Notes to Skepticism

1. That something is widely acknowledged to be true certainly does not mean that no philosopher has denied it. For a denial that propositional knowledge requires belief, see Radford 1966.

2. See the previous footnote.

3. For more on suspension of judgment, see Friedman (2013, 2017).

4. Notice that a universal form of Cartesian Skepticism is inconsistent, for reasons related to our discussion of whether Pyrrhonian Skepticism is self-refuting. A universal form of Cartesian Skepticism would have to hold, for some proposition of the form “Suspension of judgment is the only justified attitude regarding p”, both that suspension of judgment and belief are each the only justified attitude to hold towards it. For arguments that Cartesian skepticism is self-refuting, see Wilson (2012) and Rinard (2018).

5. See, for example, DeRose and Warfield 1999. In that volume most of the authors take the CP-style argument to be the primary one. There is a good discussion of Cartesian Skepticism in the Introduction to that volume. Frances (2005) argues that special kinds of skeptical hypotheses generate limited but insidious forms of skepticism.

6. Alternatively, CP might be further patched by adding the requirement that the subject in question performs the requisite deduction and believes q on this basis. This version of CP brings it closer to so-called “Transmission Principles”—see the entry on transmission of justification and warrant.

7. For another, similar, proposed counterexample, see Audi 1988: 77.

8. In other words, Dretske-style cases seem to be, at best, counterexample to Transmission Principles rather than CP. See footnote 5.

9. The possibility of our having foundational justification for believing p can still work as an alternative to Dretske’s construction of CP.

10. Nozick’s account is in direct conflict with a knowledge version of CP, but we are assuming that if the knowledge version fails, then so does the justification version. See section 1 for more on this.

11. For a full discussion of Nozick’s account of knowledge, see Luper-Foy 1987.

12. It is crucial to note that the truth of CP does not depend upon the antecedent being fulfilled. It is also important to note that Nozick himself thought that his analysis entailed that although we do not know that we are not the victims in a skeptical scenario, we do know ordinary propositions.

13. Our discussion of safety is taken from Comesaña 2007.

14. Williamson 2000 also proposes what he calls a “safety” condition on knowledge, and he cites Sosa approvingly. However, Williamson is not averse to understanding safety in terms of knowledge, which goes against Sosa’s project.

15. Notice that, for similar reasons, Nozick’s third condition also cannot be understood in terms of the standard semantics for subjunctives.

16. It is interesting to note in this regard that Hobbes 1651 had already appealed to the asymmetry of indiscriminability with regard to the dreaming hypothesis.

17. This section borrows from Comesaña 2005a.

18. We are ignoring here disjunctivism about perceptual experience (see entry on the disjunctive theory of perception).

19. Inferentially justified beliefs can aid in justifying yet further beliefs, but they themselves must be justified at least in part on the basis of basic beliefs. This recursive structure for justification is related to our discussion above regarding whether Closure by itself has untoward consequences.

20. Primitivists are usually classified as internalists too.

21. We already encountered Positism in our discussion of Cartesian Skepticism, there in the guise of the view that no evidence justifies us in believing the negation of skeptical hypotheses. The name “Positism” is from Van Cleve 2005.

Copyright © 2019 by
Juan Comesaña <>
Peter Klein

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