18–20), even if further argument led to a view that they are not mental. For the neutralists, accepting that sense data exist should be compatible with various theories of perceptual ontology, such as naïve realism, representative realism, Berkeleyan idealism, and Kantian transcendental idealism.

Early theorists who considered sense data to be mind-independent typically thought of them as persisting through time. Russell, in early sense-data writings (1912: ch. 1), viewed such data as existing apart from the mind as a special kind of thing (neither mental nor physical), which was commonly designated as a tertium quid or “third thing”, in addition to objects (such as a physical table) and the perceiver’s mental states. Such intermediary third things might be epistemically given only in the act of sensing them, but they would not depend for their existence on that act. This led to the notion of unsensed sense data (e.g., mind-independent patches of color), which were sometimes called “sensibilia” to indicate that they could be sensed if someone were at the right location, but that they existed in any case (Russell 1914b: sec. 3). In the second half of the twentieth century, when sense data came to be viewed mainly as mind-dependent, they were considered to be mental objects or contents of which we are directly aware. Accordingly, the white shape of the coaster-shaped patch would be a property of the mental object that is experienced, which was taken to mean that the mental state itself would have among its properties a white and roundish patch of color (Jackson 1977: chs. 4–5).

The initial positing of sense data arose within an extant discussion of sense perception and its objects. In Oxford and Cambridge of the late nineteenth century, it was common to discuss perception as part of the “problem of the external world”, an epistemological problem found in modern philosophy, from Descartes onward, concerning whether we know an external world beyond our own minds and, if so, how we know it. These discussions typically assumed a distinction between sensation and perception, similar in many ways to that later drawn between sense data and the perception of material objects. A standard description of how vision occurs would say that sensations of shape and color are first produced via the stimulation of the sensory nerves, and that from such sensations the perceiver forms perceptions of objects, perhaps through a process of judgment or through learned associative connections among sensations. Let us turn, then, to the history of theories of sensation and perception, and the rise of sense data.

2. Historical

The philosophical practice of separating what is immediately given to vision by way of sense impression from further psychological or logical acts of perception stems from antiquity.[3] In the optical tradition (where “optics” covered the complete science of vision, from physics and physiology to psychology), the medieval Islamic philosopher Ibn al-Haytham (ca. 1030) distinguished what is found in “pure sensation”, the immediate result of stimulating the sense organs, from what depends on recognition, judgment, and reason (Optics, II.3.25). Arguably (Hatfield 2020: 200), he included light, color, and visual direction (a correlate of shape) among the things immediately sensed. The optical tradition as promulgated in the medieval European Latin West provided a framework for the theories of vision of Descartes and Berkeley (Hatfield & Epstein 1979: 371). The distinction between (a) a core of sensation and (b) perception of objects in the world as the result of further psychological processes provided the predominant framework for theorizing about the senses into the twentieth century.[4] The proximate background for the arguments about sense data just after 1900 was set by engagement with early modern philosophy and nineteenth-century British philosophy.

2.1 The Concept of Sense Data in the Modern Period

In discussions of early modern philosophy in the second half of the twentieth century, Descartes, Locke, Berkeley, and Hume were sometimes portrayed as sense-data theorists,[5] especially when suggesting that they abetted skepticism about the external world. Indeed, the Scottish philosopher Thomas Reid diagnosed the external-world skepticism found in Hume as arising from the theory of ideas (initiated by Descartes and adopted by the others) being taken by Hume to what Reid considered to be its logical conclusion (Nichols & Yaffe 2014 [2016]). This interpretation was known to our early sense-data theorists through study of Reid himself or via William Hamilton’s Lectures on Metaphysics (1861), in which Reid’s claims were discussed. In the latter half of the twentieth century, Richard Rorty (1979: ch. 3) portrayed Descartes and Locke as engendering a veil of perception. He did not use the term “sense data” to describe the fabric of the veil by which these authors isolated perceivers, but he endorsed Reid’s charge that they created a veil of ideas. This reading has been challenged (e.g., in Yolton 1984), and the present entry qualifies it in many respects.

2.1.1 Sense Data and Early Modern Philosophy

Several threads within early modern theories of perception provide a background for the Classical Notion of sense data. First, there was the already-noted tendency to distinguish sensation from perception, or a passively received sensory core from a further perceptual act. For vision and touch, this further act typically included perception of objects as existing and as present in a locally coherent three-dimensional space. The act might result from judgment, inference, or association. Second, the immediate objects of sensory perception were sometimes rendered as mental representations from which an external world must be inferred, possibly allowing for skepticism about the basis for such inferences. Third, these mental representations might or might not be attributed all or most of the features of the Classical Notion. In particular, many early modern theorists, as many theorists now, distinguished between representation via intentional contents that do not literally possess the qualities they present (such as color or shape), and representation through entities that possess the properties (such as color or shape) as they appear.

The terminological distinction between “sensation” and “perception”, explicitly so formulated, is usually credited to Reid, although it can be found in Nicolas Malebranche (Simmons 2009). Taken as a broad conceptual distinction with several terminological and substantive variants, it is more widely present. Descartes, in the Meditations (1641 [1985: 55]), speaks of the perception of objects as arising from sensory ideas caused by such objects. Subsequently, in the Sixth Replies, he distinguishes between the immediate mental products resulting from stimulation in the sense organs, nerves, and brain, such as perception of an extended area of light and color, and subsequent inferences or calculations that yield perception of an object with a specific size, distance, and shape (1641 [1985: 295]). In other places, Descartes offers a physiological account of the perception of distance that renders the third dimension part of the sensory core (Dioptrics, 1637, Sixth Discourse [1965: 105–106]; see Hatfield 2020: 212–213); even so, a judgment would still be needed for object perception.

Locke, in the Essay (1690: bk 2, ch. 9, art. 8), distinguishes between original sensory ideas and the perception of an object as the result of an unnoticed act of judgment:

We are farther to consider concerning Perception, that the Ideas we receive by sensation, are often in grown People alter’d by the Judgment, without our taking notice of it. When we set before our Eyes a round Globe, of any uniform colour, v.g. Gold, Alabaster, or Jet, ’tis certain, that the Idea thereby imprinted in our Mind, is of a flat Circle variously shadow’d, with several degrees of Light and Brightness coming to our Eyes. But we having by use been accustomed to perceive, what kind of appearance convex Bodies are wont to make in us; what alterations are made in the reflections of Light, by the difference of the sensible Figures of Bodies, the Judgment presently, by an habitual custom, alters the Appearances into their Causes: So that from that, which truly is variety of shadow or colour, collecting the Figure, it makes it pass for a mark of Figure, and frames to it self the perception of a convex Figure, and an uniform Colour; when the Idea we receive from thence, is only a Plain variously colour’d, as is evident in Painting.

The passage makes a clear distinction between the immediate impression caused by an object, in this case, sensation of a flat circle variously colored, and the subsequent act by which, after a process of learning, the faculty of judgment “frames … the perception of a convex Figure”. In a similar vein, Berkeley distinguishes between the immediate objects of sight, which include light and color forming a visible extension with visible figure and magnitude, and the mediate objects of sight, informed by touch (Essay Towards a New Theory of Vision, 1709: sec. 49, 55). The immediate object of sight for an approaching object grows in visible extension. But, as the result of learning through the sense of touch, the perceiver experiences the mediate object of sight, an object of constant size. Hume offered a similar example: a table, considered as an external object, retains a constant size; yet our sensory image of it varies as we approach or recede from it (Enquiry, 1748: XII.I.9).

A full tally would reveal that the positions of these early modern figures are consistent with item 5 of the Classical Notion:

Our awareness of such properties of sense data does not involve the affirmation or conception of any object beyond the datum,

when the terminology is adjusted to substitute “sensory ideas” or “immediate objects of perception” for “sense data”. They might also agree on the privacy of sensations or sensory ideas. The authors would differ among themselves on some other points, such as whether there is an act-object distinction and whether sensory ideas are experienced by direct acquaintance.

As regards external objects, Descartes and Locke were realists who held that representations mediate the perception of external objects. Accordingly, perceivers immediately experience sensory ideas that present properties such as shape and color and, through an act of judgment, come to perceive external objects as having properties that cause those sensory ideas.[6] Berkeley and Hume sought to turn this position against them by arguing that it has skeptical consequences. They sought to avoid such skepticism, by adopting idealism in Berkeley’s case, which makes really existent sensory ideas the objects of perception, allegedly avoiding skepticism, or adopting a common-sense realism about external objects, in Hume’s common-sense persona.

The fact that our early modern authors shared with the Classical Notion a version of item 5 does not make them sense-data theorists. Two key ingredients are items 3 and 6: “Sense data have the properties that they appear to have”, and “These properties are known to us with certainty”.

As regards item 3, current consensus is that it does not represent Descartes’ position. He did not believe that states of mind such as sensory ideas have properties of color or other sensory qualities. Rather, he held that color and other qualities are in the mind “representatively”, or in terms of “objective being” or “objective reality” (Meditations, 1641 [1985: 28–29, 74–75, 113–114]). Descartes is here understood to be invoking a notion of intentionality or intentional being.[7] The phenomenal red that one experiences is not an instance of the property red that is predicated of the mind, but rather the idea of red has an intentional content that is experienced as phenomenal red (Yolton 1984: ch. 1; 1996: 74–75; Nadler 2006: 91–92). Similarly, the mind does not itself become square when it experiences a square.

Regarding Locke, a perusal of the Essay, bk 2, ch. 8, reveals that he is not clear on the matter. Interpreters find two notions of “sensory ideas” in Locke: as objects of perception that might potentially instantiate color and shape, and in that way be like sense data; and as acts of perceiving that might exhibit color and shape only by way of representation (Yolton 1984: ch. 3), understood here to mean nonconceptual intentional content (see note 7).

As has been mentioned, Berkeley is sometimes classified as an early sense-data theorist. The issue is complex. On the one hand, he claims to be a champion of common sense who “believes [his] senses”, that is, who holds that “the real things are those very things I see and feel” and that “colours and other sensible qualities are on the objects” (Three Dialogues, 1713: Third Dialogue [2008: 210]). Berkeley holds that we are immediately aware only of sensory ideas, and passages such as these might suggest that those ideas bear property-instances of red or other qualities. On the other hand, he speaks of light and color as “passions or sensations in the soul” (Three Dialogues, First Dialogue [2008: 178]), describes figures and colors as “sensible appearances”, and equates them with sensory “ideas” (Three Dialogues, First Dialogue [2008: 185]). In the Principles (1710: pt 1, art. 72), he speaks of God ordering our “sensations”, which he equates with the “appearances of Nature”. He never speaks of sensory ideas as being red, but only as being instances in which we see red or have the sensation or appearance of red.

Berkeley directly addressed the question of whether sensory ideas have the properties they exhibit in answering a challenge to his idealistic view that only immaterial minds and ideas exist. If minds are immaterial and have no extension, how can we have an idea of an extended thing, for instance, a square? Here Berkeley in effect invoked the Cartesian notion of objective reality or (in present-day terms) intentional content. When challenged with the claim that

if extension and figure exist only in the mind, it follows that the mind is extended and figured; since extension is a mode or attribute,

he answered:

those qualities are in the mind only as they are perceived by it, that is, not by way of mode or attribute, but only by way of idea; and it no more follows, that the soul or mind is extended because extension exists in it alone, than it does that it is red or blue, because these colours are on all hands acknowledged to exist in it. (Principles, pt 1, art. 49; see also Three Dialogues, Third Dialogue [2008: 229–230])

Unlike sense data, the sensory ideas of an extended shape or a color do not have the shape or color as a property; rather, perceived shapes and colors are a kind of intentional content, a way in which things appear.[8]

As regards item 6, that perceivers enjoy certainty in the apprehension of sensory ideas, a standard view has Descartes and Locke asserting or seeking such certainty (Rorty 1979: chs. 1, 3). This reading has been challenged for Descartes, Locke, and Berkeley (Yolton 1984: ch. 5; Hatfield 2011). Accordingly, the real hope for a prominent early modern conception that approaches the Classical Notion, especially as regards items 3 and 6, lies with Hume.

Hume held a version of the sense-datum theory, which treated such data as mental or phenomenal items. Indeed, he provided what became the first standard argument for the existence of sense data, the Argument from Perceptual Variation, which holds that, for things that we believe to possess stable properties such as shape, size, or color, our experiences of those things vary with the perceiver’s physiological state and spatial position; hence, we cannot equate the shape we perceive with the thing’s actual shape. In fact, Descartes (Meditations [1985: 56–61]), Locke (Essay, bk 2, chs. 8–9), and Berkeley (Principles, pt 1, art. 14) all produced arguments that noted the variation of sensory ideas in relation to actual or purported properties of material objects, using these arguments to distinguish immediately perceived sensory ideas and their intentional contents from the latter objects. But it is Hume who clearly used the Argument to support the Classical Notion of sense data.

In An Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (1748), Hume considers the common-sense view that we directly perceive material objects, such as a table. This sort of naïve realism is, Hume says,

destroyed by the slightest philosophy, which teaches us, that nothing can ever be present to the mind but an image or perception, and that the senses are the only inlets, through which these images are conveyed. (Enquiry, XII.I.9)

He then argues:

The table, which we see, seems to diminish, as we move farther from it: But the real table, which exists independent of us, suffers no alteration: It was, therefore, nothing but its image, which was present to the mind.

As Reid (Intellectual Powers, 1785: Essay 2, ch. 14) was to point out, if we take “seems” here to refer to an appearance of the table itself, then there is no contradiction: appearances of a thing can vary even if the thing does not. But we should treat “seems” as an instance of what Chisholm (1957: 43–44) calls its “epistemic” use. To say that a thing seems to diminish in size is to endorse that it does diminish in size. Accordingly, the phenomenal size reveals the actual size of the object of perception, and that object gets smaller. Hence, we may formulate the argument as:

  1. The table that I see diminishes in size as we move away from it.
  2. The real table does not change in size as we move away from it.
  3. Therefore, the table that I see is not the real table.

Hume’s own conclusion, quoted above, is that we perceive only an image of the table. This conclusion arises from the larger context in which our immediate experiences are sense impressions (a version of item 1). Because the object seen diminishes but the real table does not, our sensory experience does not acquaint us with the table but with something else, a mental or phenomenal impression.[9] As a result, Hume held that we cannot know an external world of mind-independent objects, such as the purported “real table”, but must restrict our sensory knowledge to sequences of sense impressions.

Thus far, we have not found explicit endorsement of items 3 and 6. These items are found most clearly in Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature (1739–40). He there says that “every impression”, including both internal and external, and hence including sense impressions, “appear, all of them, in their true colours, as impressions or perceptions” (Treatise, I.4.2.7; again, Chisholm’s epistemic “appear”). But, further,

since all actions and sensations of the mind are known to us by consciousness, they must necessarily appear in every particular what they are, and be what they appear.

Otherwise, we must suppose

that even where we are most intimately conscious, we might be mistaken.

Hume here endorses a version of what is otherwise known as the “transparency” of the mind: if our impressions have a property, that property must appear to us and hence be known to us, and if our impressions appear in a certain way, they are that way. This holds of extension:

the very idea of extension is copy’d from nothing but an impression, and consequently must perfectly agree to it. To say the idea of extension agrees to any thing, is to say it is extended. (Treatise, I.4.5.15)

An impression of a square, which we are conscious of as extended, is really extended. Our consciousness of sensory properties, as those properties are present to us phenomenally, reveals the properties as they are. We can’t be mistaken about them. Items 3 and 6 are affirmed by Hume. Indeed, substituting “impression”, “idea”, and “perception” for “sense datum”, we might ascribe to Hume all of the items in the Classical Notion, save perhaps item 8, the act-object relation. In reading the Treatise and Enquiry, one might be tempted to ascribe item 8 to Hume, but he notoriously rejected such ascriptions in the Appendix to the Treatise.

The need for philosophers to address the problem of the external world was widely regarded as a legacy of early modern philosophy to the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. At Cambridge and Oxford into the 1890s, discussions of the problem of the external world referenced Hamilton’s Lectures on Metaphysics (1861) and J. S. Mill’s An Examination of Sir William Hamilton’s Philosophy (1872). In that decade and the next, G. F. Stout and James Ward at Cambridge discussed the problem as did Thomas Case and John Cook Wilson at Oxford (Nasim 2008, Hatfield 2013b).

2.1.2 Hamilton, Mill, and Sense Data

Hamilton was Professor of Logic and Metaphysics at Edinburgh, and in that capacity regularly gave lectures in each subject area. In his Lectures on Metaphysics, he offered a taxonomy of positions on the problem of the immediate objects of perception. This taxonomy distinguished those who accepted or rejected what Hamilton considered to be the fundamental “fact of consciousness” or “datum of consciousness” (1861, 2: 86). In Hamilton’s view,

consciousness gives, as an ultimate fact, a primitive duality; a knowledge of the ego in relation and contrast to the non-ego; and a knowledge of the non-ego in relation and contrast to the ego. (1861, 1: 292)

Further, it is “given” that ego and non-ego are mind and matter and that these are co-equal. Hamilton’s preferred position, which he called “Natural Realism” or “Natural Dualism”, affirmed the datum of consciousness and held that some portion of the external world is given to the subject in immediate perception. He argued that, in vision, the physical retinal image is the immediately given material entity (1861, 2: 130, 179–184). Accordingly, we have intuitive knowledge of a two-dimensional image, which we are able to understand as a projection of the three-dimensional physical world. This position would allow Hamilton to reject Hume’s Argument from Perceptual Variation, because the “real object” of perception, the retinal image, does vary as we approach or recede from the real table. On this view, we don’t immediately perceive the real table, but we infer it from a real item of the external world that we do perceive immediately: the retinal image.

Hamilton described positions that emended or rejected his fundamental datum of consciousness. Some rejected the fundamental datum and held that in perception we are immediately aware of something that differs from the external world. Hamilton called this a “representative” theory (1861, 1: 295), or, more impressively, he named it “Hypothetical Dualism” or “Cosmothetic Idealism”. Holders of this position are subdivided

into those who view in the object immediately perceived, a tertium quid different both from the external reality and from the conscious mind, and into those who identify this object with a modification of the mind itself. (1861, 1: 298)

Hamilton effectively invoked a notion of sense data, even if the closest he came terminologically was to speak of the “datum” of consciousness. He accepted most tenets of the Classical Notion, but exceeded that notion in considering the datum to be the physical retinal image.[10] He further described positions opposed to his own that are close to positing a sense datum, either as a tertium quid or as a mental representation. He is not clear on whether these purported representative entities would be ascribed the properties they seem to have (item 3), but his emphasis on the power of introspective or intuitive consciousness would move him in that direction.

On one way of reading his work, John Stuart Mill offered arguments against some immediately given sense data before they had been so named. Mill did not deny Hamilton’s premise that whatever is immediately and intuitively known in consciousness is known with certainty (Examination, 126), but he contended that some states of consciousness that seem intuitive, such as the allegedly intuitive experience of a material world, are actually the result of previous psychological processes, which build up habits of mind through association. They would accordingly be complex products, not intuitively given primary data.

Mill framed his attack on Hamilton’s introspective method as a dispute over the basis for knowing the external world. Hamilton purported to find material existence through a simple and ineliminable (or “necessary”) fact of consciousness. Mill replied, grouping Hamilton together with Reid, Kant, and others:

The test by which they all decide a belief to be a part of our primitive consciousness—an original intuition of the mind—is the necessity of thinking it. Their proof that we must always, from the beginning, have had the belief, is the impossibility of getting rid of it now. This argument, applied to any of the disputed questions of philosophy, is doubly illegitimate: neither the major nor the minor premise is admissible. For, in the first place, the very fact that the questions are disputed, disproves the alleged impossibility. Those against whose dissent it is needful to defend the belief which is affirmed to be necessary, are unmistakable examples that it is not necessary. It may be a necessary belief to those who think it so; they may personally be quite incapable of not holding it. But even if this incapability extended to all mankind, it might merely be the effect of a strong association. (Examination, 143–145)

Finding that a belief has been entrenched through past experience unmasks it as merely habit-based and not a product of necessity-bestowing intuition. What seems to be a primitive datum might actually result from habit. We’ll return to this distinction below, anent Russell’s logical and psychological “hard data”.

2.2 Formation and Flourishing of the Concept and Term “Sense Data”

Formation of the concept and the term “sense data” is standardly attributed to G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell.[11] The background to this development includes not only the problem of the external world but also their early and joint commitment to British Idealism. The affirmation of sense data denied a central tenet of such idealism, that perception yields no knowledge because it is always an incomplete grasping of the whole or the Absolute. As Russell put it, looking back from 1943:

Bradley argued that everything common sense believes in is mere appearance; we reverted to the opposite extreme, and thought that everything is real that common sense, uninfluenced by philosophy or theology, supposes real. With a sense of escaping from prison, we allowed ourselves to think that grass is green, that the sun and stars would exist if no one was aware of them, and also that there is a pluralistic timeless world of Platonic ideas. (1951: 12)

As we shall see, the realism that Russell affirms here is in some respects peculiar, for in one version it includes a denial of mind-independent material things, but without embracing idealism.

Moore first developed the concept of sense data. His conception primarily focused on epistemology, whereas Russell combined epistemology with various metaphysical schemes for building from sense data.[12]

2.2.1 Moore and Sense Data

Moore broke with idealism in 1898 and his “Refutation of Idealism” appeared in 1903. This paper did not introduce the concept of sense data, but it formulated the distinction that made him a realist, which he maintained throughout his life, between the act of sensation and its object. Moore contended that every case of sensation involves awareness of two distinct elements, one common to all sensations and the other differing among them. He distinguished the common element, which he called “consciousness”, from the differing “objects” of sensation, which might be blue in one case, green in another. He did not claim to prove that the object is what it seems to be: a material object at a distance, but he endorsed a naïve realism, according to which we are directly aware of “the existence of a table in space” just as we are directly aware of the conscious element (1903: 453).

In December, 1909, Moore gave a paper at the Aristotelian Society in which he introduced the term “sense data”.[13] The paper again divided “mental acts” from their objects, and it observed that we are aware of a difference between mental act and non-mental object: when we perceive one color and then another, the act of consciousness is of the same type, whereas the two colors that are objects of the act differ. Such acts of consciousness can themselves differ in quality (one mental act may be a perceiving, another a willing, etc.), and many mental acts may be conjoined to form a complex mental entity. But such acts are distinct from their objects, even if those objects exist only when we perceive them, as, Moore reports, some people believe about colors. He then introduces the term “sense data”:

By sense-data I understand a class of entities of which we are very often directly conscious, and with many of which we are extremely familiar. They include the colours, of all sorts of different shades, which I actually see when I look about me; the sounds which I actually hear; the peculiar sort of entity of which I am directly conscious when I feel the pain of a toothache, and which I call “the pain”; and many others which I need not enumerate. But I wish also to include among them those entities called “images”, of which I am directly conscious when I dream and often also when awake; which resemble the former in respect of the fact that they are colours, sounds, etc.; but which seem, as a rule, like rather faint copies of the colours, sounds, etc., actually seen or heard, and which, whether fainter or not, differ from them in respect of the fact that we should not say we actually saw or heard them, and the fact that they are not, in the strictest sense of the words, “given by the senses”. All these entities I propose to call sense-data. And in their case there is, of course, no question whether there are such entities. The entities meant certainly are, whether or not they be rightly described as “sensations”, “sense-presentations”, “sense-data”, etc. Here the only question can be, whether they are “mental”. (1909–10: 57)

Moore’s remarks are not in the spirit of arguing that sense data exist but of drawing our attention to their obvious existence; his argument concerns whether they are mental. Moore observes (1909–10: 58) that philosophers such as Stout regard sense data as mental because they fail to distinguish act from object, consciousness of blue from the blue of which we are conscious. Having made this distinction between act and object, he finds it manifest that the object is non-mental (1909–10: 58–60).

Moore intended the term “sense data” to provide a neutral description for whatever is the immediate object of our awareness and hence to be neutral on the problem of the external world. Over the next half century, he considered various theories about how sense data might relate to physical objects. In these discussions, he sometimes used “sensibles” as a broader term that includes unsensed sense-data (1913–14: 357–358). Without following the various shifts in his preferred theory, we can note that he considered five relations that sense data might have to physical objects or other actual or potential causes (Moore 1913–14, 1918–19, 1925, 1957). On one conception, physical objects might be regarded as

  1. collections of sensed and unsensed sense data, independent of any conception of the causal source of such data.

Bringing in potential causes of sense data, these might be:

  1. a spiritual entity, as in Berkeleyan idealism;
  2. an unknown thing in itself; or
  3. physical objects, as in Locke’s view of representative realism.

Finally, a sense datum might be

  1. a part of the surface of a physical object.

Moore (1913–14: 376) identified (1) with Russell and Mill (e.g., Russell 1914a, b) and allowed that it might be right. But he favored positions (4) and (5). In (4), sense data stand in a relation to physical objects, called “relation R”, which turns out to be a representational relation (Moore 1925, 1957). In (5), the perceiver is directly aware of a part of the surface of a physical object.

In discussing sense data, Moore introduced some facts that illustrate the relativity of perception, using coins (1913–14: 371–372). With U.S. coins, a penny is physically smaller than a quarter and both are round. Moore and other observers report that when looking at the coins from a position other than directly above them, they appear more or less elliptical, becoming thin rectangles when seen edge-on. Further, the quarter, seen at a sufficiently greater distance than the penny, appears smaller than it. Moore wanted to account for these purported facts that exhibit perceptual relativity, while preserving the common-sense beliefs that we really do, on some occasions, see coins; that the coins really are round; that they have an inside and a lower side, even though these aren’t presently seen; that the quarter is really larger than the penny; and that the coins exist when we aren’t looking at them.

Position (4), a form of representative realism,[14] accounts for the perceptual relativity that makes us want to distinguish the immediate object of perception from the properties we ascribe to physical objects (Perceptual Variation). The immediate object is elliptical; the penny, round. Although accommodating relativity, this position may be challenged for making it difficult to know the properties of the physical object, for the object is once removed from perception. But Moore (1913–14: 379–380) was not swayed by this challenge, generally aligning himself with common sense beliefs about physical objects.

Position (5) equates the sense datum with a portion of the surface of the physical object. In order to account for perceptual relativity, Moore (1918–19: 23–24) now violates a basic tenet concerning sense data: that we perceive them as they are (item 3 of the Classical Notion). If the penny is round and we are directly aware of its physical surface, even when viewed at an angle, we are perceiving a round thing. But, Moore holds, the round thing is perceived to “seem” elliptical. It is not perceived to be elliptical, as in the other four positions, and as Moore himself had previously assumed (1918–19: 23). Hence, in holding (5), one must distinguish the actual properties of the directly seen surface from the properties it seems to have (1918–19: 24). There is no actually elliptical datum; rather, the circular datum simply seems to be elliptical. Moore did his best to uphold the direct realism of (5) and at times favored it. But in his final publication (1957), he endorsed (4) instead.

2.2.2 Russell and Sense Data

In 1911–1912, Russell returned to a project he had started soon after the break from Idealism, an investigation of the concept of matter. A need to first secure the foundations of mathematics had diverted him from this project (and resulted in Principia). Now, from 1912 on, he approached the analysis of matter from the perspectives of epistemology and ontology, investigating our knowledge and conception of the fundamental constituents of the external world. The main events concerning sense data proper run from the Problems of Philosophy (1912) to the Analysis of Mind (1921), although the legacy of sense data extends further.

Russell’s initial discussions in this period made epistemology primary. Consider the opening sentence of his 1912 popular book, The Problems of Philosophy:

Is there any knowledge in the world which is so certain that no reasonable man could doubt it? (1912 [1997: 7])

The first positive instance he offers is knowledge of sense data.

Russell finds that when he looks at an object such as a table, his perception of the table does not reveal the actual properties of the table but rather a series of sensations that vary in what they present. The character of color sensations change as one moves around a table, sometimes being brown, but in cases of reflected light (say, from a window), giving a sensation of white. The shape of the table appears as a sequence of quadrilaterals; viewed from one end, it appears as a regular trapezoid, and the physically parallel sides yield a sense experience of convergence. Russell argues for the existence of sense data with a version of the Argument from Perceptual Variation, which, for shape, runs as follows (1912 [1997: 10–11]):

  1. In looking at a table, what we see varies in shape as we move.
  2. The real table does not vary in shape.
  3. Hence, what we see is not the real table.

He offers similar arguments for color and felt properties such as hardness.

Russell gives the name “sense data” to

the things that are immediately known in sensation: such things as colours, sounds, smells, hardnesses, roughnesses, and so on. (1912 [1997: 12])

In further discussion, he affirms or implies the eight elements of the Classical Notion. He further suggests that sense data may exist only when sensed (1912 [1997: 23]). Like Moore, he emphasizes the importance of distinguishing between the mental act of sensation and the object of that act (1912 [1997: 12]). The act is mental, the object need not be. Like Moore as well, he suggests that those who believe that sense data must be mental have failed to distinguish act from object (1912 [1997: 41–43]).

Russell further asks whether the table is real and, if so, what it might be (1912 [1997: 11, 19–25]). He answers that the table most likely is a real material object, rectangular and brown. Accordingly, he assigns to material objects the role of causing sense data. Sense data then “represent” the objects that cause them (1912 [1997: 23]). This is not part of the base concept of sense data but is the result of further analysis. He has posited sense data as “third things”, standing between material objects and perceivers, and serving as the immediate objects of perception.

In Problems, Russell distinguished knowledge by acquaintance, which involves a direct relation to sense data, from knowledge by description or “knowledge that”. Although bare acquaintance makes us aware of the properties of sense data, it does not assert any truths or involve any judgments, hence does not constitute “knowledge that” something is the case (1912 [1997: 46]). We come to know basic facts about sense data by making judgments about them. In obtaining sense data of a brown table, we easily come to know that we are seeing something brown, or, subsequently, a whitish sheen, or an appearance of one or another trapezoidal surface. This is what Russell calls “knowledge of things by description” (1912 [1997: 46]). Description is only possible if we have access to universals, such as brownness, whiteness, being a surface, being a trapezoid, and so on. According to Russell, repeated sensations allow us to become acquainted with sensory universals:

When we see a white patch, we are acquainted, in the first instance, with the particular patch; but by seeing many white patches, we easily learn to abstract the whiteness which they all have in common, and in learning to do this we are learning to be acquainted with whiteness. (1912 [1997: 101])

Having acquaintance with universals such as whiteness, we can make judgments that yield knowledge by description of the properties of things. These are judgments of fact about sense data, which establish truths.

Going forward, Russell retained the view that sense data (or their counterparts) provide epistemological bedrock. But within a year or so, in Our Knowledge of the External World (1914a) and “The Relation of Sense-data to Physics” (1914b), he changed position on the metaphysics of sense data in relation to material objects. He came to view such objects as logical constructions out of sense data. He found no need to assert the existence of material objects, whether the substantial “thing” of common sense or the atoms and molecules of physics (1914b: 109, 114–115). Rather, he populated the world with minds and sense data and new entities termed “sensibilia”. Things and micro-physical particles became logical constructions, not inferred entities as in his representative realism of 1912. This adjustment may be seen as an extension of his recognition that sense data are very well known. Treating material objects as mere logical constructions avoids a shaky inference from well-known data to the actual existance of physical things.

During this development, Russell retained and clarified his conception of occurrent sense data, including the eight points of the Classical Notion. He retained the distinction between mental act and non-mental object (1914a: 76; 1914b: 113). Sense data are non-mental, but they exist as sense data only while they are present to the mind (1914a: 64; 1914b: 110). He now identified two additional entities, inferred rather than constructed, that would figure into his account of the external world: other people’s sense data, inferred from their testimony and ultimately relying on analogy with one’s own mind to posit other minds; and

the “sensiblia” which would appear from places where there happen to be no minds, and which I suppose to be real although they are no one’s data. (1914b: 116)

Sensibilia, as postulated entities, are particulars that become sense data when a perceiver enters into a relation of acquaintance with one of them. Thus, there are many potential trapezoidal appearances as of a table. When someone has a sequence of table-like experiences, some of those trapezoidal appearances are manifest as sense data. At other perspectives, not occupied by any observer, there are unsensed particulars. As Russell put it:

I shall give the name sensibilia to those objects which have the same metaphysical and physical status as sense-data without necessarily being data to any mind. (1914b: 110)

The notion of “object” here is not that of an ordinary physical object. Rather, as the objects of sensation, Russell posits a bevy of fleeting particulars, the exact time course of which he didn’t specify.

Russell’s analysis of our perception of an external world advanced in other ways. In Problems (1912: ch. 1), he had noted that we are so accustomed to judging the “real” shapes of things that we believe “that we actually see the real shapes” (1912 [1997: 10]), that is, we uncritically assume that we see the table as rectangular. But when we adopt the attitude needed to produce a drawing of the table, we may come to notice the appearances of various trapezoidal shapes. In Our Knowledge (1914a: ch. 3), Russell further analyzes this difference. His analysis depends on the relation between what is logically and psychologically primitive or else derivative. Logically primitive beliefs are those that are not logically derived via inference or construction. In order to strengthen our knowledge, we seek to align these primitive beliefs with the psychologically primitive. While having an ordinary perception of the table with its actual shape, we mistakenly believe that this experience, which has resulted from a learned psychological process, is psychologically primitive; accordingly, we also designate this perception of the table as logically primitive. Scientific psychology now offers a point that Russell had attributed to learning to draw: that what is actually psychologically primitive is the perspectival view of the table as trapezoidal (1914a: 68). Armed with this psychological finding, we endeavor to make the trapezoidal datum logically primitive; what is psychologically primitive is more secure and so provides us with “hard data” by comparison with the “soft data” of the common-sense belief about the table’s shape (1914a: 69–70). As with Mill’s apparently but not actually intuitive beliefs, before epistemological analysis many beliefs about sensory things are logically primitive, because not reached through logical derivation, and psychologically derivative, because caused by extra-logical psychological processes such as association. Upon further consideration, we favor beliefs that are both psychologically and logically primitive (1914a: 69–70) and so establish sense data as logically primitive.

Russell’s postulation of sensibilia allowed him to gain in metaphysical regularity and economy. Sensibilia make it that the objects of sense, color patches and like, do not simply go out of existence when unobserved. Rather, sensibilia persist and we sample them when we occupy positions that present specific table-perspectives. But, further, he economizes by replacing the “real” physical table with sense data and sensibilia at various locations. These are coordinated between the senses, and so include those as of approaching the table with our eye until our face touches it, a perspective that connects with the felt location of table (1914b: 119–120).

By 1920, Russell proposed even greater ontological economy by giving up mental acts and the experiencing subject as distinct from sense data. This meant that the “data” were no longer given to a distinct subject and so were improperly named as “sense data”; henceforth, he spoke of “momentary particulars” or “events”. He explicated this “neutral monism” in the Analysis of Mind (1921: ch. 1). He saw himself as adopting James’s (1904) position, according to which both the self and the external world are composed of one neutral stuff—momentary particulars, characterized by perceptual qualities such as color and shape (for visual particulars). Accordingly, he discarded the act-object analysis of mind and sense perception, as there is no longer recognition of a mind that acts but only of various sequences of momentary particulars. The sequence that includes all the experiences that I’ve had today (and before) constitutes my mind, another sequence of such particulars constitutes your mind. Physical objects, such as a table, become a different sequence of particulars, which are like sensibilia in giving perspectives on a table or a room that is composed of them. If no one’s sequence of particulars intersects with those of a particular classroom, then that room and its contents consist of a series of momentary particulars now occurring without anyone present. The material entities of physics are, as before, treated as constructions from momentary particulars.[15]

2.2.3 Further Development of the Classical Notion of Sense Data

Many other classical theorists accepted the view that sense data are non-mental. Broad (1923) and Price (1932) were realists who acknowledged both sense data and material objects. Broad explored a “critical scientific realism” by elaborating the notion of sense data (or, in his terms, “sensa”) from Russell and others. His position was in some ways similar to traditional representative realism, but Broad denied that sensa are themselves mental states, in the sense of being dependent on the mind for their existence (1923: 265–266), and, further, he denied that physical objects are inferred from sensa. Rather, sensing sensa induces an underived belief in mind-independent physical objects, a belief that is not reached by inference and cannot be justified by inference (1923: 268). Broad agreed with Russell’s point that, in ordinary perceptual consciousness, sense data are not manifest but may become so through an act of attention. He rejected the picture that we first focus on sensa and then explicitly infer objects and their properties from them; rather, we “pass automatically”, by a primitive feature of our psychology, from sensa (perhaps unnoticed) to judgments about objects and their properties (1923: 246–248).

Price’s book, Perception (1932), is an especially probing account of sense data, their ontological status and cognitive role. He begins by isolating a sense datum as what is given in perception such that we cannot doubt its existence: the extant bulgy patch of red that occurs when a tomato is viewed in good light cannot be doubted, even if we can doubt whether we are seeing a tomato or indeed any physical object at all (1932: 3). The bulgy patch is directly present in consciousness, that is, is “given” as a datum by means of a relation of mental acquaintance. Price, as has been mentioned, recommended that the term “sense data” should be considered, in its meaning, neutral on ontology. But he went on to argue for a specific conception of what sense data are, including a specification of their cognitive status and their ontology as a tertium quid.

Against the “causal” theory of perception (effectively, representative realism), Price argues that the concept of cause is neither necessary nor sufficient for our belief in physical objects, that even in spatial perception only in some cases do sense data resemble physical objects, and that in any case material objects are not inferred from sense data. He further maintains that although sense data are distinct from material objects (contra naïve realism) and their existence may require the existence of minds, they are not mental (1932: 117–127, 316–317). He elaborates notions of perceptual acceptance and perceptual assurance to describe the non-inferential cognitive acts through which we accept and believe that material objects exist. The belief in material objects consists in (a) the construction of a “standard solid” from sense data, which is a spatial structure that fits the outer shape of a physical object in three dimensions, together with (b) belief in a causally efficacious “physical occupant” of this location (1932: ch. 8).[16]

Price (1932: ch. 2, esp. pp. 27–33) gave an early formulation of the renowned Argument from Illusion as supporting sense data in opposition to naïve realism. In this argument, if the penny looks elliptical or the table trapezoidal, these are illusions, since the penny is round and the table rectangular. Price’s version of the Argument may be formulated as follows:[17]

  1. In viewing a soccer ball in the distance, we are acquainted with a flat circle.
  2. The surface of the soccer ball itself is spherical.
  3. Hence, what we are acquainted with is not the surface of the soccer ball. Call the object of acquaintance a sense datum.
  4. The sense datum is illusory: the ball is spherical, not flat.
  5. In walking toward and drawing near to the soccer ball, we are now acquainted with a bulgy, hemispherical surface; our perception is now veridical.
  6. There is a continuous series of perceptions of the ball’s shape as we walk, transitioning from flat to hemispherical.
  7. Our perceptual consciousness of this series exhibits no qualitative, phenomenal breaks when transitioning.
  8. If there is no phenomenal break then there is no qualitative difference in the veridical and illusory experiences considered as experiences.
  9. It is not plausible that qualitatively similar perceptions are of radically different objects, the actual surface of the ball in the near case and an illusory sense datum in the distant and in-between cases.
  10. Since I am surely acquainted with a sense datum in the distant case, I am acquainted with a sense datum throughout.
  11. Hence, the direct object of perception is a sense datum.

The argument relies on the indistinguishability of far and near perceptual experiences, considered as experiences, to argue that, since the far experience does not directly present the object’s surface and shape, the near experience also does not directly present that surface and shape. Price fortified the appeal to far and near experiences with the observation that experiences of the ball’s shape vary continuously with distance, which he found to tell against the claim that nearby experiences of the ball are direct while other experiences are mediated by sense data.[18] In addition, Price extended the argument to include cases of hallucination (1932: 28–29), which are explained by the having of sense data that are indistinguishable from veridical perception. Appealing to the phenomenal indistinguishability of various perceptual experiences provides support for sense data across all three cases: veridical perception, illusion, and hallucination.

In subsequent discussions, this argument received much attention (see Ayer 1940: ch. 1; Robinson 1994: ch. 2; for an overview, Smith 2002: ch. 1). In contrast, when Russell, Moore, Broad, and others spoke of Perceptual Variation and the relativity of perception, they did not treat the elliptical appearance of a penny as illusory. They simply affirmed that, from various positions, the penny looks elliptical even though it is actually round. Further, although they may have alleged the phenomenal indistinguishability of illusory appearances, such as the bent appearance of a stick partially submerged in water, when compared with ordinary appearances, this was not the basic argument for sense data. Their basic argument came from Perceptual Variation and the lack of a match between the penny as it appears and the penny as they believed it to be physically.

A. J. Ayer (1940), contra Price and others, argued that the existence of sense data is not a factual question but a matter of linguistic convention. He held that all theorists of perception might agree on the phenomenal facts about seeing pennies but disagree on the implications for the real shapes of pennies. One theorist holds that, as the observer changes position, the penny appears elliptical but stays round; the theorist endorses sense data (by Illusion). Another theorist agrees about the series of elliptical appearances with a moving observer but holds that, when the penny looks elliptical, it has changed shape to become elliptical (Ayer 1940: 17–18). According to Ayer, the competing theories can’t be differentiated empirically (they agree on the elliptical appearances) and so they become recommendations about perceptual language. Ayer (1940: ch. 1) found that the Argument from Illusion supports choosing sense-data language. He developed the language of phenomenalism, in which statements about material objects are understood as statements about actual and possible sense data (1940: ch. 5). In his scheme, even though sense data do not exist unsensed (possible sense data are merely hypothetical), they need not be classed as mental states (1940: 76–78). Ayer (1940: 61–65) departed from the other main theorists in rejecting an act-object analysis of sensations and their objects (item 8).

3. Major Critical Responses or Oppositions

The topic of sense data was heavily discussed in the middle decades of the twentieth century, and some notable criticisms were published.[19]

Austin’s lectures in Oxford (from 1947 on), critical of sense data, were published in 1962 as Sense and Sensibilia. They took aim at the doctrine that

we never see or otherwise perceive (or ‘sense’), or anyhow we never directly perceive or sense, material objects (or material things), but only sense-data. (1962: 2)

Austin accuses Ayer (1940), Price (1932), and others of embracing a “scholastic” view that analyzes a few poorly understood words and “half-studied ‘facts’”. By contrast, he promises to show

that our ordinary words are much subtler in their uses, and mark many more distinctions, than philosophers have realized; and that the facts of perception, as discovered by, for instance, psychologists but also as noted by common mortals, are much more diverse and complicated than has been allowed for. (1962: 3)

Austin’s criticisms focus on language use, even while dissenting from Ayer that the issues are entirely terminological (Austin 1962: ch. 6). He focuses on the “argument from illusion” from Ayer (also citing Price), and complains that ordinary cases of perceptual relativity and variation, such as the elliptical-looking penny, are not normally taken to be illusions. In fact, as we have seen, many earlier sense-data theorists would agree. Austin has little to say about the Argument from Perceptual Variation from the classical discussions. He finds the penny example to be atypical because pennies have stable, sharply bounded shapes whereas many objects, such as cats, do not. In considering the Argument from Illusion, Austin (1962: 52) objects to the continuity premise, which we have just seen in Price: that if, in one case, we explain a mismatch between object and perception by introducing a special entity such as a sense datum, we must then accept that in phenomenally similar cases we can’t have direct, veridical perception. (The continuity premise remains in dispute today, see Crane & French 2015 [2021].) More generally, sense-data theorists had argued that in describing elliptical appearances gained from a penny, one adopts a special sense of “see” that (1) does not require that an elliptical material object exists, but (2) does affirm that an elliptical sense datum exists (1962: ch. 3). Austin’s denial that something elliptical must be seen in such cases draws on ordinary language. But Price and others distinguished different senses of perception words advisedly; Austin fails to engage their reasons more directly. Further, he does not consider theorists who say that we perceive material things as a result of sensing sense data (e.g., Broad 1923: 248).

Another challenge to sense-data theory sought to reveal a “sense-datum fallacy” (Chisholm 1957: 151–152). The charge is that sense-data theorists make inferences like this: something appears elliptical, therefore what we see is an appearance that is elliptical.[20] The fallacy consists in simply assuming that if something appears a certain way (such as Price’s flat circle produced by a spherical ball), something must exist that is that way (a sense datum). Critics then argue that, in asserting that something appears elliptical (or flat), one might simply be describing the character of the appearance, not asserting that an item with an elliptical shape (or flat surface) is present. Afterall, we normally do accept that things need not be as they appear. In response, it has been contended that sense-data theorists do not simply move from “appears elliptical” to “is elliptical” (Smith 2002: 35–36). Rather, the positing of sense data most commonly arises through acceptance of an act-object analysis of perception (item 8), which also affirms that the objects of perception are directly apprehended (item 1) and that they are as they appear (item 3). The arguments from Variation and Illusion may then be used to contend that we often experience perceptual objects whose properties are distinct from the properties ascribed to material objects, as in the penny appearing elliptical, and that from the qualitative similarity of illusions (or variant appearances) and alleged direct perceptions, we should conclude that we are always acquainted with sense data. Such arguments may indeed be challenged, but there has been no simple and unwary move from appears such to is such.

Theorists who sought to avoid this alleged fallacy held that a penny might appear elliptical in a phenomenally direct way without an elliptical item being present to the mind. These are sometimes known as “appearance theories”. One such position is the adverbial analysis, which holds that phenomenal qualities inhere in the mental activity of perceiving but without being present as objects or as property-instances. Accordingly, we perceive the penny itself, but perceive it in a certain manner: roundly, or elliptically, and redly (Ducasse 1942; Chisholm 1957: part 3). To say that we are experiencing the penny elliptically is to say that we enjoy an elliptical appearance without there being an actually elliptical item present to us; rather, the appearance is understood simply as our manner of sensing the penny, or as the way our sensory activity makes us experience the shape of the penny. A related sort of appearance theory renders the elliptical appearance as a mental content, or an intentional state, with the contents elliptical and red (Barnes 1944–1945). Accordingly, via intentional content, one can experience an elliptical spatial structure without being acquainted with an actually elliptical object. The intentional content instantiates an appearance as a state of the perceiver, whose perceptual experience thereby represents the world as being a certain way, for instance, as containing an elliptical shape. (Intentionalist theories are found in Dretske 1995 and Tye 1995; an important earlier formulation is Anscombe 1965.) These two types of theories account for Variation and Illusion via adverbial or intentional contents that can also account for veridical cases of perception. Indeed, these theories can allow that, in some instances (with moderate slant), we see a penny that is round by seeing it as being round and slanted relative to the line of sight. Adverbialists would say that we see the penny roundly; intentionalists, that we see the penny via mental content that represents it as being round. (On these philosophies of perception, see Crane & French 2015 [2021].)

There is a tradition in philosophy and psychology that denies, on phenomenal grounds, the distinction between impoverished, typically two-dimensional sensory contents or states and the perception of objects in three dimensions. One can see William James’s affirmation that sensations are intrinsically world-directed (1890, 2: 1–3) and exhibit three-dimensional volume (1890, 2: 135–136) as objecting in advance to the Classical Notion of sense data. James denies item 5, that sense data are neutral about a world beyond them, in favor of a position that both sensation and perception give us “an immediately present outward reality” (1890, 2: 2). The Gestalt psychologists (Koffka 1935: chs. 1–3; Köhler 1929 [1947: chs. 1–3]) also adopted a position in which we are perceptually given a world, not an impoverished content or object distinct from the world. They made perception of the valence or functional values of the world into an immediately given aspect of perceptual content. They also denied that two-dimensional sensations or sense data are the core from which perceptions are developed: the world is given in three-dimensions.[21] The Gestalt theorists drew attention to the phenomena of size and shape constancy. If two objects of the same size are presented at five and ten feet, the retinal image of the farther object will be half as large (in linear height) as the image of the nearby object; yet observers report them to be phenomenally of the same size (or nearly so). Similarly, a circle seen at a (moderate) slant projects an ellipse on the retina but appears circular. These theorists contended that significant phenomenal differences in size between the two objects, and the appearance of an elliptical shape, are produced only under special laboratory conditions or through trained acts of attention, as might be found in those who are taught to draw (Koffka 1935: 222–223; Köhler 1929 [1947: 71–74]). Subsequently, the perceptual psychologist James J. Gibson (1950) agreed with the Gestalt theorists in arguing that the two-dimensional experiences that are like sense data arise from acts of attention that artificially alter our phenomenology away from the three-dimensional visual world that we normally perceive. Accordingly, the two-dimensional visual field is not an immediate object of perception or primitive constituent of perception that is uncovered by attention. Rather, it is constructed through a special effort of attention. Gibson held that, in everyday perception of a circle at a slant (say, your neighbor’s plate at a dinner party), the object looks like a circle at a slant and so looks circular, not elliptical (1950: chs. 1, 9). In subsequent writings, Gibson (1966, 1979) developed the notion that sensory systems are attuned for presenting to perceivers a navigable environment and its affordances for meeting the perceiver’s needs and goals.

Each of these three theoretical stances denies, on phenomenal grounds, the two-fold character of perceptual consciousness, or the division into impoverished sensuous element and accompanying interpretation or object-positing. Rather, sensory experience is intrinsically world-presenting, spatially expansive (in three dimensions), and utility alerting.

Wilfrid Sellars sought to unmask the “myth” of a pure given to which subjects can respond atomistically in a way that yields an epistemic given (a primitive basis for knowledge). According to Sellars’s highly regarded “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind” (1956), the “classical” sense datum position holds that “s is red” can be known non-inferentially. Classical sense-data philosophers

have taken givenness to be a fact which presupposes no learning, no forming of associations, no setting up of stimulus-response connections. (1956: §6)

They accept an “inconsistent triad”:

  1. X senses red sense-content s entails x non-inferentially knows that s is red.
  2. The ability to sense sense-contents is unacquired.
  3. The ability to know facts of the form x is φ is acquired.

A and B together entail not-C; B and C entail not-A; A and C entail not-B. (1956: §6, emended)

Who allegedly subscribed to this triad? Some of Sellars’s examples draw from early modern philosophy; he effectively attributes a version of A and B to Locke, Berkeley, and Hume (1956: §28) but, it seems, not C. He criticizes Ayer’s linguistic analysis (1956: §§8–9) but suggests that it is aimed more at analyzing object-talk into sense-data talk than at showing sense-data talk to be epistemically basic (as in A). He briefly alludes to Broad (1956: §11) and Price (1956: §31), without ascribing the triad to them. He also devotes considerable attention further on to the role of an ostensive “given” within the “positivistic conception of science” (1956: §43), and it is tempting to surmise that his main target was that conception as put forward by Carnap, Reichenbach, and others. To assess that direction, we would need to interpret the positivist shift from elementary experiences to protocol sentences as epistemically basic, which would take us far afield (but see Leitgeb & Carus 2020).

In relation to the triad, a prominent reading of Locke has him impute epistemic authority to sensory ideas as giving knowledge of their causes (Ayers 1991: vol. 1, ch. 18). Locke is attributed A and B but not C. It is doubtful that Descartes, who distinguished sensing from judging, would endorse A. Among the classical sense-data theorists, many would deny A, distinguishing sensing and “acquaintance” from “knowing that”; sensing red may usually and non-inferentially lead to knowing that s is red, but not as a simple matter of entailment. Russell explicitly denied A; sensing may be unacquired but “knowing that” involves judging, not mere sensing, and the universals that enter judgments of sensory quality (such as whiteness) are acquired, affirming C. Sellars himself rejects A, complicates B, and affirms C, adopting (by assumption) a position of “psychological nominalism” (1956: §29), according to which kind-terms, including color terms, and the ability to be aware of color instances are learned as part of a linguistic and conceptual web of meaning (holism).

In his holism about color terms, Sellars raised an objection that would engage Russell’s conception of atomic statements about sense data as epistemically basic (Russell’s psychologically and logically primitive hard data). Sellars (1956) constructs an elaborate myth of his own, in which our behaviorist ancestors must learn to treat thoughts as internal states of one another and subsequently to self-report their own thoughts (1956: §§47–59). He extends the story from the attribution of inner thoughts to one another to the positing of internal sensory impressions (1956: §§60–62). His view differs from Russell’s position in making the ability to be aware of red sense experiences depend on the acquisition of a sophisticated web of meaning and theory; this ability is not “given”. Nor, as Russell would have it, is the universal red needed for knowing that s is red, “easily acquired” (1912 [1997: 101]). Accordingly, there are no easily acquired color predicates to describe the sense data that ground knowledge. Sellars asserts that

instead of coming to have a concept of something because we have noticed that sort of thing, to have the ability to notice a sort of thing is already to have the concept of that sort of thing, and cannot account for it. (1956: §45)

Sellars claims the advantage that, through this social process of acquisition, sense impressions lose “absolute privacy” and become objects of intersubjective knowledge (1956: §62), and here he directly departs from item 7 in the Classical Notion. But he has also rejected the acquaintance view of sense data as immediately present to the mind prior to learning (item 2). Sellars’s holistic conception that the acquisition of phenomenal concepts enables the ability to observe and self-report the presence of sense particulars may offer better reasons for rejecting item 2 of the Classical Notion than are found in his discussion of the inconsistent triad.

4. Sense Data Recently

In philosophies of mind and perception, sense data fell out of favor in the 1960s and 1970s. But there have been attempts to restore some version of the theory. Often, but not always, these efforts sought to sustain mental sense data as the immediate objects of perception. The most extensive efforts are by Frank Jackson, in Perception (1977), and Howard Robinson, in a book of the same title (1994).

Jackson set out to support the conclusion that the immediate objects of perception are mental and that they represent physical objects. He first argues that what we immediately perceive are sense data, which are colored patches. His argument appeals to the fact that when we perceive an object, we are not in immediate contact with the whole object but only a portion of it, and that we are immediately aware of the color and shape of this portion. We see the object in virtue of seeing its surface, and the basic form of seeing its surface is to see its color and shape via sense data that represent that surface. The “in virtue of” relation does all the work here; Jackson does not draw on, and rejects, the arguments from Variation and Illusion (1977: chs. 1, 4, 7).

This conclusion does not say whether sense data are mental or physical (1977: 119). The argument that sense data are all mental proceeds for the case of vision by seeking to establish that colors are mental items. The argument is indirect, from the conclusion that colors are not physical. This conclusion, in turn, relies on the claim that color is not a “scientific property”, that only scientific properties exist in the external world and affect the eyes and brain, and that color then can only be a mental entity caused by neural activity (1977: ch. 5).

The argument relies on a conception of scientific or physical properties that is widespread in philosophy: that physics has no place for phenomenal properties or perceptual experience. Accordingly, physics posits particles and forces, which may cause perceptual experience in a suitable perceiver, but which themselves are colorless. Jackson is certainly right that physics today does not accept something akin to phenomenal color as a fundamental physical property; rather, it accepts wavelengths and brain processes, and these possess no such fundamental property. Prior to the evolution of color-sentient beings, there presumably were no phenomenal experiences of color, hence none to be counted among physical phenomena. Nonetheless, physics, especially in the science of optics, accepts the “subjective perception of color” (Nelson 2017: 125) as an object of study,[22] just as acoustics accepts the experience of pitch as a physical phenomenon (Weld & Palmer 1925: 322). Arguably, phenomenal experiences need not be reduced or even reducible to basic physical processes in order to be counted among physical phenomena and hence among items to be investigated in the hard sciences, including physics. Accordingly, color experience needn’t be decisively categorized as “non-physical”. Its ultimate ontology is left open. It might be a mental content as in an intentional theory or other appearance theory.[23] The color property might be analyzed relationally, as a surface property with the power to produce a color experience, which needn’t be a colored sense datum. The metaphysical status of phenomenal experience need not be decided in order for the conditions of such experience to be examined in the science of physics.

Robinson (1994) sets forth the most extensive case for sense data in recent times. His book offers a history of sense-data theory, which he sees as deriving from Locke, Berkeley, and Hume. Robinson thus disagrees with the history offered above as regards Berkeley and Locke. He also specifies a standard conception of sense data (1994: 1–2): that such data possess the sensible qualiteis they appear to have, and that they are not intrinscally representational (they do not intrinsically refer beyond themselves; they have no intentional content). He takes the Argument from Illusion to be the primary classical argument for sense data in the twentieth century (though not much invoked before). Most of the other arguments he examines are related to Variation or Illusion, or to Jackson’s argument from science about color.

Some of Robinson’s arguments are new to our discussion, such as the Time-Lag Argument. It notes that the light reaching our eyes from stars may be hundreds or thousands of years old and so the star may have ceased to exist. On the assumption that the object of veridical perception exists, our perception cannot be of the actual star, and hence must be of another object. But all perception involves a causal process that unfolds in time; hence, on the assumption that perception must be simultaneous with its object, we never perceive the actual properties of the things that reflect or emit light (1994: ch. 3). This argument can be extended to a Causal Argument (1994: ch. 6) which appeals to the fact that we can be made to seem to perceive objects by non-standard causal processes, such as those that underlie hallucination. In such cases, we don’t perceive an external object and so there must be another object that we perceive, having the properties that appear to us (invoking item 3 of the Classical Notion). These cases could be phenomenally indistinguishable from normal perception. Hence, arguing that phenomenally indistinguishable items should be classified as the same type of object (as in Price’s Argument from Illusion, Sec. 2.2.3, above), we should conclude that in the normal case we also don’t directly perceive an external object.

In addition to making these various arguments for sense data, Robinson (1994: ch. 7) also raises objections against what he takes to be the primary opponents: intentionalism and the adverbial theory. He further suggests that, if his arguments for sense data are sound, this finding would support a phenomenalistic idealism over physical realism (1994: chs. 8–9). (On idealism, see Guyer & Horstmann 2015 [2021]; on realism, Miller 2002 [2019].)

For those who would avoid both mental and non-mental perceptual intermediaries, the theory of “Naturalized Sense Data” (NSD) is of interest (Bermúdez 2000). It distinguishes between what is directly perceived and what is immediately perceived. In this scheme, three-dimensional objects are directly perceived but not immediately perceived. We immediately perceive the portion of the surface of the object that is visible at any moment. Because we immediately perceive a portion of the three-dimensional object, we are able to make ostensive reference to the three-dimensional object itself and so, it is claimed, to perceive it directly. NSD assumes that naïve realism holds that we immediately perceive three-dimensional objects as a whole; NSD therefore rejects naïve realism, since according to NSD we immediately perceive only surface-portions (2000: 369–372). NSD objects to traditional sense-data theory as placing an unnecessary intermediary between the perceiver and ostended objects (2000: 370–371).

There are two problems with this position. First, as Bermúdez observes, if it is to avoid bringing in mentalistic factors, it requires a physicalist account of color as a surface property, which has not been forthcoming (2000: 368, n. 14; 373). Second, if a physical surface-portion provides the immediate object of perception, then it provides the phenomenal content of our perception. When Moore endorsed surface-portions as immediate objects, he noted the problem that if a surface of a round penny (seen obliquely) is the object of perception, it should appear round. Since he held that it did not, he felt compelled to say that the sense datum appears elliptical but is round, thereby sundering the immediacy by bringing a separate “appearance” into the mix. A defender of NSD might counter Moore’s response by saying that the penny in fact looks round and slanted, so there is no disparity between physical surface-portion and phenomenal perception. But then Price’s objection arises. Price allowed for what is now called full shape constancy within a few feet of the observer: the round penny at a slant would appear round. But he noted that, beyond a few feet, constancy starts to break down.[24] This creates a problem for NSD: within the framework set out here, it would need to recognize “appearances” with content that differs from the actual structure of a surface-portion. This violates the intent of NSD, which is to establish an account in which the phenomenal content of perceptual experience is provided by the properties of the surface-portion itself, without needing to invoke appearances in addition to immediately perceived surface-portions.

5. Conclusion

The core notion of a sense datum is an immediately given, minimal perceptual object, consisting in the case of vision of a shaped patch of color. Often, but not always, this datum was considered to be two dimensional. It typically was contrasted with the perception of a three-dimensional material object of a particular kind and displaying a panoply of further properties. In the classical period (the first several decades of the twentieth century), sense data were typically taken to be non-mental and mind-independent, and were often regarded as representing material objects. In some cases, sense data or their kin were taken to be elemental constituents in the composition or bundling of sense particulars. These particulars did not refer to material objects per se but, when conjoined, composed a perceptual world (as in Russell 1914a and 1914b). More recently, sense data have been viewed as mental items (e.g., Jackson 1977), and perhaps as leading to idealism (Robinson 1994). In a few cases, sense data have been equated with portions of the surface of a material object (Moore 1918–19: 23–24; Bermúdez 2000).

The theory of sense data is a species of a genera of positions in perception theory, which make a distinction between an impoverished sense impression and the perception, affirmation, or judgment of a further entity, usually a material object. Although sharing this distinction, other species in this genus differ from sense-data theory in various ways, the most fundamental being that they do not posit an object having the properties of color and shape as found in conscious perception (item 3). Some views render perceived properties as appearances. One type of appearance theory holds that shape, color, and other perceived object-properties are intentional contents (intentionalism). Another type holds that experiences of shapes and colors are manners or modes of perceiving (adverbialism). Adherents of both types of theory reject the act-object analysis and so would reject item 8 of the Classical Notion; and, of course, they would also reject items 1 and 2. In another vein, some versions of naïve realism hold that we immediately perceive the surface of an object from a point of view and in three dimensions, and then augment the basic perception to include conceptualized object content (Noë 2004, Brewer 2011). At present, these various positions enjoy more favor than do theories that posit sense data as mental objects or as third things. Indeed, recent discussions in the philosophy of perception frequently use sense data as an example of a concept or an entity to be avoided (e.g., Fish 2010: ch. 2).

Theories that distinguish impoverished sense perception from object perception and cognition have been challenged by what Firth (1949–50) called the “percept theory”, according to which immediate visual experience is of a three-dimensional visual world that manifests object-properties and possibilities for action. This is the tradition of James, the Gestalt psychologists, Gibson, and some of the appearance theories (e.g., Smith 2002). Such theories have grown in favor recently. But sense-data theories have also shown development. Many sense-data theories recognize the immediate objects of perception to be three-dimensional. This would permit a penny seen at a moderate slant to be described as appearing as a circle at a slant, not an ellipse. Finally, although treatment of color as a primitive property that literally inheres in sense data (whether such data are considered to be surface portions, mental objects, or third things) is not widely favored, it is also true that, metaphysically, there is no settled home for phenomenally experienced color. The endeavor to account for the phenomenal characteristics of objects and their properties is ongoing.


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I am indebted to an anonymous referee for many helpful queries and suggestions and to Louise Daoust, Elle Kirsch, Pen Maddy, Holly Pittman, Tiina Rosenqvist, and Evan Sommers for raising many important points.

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