Transmission of Justification and Warrant
Ted is on his way to the Philosophy Department, early in the freezing morning. Although he doesn’t know how cold it is, Ted conjectures that the temperature must be below 0 °C. Out of curiosity, he checks the weather app of his smartphone. To his astonishment, he sees that it is −30 °C. He concludes that this is the least temperature to which he has been exposed ever. Ted’s belief about his personal record owes its justification to Ted’s belief that it is −30 °C, justified by the evidence supplied by his smartphone, and Ted’s acknowledging that if it is −30 °C, then this is the least temperature to which he has been exposed ever. When one’s belief q derives its justification from the justification that one has for another belief p in this way, it has become customary to say that the justification for p transmits to q across the inferential link from p to q.
Transmission of justification across inference is a valuable and indeed ubiquitous epistemic phenomenon in everyday life and science. It is thanks to the phenomenon of epistemic transmission that inferential reasoning is a means for substantiating predictions of future events and, more generally, for expanding the sphere of our justified beliefs or reinforcing the justification of beliefs that we already entertain. However, transmission of justification is not without exceptions. As a few epistemologists have come to realise, more or less trivial forms of circularity can prevent justification from transmitting from p to q even if one has justification for p and one is aware of the inferential link from p to q. In interesting cases this happens because one can acquire justification for p only if one has independent justification for q. In this case the justification for q cannot depend on the justification for p and the inferential link from p to q, as genuine transmission would require.
The phenomenon of transmission failure seems to shed light on philosophical puzzles, such as Moore’s proof of a material world and McKinsey’s paradox, and it plays a central role in various philosophical debates. For this reason it is being granted continued and increasing attention.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Epistemic Transmission
- 3. Failure of Epistemic Transmission
- 4. Transmissivity as Resolving Doubts
- 5. Applications
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Arthur has the measles and stays in a closed environment with his
little sister Mafalda. If Mafalda ends up contracting the measles
herself because of her staying in close contact with Arthur, there
must be something—the measles virus—which is transmitted
from Arthur to Mafalda in virtue of a relation—the relation of
staying in close contact with one another—instantiated by the
two siblings. Epistemologists have been devoting their attention to
the fact that epistemicproperties—like being justified
or being known—are often transmitted in a similar way. An
example—which we shall not discuss in this entry—is the
transmission of knowledge via testimony from an individual to another.
A different but equally important phenomenon—which occupies
centre stage in this entry—is the transmission of epistemic
justification across an inference or argument from one proposition to
Consider proposition q constituting the conclusion of an argument having proposition p as premise (where p can be a set or conjunction of more propositions). If p is justified for a subject s by evidence e, this justification may transmit to q if s is aware of the entailment between p and q. When this happens, q is justified for s in virtue of her justification for p based on e and her knowledge of the inferential relation from p to q. Consider this example from Wright (2002):
E1. Three hours ago, Jones inadvertently consumed a large risotto of Boletus Satana.
P1. Jones has absorbed a lethal quantity of the toxins that toadstool contains.
Q1. Jones will shortly die.
Here a subject s can deductively infer Q1 from P1 given some background information. Suppose s acquires justification for P1 by learning E1. In this case s will also acquire justification for Q1 in virtue of her knowledge of the inferential relation from P1 to Q1 and her justification for P1. Thus s’s justification for P1 will transmit to Q1.
It is widely recognised that epistemic justification sometimes fails to transmit across an inference or argument. In interesting cases of transmission failure, s has justification for believing p and s knows the inferential link between p and q, but s has no justification for believing q in virtue of her justification for p and her knowledge of the inferential link. Here is an example from Wright (2003). Suppose s’s background information entails, among ordinary things, that Jessica and Jocelyn are indistinguishable twins. Consider this possible reasoning:
E2. This girl looks just like Jessica.
P2. This girl is actually Jessica.
Q2. This girl is not Jocelyn.
In Twins E2 can give s justification for believing P2 only if s has independent justification for believing Q2 in the first instance. Suppose that s does have independent justification for believing Q2, and imagine that s learns E2. In this case s will acquire justification for believing P2 from E2. But it is intuitive that s will acquire no justification for Q2 in virtue of her justification for believing P2 based on E2 and her knowledge of the inferential link between P2 and Q2. So Twins instantiates transmission failure when Q2 is independently justified.
An argument incapable of transmitting to its conclusion a specific justification for its premise(s)—e.g., a justification based on evidence e—may turn out to be able to transmit to the same conclusion a different justification for its premise(s)—e.g., one based on different evidence e*. Replace for instance E2 with E2* = ‘This girl’s passport certifies she is Jessica’ in Twins. E2* appears capable of providing s with justification for believing P2 even if s has no independent justification for Q2. Suppose then that s has no independent justification for Q2, and that she acquires E2*. It is intuitive that s will acquire justification from E2* for P2 that does transmit to Q2. Now the inference from P2 to Q2 instantiates epistemic transmission.
Although many of the epistemologists taking part in the debate on epistemic transmission and transmission failure speak of transmission of warrant, rather than justification, they all seem to use the term ‘warrant’ to refer to some kind of epistemic justification. Most epistemologists investigating epistemic transmission and transmission failure—e.g., Wright (2011, 2007, 2004, 2003, 2002 and 1985), Davies (2003a, 2000 and 1998), Dretske (2005), Pryor (2004), Moretti (2012) and Moretti & Piazza (2013)—broadly identify the epistemic property capable of being transmitted with propositional justification. Only a few authors explicitly focus on transmission of doxastic justification—e.g., Silins (2005), Davies (2009) and Tucker (2010a and 2010b). In this entry we will follow the majority in discussing transmission and failure of transmission of justification as phenomena primarily pertaining to propositional justification. (See however the supplement on Transmission of Propositional Justification versus Transmission of Doxastic Justification.)
Epistemologists typically concentrate on transmission of (propositional or doxastic) justification across deductively valid arguments (or arguments deductively valid given background information). The fact that justification can transmit across deduction is crucial for our cognitive processes because it makes the advancement of knowledge—or of justified belief—through deductive reasoning possible. Suppose evidence e gives you justification for believing hypothesis or proposition p and you know that p entails another proposition q that you have not directly checked. If the justification you have for p transmits to its unchecked prediction q through the entailment, you acquire justification for believing q too.
Epistemologists may analyse epistemic transmission across ampliative (or inductive) inferences too. (Note that arguments deductively valid given background information can often be turned into good ampliative arguments by simply removing some background information.) Yet this topic has received much less attention in the recent literature on epistemic transmission. (See however interesting remarks in Tucker 2010a.)
In the remaining part of this entry we will focus on transmission and transmission failure of propositional justification across deductive inference. Unless differently specified, by ‘epistemic justification’ or ‘justification’ we will always mean ‘propositional justification’.
As said, s’s justification for p based on evidence e transmits across entailment from p to p’s consequence q whenever q is justified for s in virtue of s’s justification for p based on e and her knowledge of q’s deducibility from p. This initial characterisation can be distilled into three conditions individually necessary and jointly sufficient for epistemic transmission:
s’s justification for p based on e transmits to p’s logical consequence q if and only if:
(i) s has justification for believing p based on e, (ii) s knows that q is deducible from p, and (iii) s has justification for believing q in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii).
Condition (iii) is crucial for distinguishing transmission of
justification across (known) entailment from closure of
justification across (known) entailment. To say that a subject
s’s justification for believing p is closed under
p’s (known) entailment to q is to say that:
If (i) s has justification for believing p and (ii) s knows that p entails q, then (iii-c) s has justification for believing q.
One can coherently accept the above principle—known as the
principle of epistemic closure—and
deny a corresponding principle of epistemic transmission,
cashed out in terms of the conditions outlined above:
If (i) s has justification for believing p and (ii) s knows that p entails q, then (iii) s has justification for believing q in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii).
The principle of epistemic closure just requires that when s has justification for believing p and knows that q is deducible from p, s have justification for believing q. In addition, the principle of epistemic transmission requires this justification to be had in virtue of her having justification for p and knowing that p entails q (for further discussion see Tucker 2010b).
Another important distinction, at this juncture, is the one between the principle of epistemic transmission and a different principle of transmission discussed by Pritchard (2012) under the label of evidential transmission principle. According to it,
If s perceptually knows that p in virtue of evidence set e, and s competently deduces q from p (thereby coming to believe that q while retaining her knowledge that p), then s knows that q, where that knowledge is sufficiently supported by e. (Pritchard 2012, 75)
Pritchard’s principle, to begin with, pertains to (perceptual)
knowledge and not to propositional justification. Moreover, it
deserves emphasis that there are inferences that apparently satisfy
Pritchard’s principle but fail to satisfy the principle of
epistemic transmission. Consider for instance the following triad:
E3. The animals in the pen look like zebras.
P3. The animals in the pen are zebras.
Q3. The animals in the pen are not mules cleverly disguised so as to look like zebras.
According to Pritchard, the evidence set of a normal zoo-goer standing before the zebra enclosure will typically include, above and beyond E3, the background proposition that (EB) to disguise mules like zebras would be very costly and time-consuming, would bring no comparable benefit and would be relatively easy to unmask. Suppose s knows P3 on the basis of her evidence set, and competently deduces Q3 from P3 thereby coming to believe Q3. Pritchard’s evidential transmission principle apparently accommodates the fact that s thereby comes to know Q3. For her evidence set — because of its inclusion of EB — sufficiently supports Q3. But the principle of epistemic transmission is not satisfied. Although (i) s has justification for P3 and (ii) she knows that P3 entails Q3, she has justification for believing Q3 in virtue of, not (i) and (ii), but the independent support lent to it by EB.
Condition (iii) is sufficient to distinguish the notion of epistemic transmission from different notions in the neighbourhood. However, as it stands, it is still unsuitable for the purpose to completely characterize the phenomenon of epistemic transmission. The problem is that there are many other cases in which it is intuitive that the justification for p based on e transmits to q even if condition (iii), strictly speaking, is not satisfied. These cases can be described as situations in which only part of the justification that s has for q is based on her justification for p and her knowledge of the entailment from p to q. Consider the following example. Suppose you are travelling on a train heading to Edinburgh. At 16:00, as you enter Newcastle upon Tyne, you spot the train station sign. Then, at 16:05, the ticket controller tells you that you are not yet in Scotland. Now consider the following reasoning:
E4. At 16:05 the ticket controller tells you that you are not yet in Scotland.
P4. You are not yet in Scotland.
Q4. You are not yet in Edinburgh.
As you learn E4, given suitable background information, you acquire justification for P4; moreover, to the extent to which you know that not being in Scotland is sufficient for not being in Edinburgh, you also acquire via transmission justification for Q4. This additional justification is transmitted irrespective of the fact that you already have justification for Q4, acquired by spotting the train station sign ‘Newcastle upon Tyne’. If (iii) were read as requiring that the whole of the justification available for a proposition q were had in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii), cases like these would become invisible.
A simple way to deal with this complication is to amend the tripartite analysis of epistemic transmission by turning (iii) into (iii+), saying that at least part of the justification that s has for q has been achieved by her in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). Let us say that a justification for q is an additional justification for q whenever it is not a first-time justification for it. Condition (iii+) can be reformulated as the following disjunction:
s has first-time justification for q in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii),
s has an additional justification for q in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii).
Much of the extant literature on epistemic transmission concentrates on examples of transmission of first-time justification. These examples include Toadstool. We have seen, however, that what intuitively transmits in certain cases is simply additional justification. Epistemologists have identified at least two—possibly overlapping—kinds of additional justification (cf. for instance Moretti & Piazza 2013).
One is what can be called independent justification because it appears—intuitively—independent of the original justification for q. This notion of justification could probably be sharpened by appealing to counterfactual analysis. Suppose s’s justification for p based on e transmits to p’s logical consequence q. This justification transmitted to q is an additional independent justification just in case the following three conditions are met: (1) s was already justified in believing q before acquiring e, (2) as s acquires e, s is still justified in believing q, and (3) if s had not been antecedently justified in believing q, upon learning e, s would have acquired via transmission a first-time justification for believing q. Journey instantiates transmission of justification by meeting (1), (2) and (3). Thus Journey exemplifies a case of transmission of additional independent justification.
Consider now that justification for a proposition or belief normally comes in degrees of strength. The second kind of additional justification can be characterised as quantitatively strengthening justification. Suppose again that s’s justification for p based on e transmits to p’s logical consequence q. This justification transmitted to q is an additional quantitatively strengthening justification just in case the following two conditions are satisfied: (1) s was already justified in believing q before acquiring e, and (2*) as s acquires e, the strength of s’s justification for believing q increases. Here is an example from Moretti (2012). Your background information says that only one ticket out of 5,000 of a fair lottery has been bought by a person born in 1970, and that all other tickets have been bought by older or younger people. Consider now this reasoning:
E5. The lottery winner’s passport certifies she was born in 1980.
P5. The lottery’s winner was born in 1980.
Q5. The lottery’s winner was not born in 1970.
The proposition Q5 given its high chance, is already justified on your background information only. As you learn E5, it is intuitive that you acquire an additional quantitatively strengthening justification for Q5 via transmission. For your justification for P5 transmitted to Q5 is intuitively quantitatively stronger than your initial justification for Q5.
In many cases when q receives via transmission from p an
additional independent justification, q will also receive a
quantitatively strengthening justification. This is not true in
general though. For there seem to be cases in which an additional
independent justification transmitted from p to q
intuitively lessens an antecedent justification for q
(cf. Wright 2011).
An interesting question is whether it is true that as q
receives via transmission from p an additional quantitatively
strengthening justification, q also receives an independent
justification. This seems true in some cases—for instance in
Lottery above. It is controversial, however, whether it is the
case that whenever q receives via transmission a
quantitatively strengthening justification, q also receives an
independent justification. Wright 2011, and Moretti & Piazza 2013
describe two examples in which a subject allegedly receives via
transmission a quantitatively strengthening but not independent
To summarise, additional justification comes apparently in two species at least: independent justification and quantitatively strengthening justification. This fact enables us to lay down three specifications of the general condition (iii+) necessary for justification transmission, each of which represents a condition necessary for the transmission of one particular type of justification. Let us call these specifications (iii-ft), (iii-ai) and (iii-aqs).
(iii-ft) s has first time justification for q in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii).
(iii-ai) s has additional independent justification for q in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii).
(iii-aqs) s has additional quantitatively strengthening justification for q in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii).
Transmission of first-time justification makes the advancement of justified belief through deductive reasoning possible. However, the acquisition of first-time justification for q is not the sole possible improvement of one’s epistemic position relative to q that one could expect from transmission of justification. Moretti & Piazza (2013, 2491–93), for instance, have described a variety of different ways in which s’s epistemic standing toward a proposition can be improved upon the acquisition via transmission of an additional justification for it.
It is widely acknowledged that justification sometimes fails to transmit across known entailment (this acknowledgement dates back at least to Wright 1985). Moreover, it is no overstatement to say that the recent literature has investigated the phenomenon of failure of transmission of justification more extensively than that of transmission of justification. As we have seen, justification based on e transmits from p to q across the entailment if and only if (i) s has justification for p based on e, (ii) s knows that q is deducible from p, and (iii+) at least part of s’s justification for q is based on the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). It follows from this characterisation that no justification based on e transmits from p to q across the entailment if condition (i), condition (ii), or condition (iii+) are not satisfied. These are cases of transmission failure.
The most trivial cases of transmission failure are such that it is true that condition (iii+) is unsatisfied because condition (i) or condition (ii) are unsatisfied, but it is also true that (iii+) would have been satisfied if both condition (i) and (ii) have been satisfied (cf. Tucker 2010b). It deserves emphasis that these cases involve arguments that are not unsuitable for the purpose to transmit justification depending on evidence e: had the epistemic circumstances been congenial to the satisfaction of (i) and (ii), these arguments would have transmitted the justification based on e from p to q. As we could put the point, these arguments are transmissive of the justification depending on e.
More interesting cases of transmission failure—or, for some authors (e.g., Beebee 2001), the only genuine cases of transmission failure—are those in which condition (iii+) is not satisfied because it could not have been satisfied, no matter whether or not conditions (i) and (ii) have been satisfied. These cases concern arguments non-transmissive of justification depending on a given evidence, i.e., arguments incapable of transmitting justification depending on that evidence under any epistemic circumstance. One example in point is provided by Twins. Suppose first that s has independent justification for Q2. In those circumstances (i) s has justification from E2 for P2. Furthermore (ii) s does know that P2 entails Q2. However, s has not justification for Q2 in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). So (iii+) is not met. Suppose now that s has no independent justification for Q2. Then, it is not the case that (i) s has justification from E2 for P2. So, in this case (iii+) is not met either. Since there is no other possibility — either s has independent justification for Q2 or she doesn’t — it cannot be the case that s’s belief that Q2 is justified in virtue of her justification for P2 from E2 and her knowledge that P2 entails Q2.
It is worth noting that none of these cases of failure of transmission of justification considered above entails failure of epistemic closure. For in none of these cases s has justification for believing p, s knows that p entails q, and s fails to have justification for believing q.
Unsurprisingly, the epistemologists contributing to the literature on transmission failure have principally devoted their attention to the cases of transmission failure involving non-transmissive arguments. Some epistemologists have attempted to identify conditions whose satisfaction suffices to make an argument non-transmissive of justification based on a given evidence. The next section is devoted to reviewing the most influential of these proposals.
Some non-transmissive arguments explicitly feature their conclusion among their premises. Suppose p is justified for s by e, and consider the premise-circular argument that deduces p from itself. This argument cannot satisfy condition (iii+) even if conditions (i) and (ii) are satisfied. The reason is that no part of s’s justification for p can be acquired in virtue of, among other things, the satisfaction of (ii). For if (i) is satisfied, p is justified for s by the relevant evidence e independently of s’s knowledge of p’ self-entailment, thus not in virtue of (ii).
Non-transmissive arguments are not necessarily premise-circular arguments. A different source of non-transmissivity instantiating a subtler form of circularity is the dependence of evidential relations on background or collateral information. This type of dependence is a rather familiar phenomenon: the boiling of a kettle on a camping stove gives one justification for believing that the temperature of the liquid inside is approximately 100 °C only if one knows that the liquid is water and that atmospheric pressure is the one of the sea-level. It doesn’t if one knows that the kettle is on the top of a high mountain, or if one knows that the kettle contains, say, sulphuric acid.
Wright argues, for instance, that the following epistemic set-up, which he calls the information-dependence template, suffices for an argument’s inability to transmit justification.
A body of evidence, e, is an information-dependent justification for a particular proposition p if whether e justifies p depends on what one has by way of collateral information, i. […] Such a relationship is always liable to generate examples of transmission failure: it will do so just when the particular e, p, and i have the feature that needed elements of the relevant i are themselves entailed by p (together perhaps with other warranted premises). In that case, any warrant supplied by e for p will not be transmissible to those elements of i. (2003, 59, edited.)
The claim that s’s justification from e for p requires s to have background information i is customarily understood as equivalent (in this context) to the claim that s’s justification from e for p depends on some type of independent justification for believing or accepting i.
The instantiation of the information-dependence template appears sufficient for an argument’s inability to transmit first-time justification. Consider again the following triad:
E2. This girl looks just like Jessica.
P2. This girl is actually Jessica.
Q2. This girl is not Jocelyn.
Suppose s’s background information entails that Jessica and Jocelyn are indistinguishable twins. Imagine that s acquires E2. It is intuitive that E2 could justify P2 for s in Twins only if s had independent justification for believing Q2 in the first instance. Thus Twins instantiates the information-dependence template. Note that s acquires first-time justification for Q2 in Twins only if (i) E2 gives her justification for P2, (ii) s knows that P2 entails Q2 and (iii-ft) s acquires first-time justification for believing Q2 in virtue of (i) and (ii). The satisfaction of (iii-ft) requires s’s justification for believing Q2 not to be independent of s’s justification from E2 for P2. However, if (i) is true, the informational-dependence template requires s to have justification for believing Q2 independently of s’s justification from E2 for P2. Thus, when the information-dependence template is instantiated, (i) and (iii-ft) cannot be satisfied at once. In general, no argument satisfying this template together with a given evidence will be transmissive of first-time justification based on that evidence.
One may wonder whether a deductive argument from p to q instantiating the information-dependence template will be unable to transmit additional justification for q. The answer seems to be affirmative when the additional justification is independent justification. Suppose the information-dependence template is instantiated such that s’s justification for p from e depends on s’s independent justification for q. Note that s acquires additional independent justification for q only if (i) e gives her justification for p, (ii) s knows that p entails q, and (iii-ai) s acquires an additional independent justification in virtue of (i) and (ii). This additional justification is independent of s’s antecedent justification for q only if, in particular, condition (3) of the characterisation of additional independent justification is satisfied. (3) says that if s had not been antecedently justified in believing q, upon learning e, s would have acquired via transmission a first-time justification for believing q. (3) entails that if q were not antecedently justified for s, e would still justify p for s. Hence, the satisfaction of (3) is incompatible with the instantiation of the information-dependence template, which entails that if s had not antecedent justification for q, e would not justify p for s. The instantiation of the information-dependence template then precludes the transmission of independent justification.
As suggested by Wright (2007, 36) the instantiation of the information-dependence template might also appear sufficient for an argument’s inability to transmit additional quantitatively strengthening justification. This claim might appear intuitively plausible: perhaps it is reasonable to expect that, if the justification from e for p depends on independent justification for another proposition q, the strength of the justification available for q sets an upper bound to the strength of the justification possibly supplied by e for p. However, the examples by Wright (2011) and Moretti & Piazza (2013) mentioned in Sect. 2 appear to undermine this suggestion. For they involve arguments that instantiate the information-dependent template yet seem to transmit quantitatively strengthening justification to their conclusions.
Some authors have attempted Bayesian formalisations of the information dependence template (see the supplement on Bayesian Formalisations of the Information-Dependence Template.) Furthermore, Coliva (2012) has proposed a variant of the same template. In accordance with the information-dependence template, s’s justification from e for p fails to transmit to p’s consequence q whenever s’s possessing that justification for p requires s’s independent justification for q. According to Coliva’s variant, s’s justification from e for p fails to transmit to q whenever s’s possessing the latter justification for p requires s’s independent assumption of q, whether this assumption is justified or not. Pryor (2012, § VII) can be read as pressing objections against Coliva’s template, which are addressed in Coliva (2012).
So far we have seen that non-transmissivity may depend on premise-circularity or on reliance on collateral information. There is at least a third possibility: an argument can be non-transmissive of the justification for its premise(s) based on given evidence because that evidence justifies directly the conclusion—i.e., independently of the argument itself (cf. Davies 2009). In this case the argument instantiates indirectness, for s’s going through the argument would result in nothing but an indirect (and unneeded) detour for justifying its conclusion. If e directly justifies q, no part of the justification for q is based on, among other things, s’s knowledge of the inferential relation between p and q. So (iii+) is unfulfilled whether or not (i) and (ii) are fulfilled. Here is an example from Wright (2002):
E6. Jones has just kicked the ball between the white posts.
P6. Jones has just scored a goal.
Q6. A game of soccer is taking place.
Suppose s learns evidence E6. On ordinary background information (i) E6 justifies P6 for s, (ii) s knows that P6 entails Q6, and E6 also justifies Q6 for s. It seems false, however, that Q6 is justified for s in virtue of the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). Quite the reverse, Q6 seems justified for s by E6 independently the satisfaction of (i) and (ii). This is so because in the (imagined) actual scenario it seems true that s would still possess a justification for Q6 based on E6 even if E6 did not justify P6 for s. Suppose in fact s had noticed that the referee’s assistant raised her flag to signal Jones’s off-side. Against this altered background information, E6 would no longer justify P6 for s but it would still justify Q6 for s. Thus Soccer is non-transmissive of the justification depending on E6. In general, no argument instantiating indirectness in relation to some evidence will be transmissive of justification based on that evidence.
The information-dependence template and indirectness are diagnostics for a deductive argument’s inability to transmit the justification for its premise(s) p based on evidence e to its conclusion q, where e is conceived of as a believed proposition capable of supplying inferential and (typically) fallible justification for p. (Note that even though e is conceived of as a belief, the collateral information i, which is part of the template, doesn’t need to be believed on some views.) The justification for a proposition p might come in further forms. For instance, it has been proposed that a proposition p about the perceivable environment around the subject s can be justified by the fact that s sees that p. In this case, s is claimed to attain a kind of non-inferential and infallible justification for believing p. The latter view has been explored by epistemological disjunctivists (see for instance McDowell 1982, 1994 and 2008, and Pritchard 2007, 2008, 2009, 2011 and 2012).
One might find it intuitively plausible that when s sees that p, s attains non-inferential and infallible justification for believing p that doesn’t rely on s’s background information. Since this justification for believing p would be a fortiori unconstrained by s’s independent justification for believing any consequence q of p, in these cases the information-dependence template could not possibly be instantiated. Therefore, one might be tempted to conclude that when s sees that p, s acquires a justification that typically transmits to the propositions that s knows to be deducible from p (cf. Wright 2002). Pritchard (2009 and 2012) comes very close to endorsing this view explicitly.
The latter contention has not stayed unchallenged. Suppose one accepts a notion of epistemic justification with internalist resonances saying that a factor J is relevant to s’s epistemic justification only if s is able to determine, by reflection alone, whether J is or is not realised. On this notion, s’s seeing that p cannot provide s with justification for believing p unless s can rationally claim that she is seeing that p upon reflection alone. Seeing that p, however, is subjectively indistinguishable from hallucinating that p, or from being in some other delusional state in which it merely seems to s that she is seeing that p. For this reason, one may find it compelling that s can claim by reflection alone that she’s seeing that p only if s has an independent reason for ruling out that it merely seems to her that she does (cf. mainly Wright 2011). If this is true, for many deductive arguments from p to q, s will be unable to acquire non-inferential and infallible justification for believing p of the type described by the disjunctivist and capable of transmitting to q. In particular, this will happen whenever q is the logical negation of a proposition ascribing to s some delusionary mental state in which it merely seems to her that she is directly perceiving that p.
Wright’s disjunctive template is meant to be a diagnostic of failure of transmission of non-inferential justification when epistemic justification is conceived of in the internalist fashion suggested above. According to Wright (2000), for any propositions p, q and r and subject s, the disjunctive template is instantiated whenever:
(a) p entails q;
(b) s’s justification for p consists in s’s being in a state subjectively indistinguishable from a state in which r would be true;
(c) r is incompatible with p;
(d) r would be true if q were false.
To see how this template might apply, consider again the following triad:
E3. The animals in the pen look like zebras.
P3. The animals in the pen are zebras.
Q3. The animals in the pen are not mules cleverly disguised so as to look like zebras.
The justification from E3 for P3 arguably fails to transmit across the inference from P3 to Q3 because of the satisfaction of the information-dependence template. For it seems true that s could acquire a justification for believing P3 on the basis of E3 only if s had an independent justification for believing Q3. But suppose that s’s justification for believing P3 is based not on E3 but on s’s seeing that P3. Let’s call Zebra* the corresponding variant of Zebra. Given the non-inferential nature of the justification considered for P3, Zebra* could not instantiate the information-dependence template. However, it is easy to check that Zebra* instantiates the disjunctive template. To begin with, (a) P3 entails Q3; (b) s’s justification for believing P3 is constituted by s’s seeing that P3, which is subjectively indistinguishable from the state that s would be in if it were true that (R) the animals in the pen are mules cleverly disguised so as to look like zebras; (c) R is incompatible with P3; and, trivially, (d) if Q3 were false R would be true.
Since Zebra* instantiates the disjunctive template, it is non-transmissive of at least first-time justification. In fact note that s acquires first-time justification for Q3 in this case if and only if (i) s has justification for P3 based on seeing that P3, (ii) s knows that P3 entails Q3, and (iii-ft) s acquires first-time justification for believing Q3 in virtue of (i) and (ii). Also note that (iii-ft) requires s’s justification for believing Q3 not to be independent of s’s justification for P3 based on seeing that P3. However, if (i) is true, the disjunctive template requires s to have justification for believing Q3 independent of s’s justification for P3 based on her seeing that P3. (For if s could not independently exclude that Q3 is false, given (d), (c) and (b), s could not exclude that the incompatible alternative R to P3, which s cannot subjectively distinguish from P3 on the ground of her seeing that P3, is true.) Thus, when the disjunctive template is instantiated, (i) and (iii-ft) cannot be satisfied at once.
The disjunctive template has been criticised by McLaughlin (2003) on the ground that the template is instantiated whenever the justification for p is fallible, i.e. compatible with p’s falsity. Here is an example from Brown (2004). Consider the following deductive argument:
P7. The animal in the garbage is a fox.
Q7. The animal in the garbage is not a cat.
Suppose s has a fallible justification for believing P7 based on s’s experience as if the animal in the garbage is a fox. Take now R to be P7’s logical negation. Since the justification that s has for P7 is fallible, condition (b) above is met by default. As one can easily check, conditions (a), (c) and (d) are also met. So Fox instantiates the disjunctive template. Yet it is intuitive that Fox does transmit justification to its conclusion.
One could simply respond to McLaughlin that his argument is misplaced because the disjunctive template was only meant to apply to infallible and not fallible justification. A more useful response to McLaughlin is however to refine the conditions listed in the disjunctive template so as to block McLaughlin’s argument while letting this template account for transmission failure of both fallible and infallible justification. Wright (2011) for instance suggests replacing (c) with the following condition:
(c*) r is incompatible (not necessarily with p but) with some presupposition of the cognitive project of obtaining a justification for p in the relevant fashion.
According to Wright’s (2011) characterisation, a presupposition of a cognitive project is any condition such that doubting it before carrying out the project would rationally commit one to doubting the significance or competence of the project irrespective of its outcome. For a wide class of cognitive projects examples of these presuppositions include: normal and proper functioning of the relevant cognitive faculties, the reliability of utilised instruments, the obtaining of the circumstances congenial to the proposed method of investigation, the soundness of relevant principles of inference utilised in developing and collating one’s results, and so on.
With (c*) in the place of (c), Fox no longer instantiates the disjunctive template. For the truth of R—the proposition that the animal in the garbage is not a fox—appears to jeopardize no presupposition of the cognitive project of obtaining a perceptual justification for P7. Thus (c*) is not fulfilled. On the other hand, arguments that intuitively do not transmit do satisfy (c*). Take again Zebra*. In that case R is the proposition that the animals in the pen are mules cleverly disguised so as to look like zebras. Since R entails that conditions are unsuitable for attaining perceptual justification for believing P3, R looks incompatible with a presupposition of the cognitive project of obtaining perceptual justification for P3. Thus R does satisfy (c*) in this case.
In order to illuminate philosophical puzzles (e.g., McKinsey Paradox illustrated below in Sect. 5.2) Davies has proposed other conditions—which he calls limiting principles—whose satisfaction would prevent an argument from possibly transmitting justification. Some of these principles will be discussed in Sect. 5.1 and Sect. 5.2. Further conditions are considered in Pryor (2012).
To conclude this section we outline an explanation of epistemic transmission failure delivered by Smith (2009), which is very different from all those considered so far. According to Smith, epistemic justification requires reliability. A subject s’s belief that p, held on the basis of s’s belief that e, is reliable in the sense defined by Smith if and only if in all possible worlds including e as true and that are as normal (from the perspective of the actual world) as the truth of e permits, p is also true. Consider Zebra again. s’s belief that P3 — that the animals in the pen are zebras — proves reliable in Smith’s sense when it is based on s’s belief that E3 — that the animals in the pen look like zebras. (Disguising mules so as to make them look like zebras is after all an abnormal practice.) Thus, all possible E3-worlds that are as normal as the truth of E3 permits are not worlds in which the animals in the pen are cleverly disguised mules. Rather, they are P3-worlds—that is to say, worlds in which the animals in the pen are zebras.
Smith distinguishes between two ways in which a belief can come to possess this property of being reliable. One possibility is that a belief that p possesses it in virtue of the modal relationship with its basis e. In this case, e is a contributing reliable basis. Another possibility is when it is the content of the belief that p, rather than the belief’s modal relationship with its basis e, that guarantees by itself the belief’s reliability. In this case, e is a non-contributing reliable basis. An example of the first kind is s’s belief that P3, which is reliable because of its modal relationship with E3. There are obviously many sufficiently normal worlds in which P3 is false, but no sufficiently normal world in which P3 is false and E3 true. An example of the second kind is s’s belief that Q3 as based on E3. It is this belief’s content, and not its modal relationship with E3, that guarantees its reliability. As Smith puts it, there are no sufficiently normal worlds in which E3 is true and Q3 is false, but this is simply because there are no sufficiently normal worlds in which Q3 is false.
According to Smith, roughly, a deductive inference from p to q fails to transmit to q justification relative to p’s basis e, if e is a contributing reliable basis for believing p but is a non-contributing reliable basis for believing q. In this case the inference fails to explain q’s reliability: if s deduced one proposition from another, she would reliably believe that q, but not — not even in part — in virtue of having inferred this proposition from p (as held on the basis of e). Zebra fails to transmit to Q3 justification relative to P3’s basis E3 in this precise sense. (Smith 2009 also includes an account of failure of transmission of knowledge across valid inference criticized by Tucker 2012. A discussion of this account is beyond the aims of this entry.)
Let us say that a subject s doubts q just in case s either disbelieves or withholds belief about q, namely refrains from both believing and disbelieving q after deciding about q. s’s doubting q should be distinguished from s’s being open minded about q and from s’s having no doxastic attitude whatsoever towards q (cf. Tucker 2010a). Let us say that a deductively valid argument from p to q has the power to resolve doubt about its conclusion just in case it is possible for s to be rationally moved from doubting q to believing q solely in virtue of grasping the argument from p to q and the evidence offered for p.
There is today wide agreement in the literature that the property of being a transmissive argument does not coincide with the property of being an argument capable of resolving doubt about its conclusion (see for example, Beebee 2001, Coliva 2010, Markie 2005, Pryor 2004, Bergmann 2004 and 2006, White 2006, Silins 2005 and Tucker 2010a). A reason for thinking so is that whereas the property of being transmissive appears to be a genuinely epistemic property of an argument, the one of resolving doubt seems to be only a dialectical feature of it, which varies with the audience whose doubt the argument is used to address.
In spite of these considerations, a few authors (e.g., Davies 1998, and 2003a, 2004, and 2009, McLaughlin 2000 and Wright 2002, 2003, and 2007) have insisted that we should conceive of epistemic transmissivity in a way that proves very closely related or even identical to the capability of resolving doubt. Whereas some of these authors have eventually conceded that epistemic transmissivity cannot be defined as capability of resolving doubt (e.g., Wright 2011), others have attempted to articulate their views in full (see mostly Davies 2003a, 2004 and 2009). Suppose one wants to claim that an argument is transmissive when it is at the service of resolving a subject’s doubt about the conclusion. One possible way to go — which parallels Jackson’s (1987, §6) analysis of when an argument begs the hearer’s question — is this. An argument could be considered to be non-transmissive when the fact that the subject doubts (or suppositionally doubts) its conclusion, in her own thought, rationally requires the subject to adopt new background assumptions on which the premises are no longer justified by the relevant evidence (cf. Davies 2003a, 2004 and 2009. For a critical discussion of Davies’ project see Coliva 2010). As we will see below, it can be argued that Moore’s proof and the inference central to McKinsey paradox are non-transmissive in this sense.
The notions of transmissive and non-transmissive argument, above and beyond being investigated for their own sake, have been put to work in relation to specific philosophical problems and issues. An important problem is whether Moore’s infamous proof of a material world and similar Moorean responses to the skeptic are successful. Another issue pertains to the solution of McKinsey paradox. A third issue concerns Boghossian’s (2001 and 2003) explanation of our logical knowledge via implicit definitions, criticised as resting on a non-transmissive argument schema (see for instance Ebert 2005 and Jenkins 2008). As the debate focusing on the last topic is only at an early stage of its development, it is preferable to concentrate on the first two, which will be reviewed in respectively Sect. 5.1 and Sect. 5.2 below.
Much of the contemporary debate on Moore’s proof of a material world (see Moore 1939) is interwoven with the topic of epistemic transmission and its failure. Moore’s proof can be reconstructed as follows:
E8. My experience is in all respects as of a hand held up in front of my face.
P8. Here is a hand.
Q8. There is a material world (since any hand is a material object existing in space).
The evidence E8 in Moore is constituted by a proposition believed by s. One might suggest, however, that this is a misinterpretation of Moore’s proof (and the variants of it that we shall consider shortly). One might argue, in other words, that what is meant to give s justification for believing P8 is s’s experience of a hand. Nevertheless, most of the epistemologists taking part in this debate implicitly or explicitly assume that one’s experience as if p and one’s belief that one has an experience as if p have the same justifying power (cf. White 2006 and Silins 2007).
Many philosophers find Moore’s proof unsuccessful. Philosophers have put forward explanations of this impression according to which Moore is non-transmissive in some of the senses described in Sect. 3 (see mainly Wright 1985, 2002, 2007 and 2011) or non-transmissive in the non-standard sense that it is incapable of resolving doubt about its conclusion (see mainly Davies 1998, 2000, 2003a, 2003b, 2004 and 2009). A different explanation is that Moore’s proof does transmit justification but is dialectically ineffective (see mainly Pryor 2004).
According to Wright there exist cornerstone propositions—or simply cornerstones—for different areas of discourse. In accordance with Wright’s characterization of it, c is a cornerstone for an area of discourse d just in case for any proposition p belonging to d, p could not be justified for any subject s if s had no independent justification for accepting c (see mostly Wright 2004). Cornerstones for the area of discourse about perceivable things are for instance the logical negations of skeptical conjectures, such as the proposition that one’s experiences are nothing but one’s hallucinations caused by a Cartesian demon or the Matrix. Wright contends that the conclusion Q8 of Moore is also a cornerstone for the area of discourse about perceivable things. Adapting terminology introduced by Pryor (2004), Wright’s conception of the architecture of perceptual justification thus treats Q8 conservatively with respect to any perceptual hypothesis p: if s had no independent justification for Q8, no proposition e describing an apparent perception could supply s with prima facie justification for any perceptual hypothesis p. It follows from this that Moore instantiates the information-dependence template considered in Sect. 3.2. For Q8 is part of the collateral information which s needs independent justification for if s is to receive some justification for P8 from E8. Hence Moore is non-transmissive. (See mainly Wright 2002.) Note that the thesis that Moore’s proof is epistemologically useless because non-transmissive in the sense explained is compatible with the claim that by learning E8, in Moore,s does acquire a justification for believing P8. For instance, Wright (2004) contends that we all have a special kind of non-evidential justification, which he calls entitlement, for accepting Q8 as well as other cornerstones in general. Thus by learning E8 we do acquire justification for P8. Wright’s analysis of Moore’s proof and Wright’s conservatism have mostly been criticized in conjunction with his theory of entitlement. A presentation of these objections is beyond the scope of this entry. (See however Davies 2004, Pritchard 2005 and Jenkins 2007. For a defense of Wright’s views see for instance Neta 2007.)
As anticipated, other philosophers contend that Moore’s proof does transmit justification and that its ineffectiveness has a different explanation. An important conception of the architecture of perceptual justification, called dogmatism in Pryor (2000 and 2004), embraces a generalised form of liberalism about perceptual justification. This form of liberalism is opposed to Wright’s conservatism, and claims that in order to have prima facie perceptual justification for believing p from an apparent perception that p, s doesn’t need independent justification for believing the negation of skeptical conjectures or of other non-perceiving hypotheses like Not-Q8. This is so, for the dogmatist, because our experiences give us immediate and prima facie justification for believing their contents. Saying that our perceptual justification is immediate is saying that it does not presuppose—not even in part—justification for anything else. Saying that our justification is prima facie is saying that it can be defeated by additional evidence. Our perceptual justification would be defeated, for example, by evidence that a relevant non-perceiving hypothesis is true or just as probable as its negation. For instance, s’s perceptual justification for believing P8 in Moore’s proof would be defeated by evidence that Not-Q8 is true, or evidence that Q8 and Not-Q8 are equally probable. On this point the dogmatist and Wright do agree. They disagree on whether s’s perceptual justification for P8 requires independent justification for believing or accepting Q8. The dogmatist denies that s needs that independent justification. Thus, according to the dogmatist, Moore’s proof transmits the perceptual justification available for its premise to its conclusion.
The dogmatist argues (or may argue), however, that Moore’s proof is dialectically flawed (cf. Pryor 2004). The contention is that Moore’s is unsuccessful because it is useless for the purpose to convince the idealist or the external world sceptic that there is a material world. In short, the idealist and the global sceptic don’t believe that there is a material world. Since the idealist and the sceptic don’t believe Q8, they are rationally required to distrust any perceptual evidence offered in favor of P8 in the first instance. For this reason they both will reject Moore’s proof as one based on an unjustified premise. Moretti (2014) suggests that the dogmatist could alternatively contend that Moore’s proof is non-transmissive because s’s experience of a hand gives s immediate justification for believing the conclusion Q8 of the proof. According to this diagnosis, Moore’s proof is epistemically flawed because it instantiates a variant of indirectness in which the evidence is an experience of a hand. Pryor’s analysis of Moore’s proof has principally been criticised in conjunction with his liberalism in epistemology of perception. (See Cohen 2002 and 2005, Schiffer 2004 Wright 2007, White 2006, and Siegel and Silins 2015.)
Some authors (e.g., Wright 2003, Pryor 2004, White 2006, Silins 2007, Neta 2010) have investigated whether certain variants of Moore are transmissive of justification. These arguments start from a premise like P8, describing a (supposed) perceivable state of affairs of the external world, and deduce from it the logical negation of a relevant skeptical conjecture. Consider for example the variant of Moore that starts from P8 and replaces Q8 with:
Q8*. It is not the case that I am a handless brain in a vat fed with the hallucination of a hand held up in front of my face.
Let’s call Moore* this variant of Moore. While dogmatists à la Pryor argue (or may argue) that Moore* is transmissive but dialectically flawed (cf. Pryor 2004), conservatives à la Wright contend (or may contend) that it is non-transmissive (cf. Wright 2007). Although it remains very controversial whether or not Moore is transmissive, epistemologists have found some prima facie reason to think that arguments like Moore* are non-transmissive.
An important difference between Moore and Moore* is this: whereas the logical negation of Q8 does not explain the evidential statement E8 (“My experience is in all respects as of a hand held up in front of my face”) adduced in support of P8, the logical negation of Q8* — i.e., Not-Q8* — explains E8 to some extent. Accordingly, since Not-Q8* provides a potential explanation of E8, is it intuitive that E8 is evidence (perhaps very week evidence) for believing Not-Q8*. It is easy to conclude from this that s cannot acquire justification for believing Q8* via transmission through Moore* upon learning E8. For it is intuitive that if this were the case, E8 should count as evidence for Q8*. But this is impossible: one and the same proposition cannot simultaneously be evidence for a hypothesis and its logical negation. By formalizing intuitions of this type, White (2006) has put forward a simple Bayesian argument to the effect that Moore* and similar variants of Moore are not transmissive of justification. (See Silins 2007 for discussion. For responses to White, see for instance Weatherson 2007, Kung 2010 and Moretti 2015).
From the above analysis it is easy to conclude that the information-dependence template is satisfied by Moore* and akin proofs. In fact note that if E8 is evidence for both P8 and Not-Q8*, it seems correct to say that s can acquire a justification for believing P8 only if s has independent justification for disbelieving Not-Q8* and thus believing Q8*. Since Not-Q8* counts as a non-perceiving hypothesis for Pryor, this gives us a reason to doubt dogmatism (cf. White 2006).
Coliva (2005 and 2012) defends a view — baptized by her moderatism — that aims to be a middle way between Wright’s conservatism and Pryor’s dogmatism. On the one hand, the moderate contends — against the conservative — that cornerstones cannot be justified and that in order to possess perceptual justification s needs no justification for accepting any cornerstones. On the other hand, the moderate claims — against the dogmatist — that to possess perceptual justification s needs to assume (without justification) relevant cornerstones. By relying on her variant of the information-dependent template described in Sect. 3.2, Coliva concludes that neither Moore nor any proof like Moore* is transmissive. (For a critical discussion of moderatism see for instance Avnur 2017, Baghramian 2017, Millar 2017, Volpe 2017, and Coliva 2017.)
Epistemological disjunctivists like McDowell and Pritchard have argued that in paradigmatic cases of perceptual knowledge, what is meant to give s justification for believing P8 is, not E8, but s’s factive state of seeing that P8. This — it might be contended — is not without consequences with respect to the question whether Moore* transmits propositional justification. Pritchard explicitly defends the claim that when s sees that P8, thereby learning that P8, s can come to know by inference from P8 the negation of any sceptical hypothesis inconsistent with P8, like Q8* (cf. Pritchard 2012, 129–30). This might encourage the belief that, for Pritchard, the inference in Moore* can transmit the justification for P8 based on s’s seeing that P8 across the entailment from P8 to Q8* (see Lockhart 2018 for an explicit argument to this effect). The latter claim must however be handled with some care.
As we have seen in Sect. 2, Pritchard contends that when one knows p on the basis of evidence e, one can know p’s consequence q by inference from p only if e sufficiently supports q. For Pritchard this condition is met when s’s support for believing P8 is constituted by s’s seeing that P8, s’s epistemic situation is objectively good (i.e., s’s cognitive faculties are working properly in a cooperative environment) and the skeptical hypothesis ruled out by Q8* has not been epistemically motivated. For, in this case, s has a reflectively accessible factive support for believing P8 that entails — and so sufficiently supports — Q8*. Thus, in this case nothing stands in the way of s competently deducing Q8* from P8, thereby coming to know Q8* on the basis of P8.
If upon deducing one proposition from another, s comes to justifiably believe Q8* for the first-time, the inference from P8 to Q8* arguably transmits doxastic justification. (See the supplement on Transmission of Propositional Justification versus Transmission of Doxastic Justification.) It is more dubious, however, that when s’s support for P8 is constituted by s’s seeing that P8, Moore* is also transmissive of propositional justification. For instance, one might contend that Moore* is non-transmissive because it instantiates the disjunctive template described in Sect. 3.2 (cf. Wright 2002). To start with, P8 entails Q8*, so (a) is satisfied. Let R* be the proposition that this is no hand but s is victim of a hallucination of a hand held up before her face. Since R* would be true if Q8* were false, (d) is also satisfied. Furthermore, take the grounds of s’s justification for P8 to be s’s seeing that P8. Since this experience is a state for s indistinguishable from one in which R* is true, condition (b) is also satisfied. Finally, it might be argued that the proposition that one is not hallucinating is a presupposition of the cognitive project of learning about one’s environment through perception. It follows that R* is incompatible with a presupposition of s’s cognitive project of learning about one’s environment through perception. Thus (c*) appears to be fulfilled too. So Moore* will not transmit the justification that s possesses for P8 to Q8*.
To resist the this conclusion, a disjunctivist might insist that Moore*, relative to s’s support for P8 supplied by s’s seeing that P8, does not always instantiate the disjunctive template, in particular because condition (b) is not necessarily fulfilled (cf. Lockhart 2018.) By appealing to a distinction drawn by Pritchard (2012), one might contend that (b) is not necessarily fulfilled, because s, though unable to perceptually discriminate between seeing that P8 and merely hallucinating it, may have evidence that favors the hypothesis that she is in the first state. For Pritchard, this happens — as we have seen — when s sees that P8 in good epistemic conditions and the skeptical conjecture that s is having a hallucination of a hand has not been epistemically motivated. In this case, s is in position to come to know Q8* by inference from P8 even if she is unable to perceptually discriminate one situation from the other.
Pritchard’s thesis that, in good epistemic conditions, s’s factive support for believing P8 coinciding with s’s seeing that P8 is reflectively accessible is open to controversy (cf. Piazza 2016 and Lockhart 2018). Since this thesis is essential to the contention that Moore* may not instantiate the disjunctive template and may thus be transmissive of propositional justification, the latter contention is also open to controversy.
One could explain the ineffectiveness of Moore and similar proofs in a specific way that differs from any of the diagnoses described so far. This new account diagnoses Moorean proofs with being non-transmissive in the precise sense (discussed Sect. 4) of being incapable of resolving doubt about their conclusions.
Diagnoses of non-transmissivity as incapability of resolving doubt can be systematised by appealing to limitation principles—i.e., principles that restrain justification transmission. For instance, a limitation principle that seems to explain why Moore is non-transmissive as incapable of resolving doubt about its conclusion has been proposed by Davies (2009) and it reads roughly as follows:
LP. The justification from e for believing the premise(s) p of a valid argument with conclusion q cannot be transmitted from premise(s) to conclusion if doubt about q would directly rationally require acceptance of a defeater for the justification from e for p.
The antecedent of (LP) would seem to be satisfied by E8, P8 and Q8. Suppose s doubted (in her thought) Q8. This alone would rationally commit s to doubting that E8 actually justifies P8. Thus Moore turns out to be non-transmissive when (LP) is in place. (Mutatis mutandis, the same explanation applies to Moore* too.)
Interestingly enough, any argument satisfying the information-dependence template also satisfies the antecedent of (LP). Suppose the justification from e for the premise(s) p of a known deductively valid argument concluding in q is conditional on independent justification for q. This implies that any subject examining the argument who had a doubt about q would be rationally required to accept a defeater for the justification for p based on e. Hence non-transmissivity as incapability of satisfying (iii+) engendered by reliance on collateral information entails non-transmissivity as incapability of resolving doubt.
McKinsey (1991, 2002, 2003 and 2007) has offered a reductio argument for the incompatibility of first-person privileged access to mental content and externalism about mental content. The privileged access thesis roughly says that it is necessarily true that if a subject s is thinking that x, then s can in principle know a priori (or in a non-empirical way) that she herself is thinking that x. Externalism about mental content roughly says that predicates of the form ‘is thinking that x’—e.g., ‘is thinking that water is wet’—express properties that are wide, in the sense that possession of these properties by s logically or conceptually implies the existence of relevant contingent objects external to s’s mind—e.g., water. McKinsey argues that s may reason along these lines:
P9. I am thinking that water is wet.
P10. If I am thinking that water is wet then I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains water.
Q9. I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains water.
Water produces an absurdity. If the privileged access thesis is true, s knows P9 non-empirically. If semantic externalism is true, s knows P10 a priori by mere conceptual analysis. Since P9 and P10 do entail Q9 and knowledge is presumably closed under known entailment, s knows Q9—which is an empirical proposition—by simply competently deducing it from P9 and P10 and without conducting any empirical investigation. As this is absurd, McKinsey concludes that the privileged access thesis or semantic externalism must be false.
One way to resist McKinsey’s incompatibilist conclusion that the privileged access thesis and externalism about mental content cannot be true together is to argue that Water is non-transmissive. Since knowledge is presumably closed under known entailment, it remains true that s cannot know P9 and P10 while failing to know Q9. However, McKinsey paradox originates from the stronger conclusion—motivated by the claim that Water is a deductively valid argument featuring premises knowable non-empirically—that s, by running Water, could come to know non-empirically the empirical proposition Q9 that she or members of her community have had contact with water. This is precisely what could not happen if Water is non-transmissive: in this case s could not learn Q9 on the basis of her non-empirical justification for P9 and P10, and her knowledge of the entailment between P9, P10 and Q9 (see mainly Wright 2000, 2003 and 2011, and Davies 1998, 2000, 2003a, 2003b and 2009).
A first possibility to defend the thesis that Water is non-transmissive is to argue that Water instantiates the disjunctive template (considered in Sect. 3.2) (cf. Wright 2000, 2003 and 2011). If Water is non-transmissive, s could acquire a justification for, or knowledge of, P9 and P10 only if s were in possession of an independent justification for, or knowledge of, Q9. (And to avoid the absurd result that McKinsey recoils from, this independent justification for Q9 should presumably be empirical.) If this diagnosis is correct, one need not deny P9 or P10 to block the intuitively false consequence that s could acquire knowledge of the empirical proposition Q9 in virtue of only non-empirical knowledge.
To substantiate the thesis that Water instantiates the disjunctive template one should first emphasise that the kind of externalism about mental content underlying P10 in Water is compatible with the possibility that s suffers from illusion of content. Were this to happen with P9 in Water, s would seem to introspect that she believes that water is wet whereas there is nothing like that content to be believed by s in the first instance. Consider:
R. ‘water’ refers to no natural kind so that there is no content expressed by the sentence ‘water is wet’.
s’s state of having introspective justification for believing P9 is arguably subjectively indistinguishable from a situation in which R is true. Thus condition (b) of the disjunctive template is met. Moreover, R appears incompatible with an obvious presupposition of s’s cognitive project of attaining introspective justification for believing P9, at least if the content that water is wet embedded in P9 is constrained by s or her linguistic community having being in contact with water. Thus condition (c*) is also met. Furthermore, P9 entails Q9 (when P10 is in background information). Hence condition (a) is fulfilled. If we could also show that (d) is satisfied in Water, in the sense that if Q9 were false R would be true, we would have shown that the disjunctive template is satisfied by Water. Wright (2000), for instance, takes (d) to be actually fulfilled and concludes that the disjunctive template is satisfied by Water.
Unfortunately, the claim that (d) is satisfied in Water cannot easily be vindicated (cf. Wright 2003). Condition (d) is satisfied in Water only if it is true that if s (or s’s linguistic community) had not been embedded in an environment that contains water, the term ‘water’ would have referred to no natural kind. This is true only if the closest possible world w in which this counterfactual’s antecedent is true is like Boghossian’s (1997) Dry Earth—namely, a world where no one has ever had any contact with any kind of watery stuff, and all apparent contacts with it are always due to multi-sensory hallucination. If w is not Dry Earth, but Putnam’s Twin Earth, however, the counterfactual turns out to be false, as in this possible world people usually have contact with some other watery stuff that they call ‘water’. So, in this world ‘water’ refers to a natural kind, though not to one having chemical composition H2O. Since determining which of Dry Earth or Twin Earth is modally closer to the actual world (supposing s is in the actual world)—and so determining whether (d) is satisfied in Water—is a potentially elusive task, the claim that Water instantiates the disjunctive template appears to be less than fully warranted. 
An alternative dissolution of McKinsey paradox—also based on a diagnosis of non-transmissivity—seems however to be available if one considers the proposition (Q10) saying that s (or s’s linguistic community) has been embedded in an environment containing some watery substance (cf. Wright 2003 and 2011). This alternative strategy assumes that Q10, rather than Q9, is a presupposition of s’s cognitive project of attaining introspective justification for P9.
Even if Water does not instantiate the disjunctive template, a new diagnosis of what’s wrong with McKinsey paradox could rest on the claim that the different argument yielded by expanding Water with Q10 as conclusion — call it Water* — instantiates the disjunctive template. If R is the same proposition displayed above, it is easy to see that Water* satisfies conditions (d), (b) and (c*) of the disjunctive template. Furthermore (a) is satisfied at least in the sense that it seems a priori that P9 via Q9 entails Q10 (if P10 is in background information) (cf. Wright 2011). On this novel diagnosis of non-transmissivity, what would be paradoxical is that s could earn justification for Q10 in virtue of her non-empirical justification for P9 and P10 and her knowledge of the a priori link from P9, P10 via Q9 to Q10. If one follows Wright’s (2003) suggestion that s isentitled to accept Q10 — namely to accept the presupposition that there is a watery substance that provides ‘water’ with its extension — Water becomes innocuously transmissive, and the apparent paradox surrounding Water vanishes. This is so at least if one grants that it is a priori that water is the watery stuff of our actual acquaintance, once it is presupposed that there is any watery stuff of our actual acquaintance. For useful criticism of responses of this type to McKinsey paradox see Sainsbury (2000), Pritchard (2002), Brown (2003) and (2004), McLaughlin (2003), McKinsey (2003) and Kallestrup (2011).
According to a different interpretation, the paradox elicited by Water is to the effect that s would be in position to settle the question—in the sense of removing doubt—about whether she or her community have been embedded in an environment containing water by simply reflecting on the content of her mental states and by attending to some specific implication of content externalism, but without engaging in any empirical investigation. If one accepts this interpretation, a way to dissolve the paradox is to show that Water is non-transmissive precisely in the sense that it is incapable of resolving doubt about its conclusion (cf. Davies 1998, 2000, 2003a and 2009). As we have seen in the previous section, diagnoses of non-transmissivity as incapability of resolving doubt can be systematised by appealing to limitation principles. Consider then following limitation principle, which is alluded to—even if not explicitly formulated—in Davies (2009):
LP*. The justification from e1 and e2 for believing respectively the premise p1 and p2 of a valid argument with conclusion q cannot be transmitted from the premises to the conclusion if doubt about q taken together with the acceptance of the premise p2 as supported by e2 would directly rationally require acceptance of a defeater for the justification for p from e1.
Suppose the antecedent of (LP*) is satisfied by an argument that s has carried out. If s doubts the conclusion of the argument, s should also doubt at least one of its premises. So the argument is unable to dispel doubt about its conclusion and it is non-transmissive in this sense. It can be argued that Water does satisfy the antecedent of (LP*) so that it is non-transmissive in this sense.
Take E9 to be the theory of externalism about mental content. As we have already seen E9 gives s justification for believing P10 in Water—i.e., the conditional: ‘If I am thinking that water is wet, I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains water’. Note that E9 gives s justification for, not only P10, but also the following conditional:
If there is a content such as the proposition that water is wet to be thought by me, then (Q9) I have (or my linguistic community has) been embedded in an environment that contains water.
Suppose now that s doubts Q9. Since Q9 is the consequent of the above conditional, which s accepts, s is committed to doubting its antecedent. So s has to doubt that there is a content like the proposition that water is wet. But s’s doubt that there is such a content for her to think rationally requires s to accept a defeater for her justification for believing P9 offered by her reflective evidence E10. For if there is no content like the proposition that water is wet for s to think, s cannot be thinking that water is wet. In conclusion, it appears that Water satisfies the antecedent of (LP*), and thus seems to prove non-transmissive in the sense of not being able to resolve antecedent doubt about its conclusion. For criticism see Beebee (2001), Pritchard (2002), McLaughlin (2003) and McKinsey (2003).
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- Pryor, J., Uncertainty and undermining, paper manuscript.
- Transmission and Transmission Failure in Epistemology, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, by C. Tucker (Willam & Mary University).
- Transmission of Warrant, PhilPapers online research in philosophy.
- Systematic Models of Transmission-Failure, list of papers maintained by Jim Pryor