Supplement to Sociobiology

Construction of Sociobiological Explanations

The central assumptions of sociobiology are embedded in the explanations sociobiologists propose. To better see how this process is operationalized, consider the following methodological schema for constructing sociobiological explanations:

Hypothesize the behavior's adaptive function

First, sociobiologists identify the category of adaptive strategies relevant to the behavior in general evolutionary theory. For example, Linda Mealey (1995) reconceptualizes (redescribes) sociopaths in evolutionarily significant terms as deceptive cheaters. The Prisoner's Dilemma model applies to the evolution of a society in which the following conditions are fulfilled: reliable communication mechanisms exist in which each player can signal that player's intent to behave one way or another, signals can be honest or deceptive, whether a behavior maximizes one's interests is contingent on the behavior of the other players, and rational behavior is behavior that maximizes one's own interests. In a two-person game, the four possible outcomes are: Players cooperate, the first player cheats and the second cooperates, the second cheats and the first cooperates, or both players cheat. Thus, it is possible for populations to include both honest Cooperators who do cooperate after signaling cooperation and deceptive Cheaters who defect after signaling cooperation. (See entry on prisoner's dilemma.)

  Cooperator Cheater
Cooperator b/b d/a
Cheater a/d c/c

Table 1. The two-player prisoner's dilemma. The relative value of the payoffs is a > b > c > d. In a single round of the game cheating is a ‘dominant’ strategy, meaning that it that maximizes a player's payoff on any assumption about the strategy of the other player. See text for discussion.

Identify the type of evolutionary model(s)

Second, sociobiologists identify the conditions under which the behavior can and cannot evolve by natural selection. Standard evolutionary game theory shows why populations of social organisms exhibit stable polymorphisms in which both cooperators and cheaters exist, rather than one type being uniquely selected and fixed as universal in the population. Single Interaction Prisoner's Dilemma models show that the most rational strategy is to defect. Like all models, the conclusions are dependent on the assumptions, and when more variables or parameters are added to simple models, these complexities may change the conclusions. When players interact only once, being a ‘Selfish Cheater’ is an evolutionarily stable strategy (ESS): a population of Selfish Cheaters could not be invaded by Cooperators and replaced by Cooperators in evolutionary time.

Iterated Prisoner's Dilemma models show that the most rational strategy is to cooperate. When players interact frequently, cooperation is evolutionarily stable because of the role of reputation. Cheaters get a reputation for cheating and it is in the interest of both Cheaters and Cooperators to interact with those known to cooperate rather than those known to cheat. However, Iterated Prisoner's Dilemma Arms Race models show that neither Cooperation nor Cheating always wins out. The reputation effect is mediated by the relative ability of the players to be sensitive to likely cues of honesty and deception or to hide those cues. The result is an ‘arms-race’ familiar in predatory-prey interactions, predator-like defectors become more adept at hiding cues of defection and prey-like cooperators become more sensitive to subtle cues of deception.

Connect these models to the distinctive attributes of the behavior

Third, Mealey identifies a defining feature of sociopathy: namely, the lack of sincere social emotions despite having normal intellectual abilities. Social emotions motivate behavior. The phenomenological experience of shame and guilt punishes behavior and negatively reinforces it, whereas the experience of sympathy and love rewards behavior and positively reinforces it. Social emotions also communicate probable intentions to others. The outward expression of emotion, hard to control by the actor, reliably indicates to others how the actor is likely to behave in the future. Sociopaths, lacking sincere social emotions, are adept at giving the outward expression of whatever social emotion would lead others to cooperate with them in the future. Sociopaths are predator-like defectors and mimics: others deceived into cooperating with them become victims or prey.

Postulate one or more life-history strategies

Fourth, sociobiologists consider which developmental strategy those exhibiting the behavior might adopt that explains trends in the behavior as it is studied in the non-evolutionary literature. From Mealey's analysis of the literature, investigators identify both clinical and sub-clinical levels of sociopathic behavior and its correlates. From her understanding of evolutionary theory, for selection to operate there must be discrete types for selection to select between. The simplest hypothesis is to posit two types of sociopathic life-histories. ‘Primary sociopaths’ exhibit clinical levels of antisocial behavior, whereas ‘secondary sociopaths’ exhibit sub-clinical levels. The behavior of primary sociopaths is the outcome of genetically based, individual differences in the use of a single strategy; sociopaths are Cheaters by virtue of their genotype regardless of the developmental and environmental variations they experience. In contrast, normal people are Cooperators by virtue of their genotype regardless of developmental and environmental variations. The behavior of secondary sociopaths is the outcome of genetically based individual differences in response to their environment; normal people and sociopaths respond differently to environmental stimuli in the course of development and are canalized (formed or stabilized during a critical period of development) to produce different sets of limited strategies. Thus, primary and secondary sociopaths differ genetically from normal people and from each other. The life-history of secondary sociopaths is more environmentally-contingent and developmentally-contingent than that of primary sociopaths.

Gather multi-disciplinary evidence

Fifth, Mealey supports this ‘two-pathway Cheater’ model of the behavior by showing how it explains variations in the behavior. Mealey provides evidence from proximate studies that there are differences in the use of cheating strategies used by sociopaths within and across environments. These patterns divide into two different developmental etiologies (causal patterns), which correspond to two types that natural selection could favor or disfavor in various conditions.

Identify the biological factors of the trait and its correlates

Behavioral genetics, using twin and adoptive studies across cultures, has found evidence that sociopathy has a genetic basis. Gender and sociopathy are highly associated; in the U.S. sociopaths comprise 3–4% of the male population and less than 1% of the female population. This suggests a ‘two-threshold’ polygenic model in which the genetic component is an outlier (on the extreme of a normal distribution), polygenic (coded by many genes with interactive effects) and nearly sex-limited (its genes are expressed only in the presence of a threshold value of a sex hormone such as androgen and thus sociopathy is nearly restricted to one sex). Females who express the trait must be more extreme outliers than males. The two-threshold model is a better explanation than a ‘sex-linkage hypothesis’ or a ‘differential experience of the sexes hypothesis’ of the greater risk for the offspring of female sociopaths as compared to the offspring of male sociopaths.

Identify sociocultural factors of the trait and its correlates and establish linkages between biological, psychological, and sociocultural factors

Social psychological studies show that many people exhibit antisocial behavior but are not sociopaths, because they express it in circumstances or ways that are socially approved. Statistical evidence reveals that a disproportionately large number of people who become lawyers, entrepreneurs, psychiatrists, or scientists have sociopathic tendencies. Lawyers can learn to defend a guilty client or prosecute an innocent one without normal feelings of guilt. Entrepreneurs can learn to ruthlessly fire staff when their vision of a successful business changes and the staff do not fit into the new plan. Psychiatrists and social workers can learn treat their patient's most intimate personal problems by day and do not care about their patients by night. Scientists can learn to do experiments on people that cause them anguish.

The Machiavellianism scale measures this subclinical variation in antisocial behavior, i.e., levels of self-initiated manipulation and control of others. Machiavellianism, a high score on the Mach scale, is defined by agreement with such statements as "Humility is of no service and is actually harmful," "Nature has so created humans that they desire everything but are unable to attain it," and "The most important thing in life is winning." Machiavellianism is best understood as a low-level manifestation of secondary sociopathy. High Machs, who use an impersonal, cognitive, rational, cool approach with others, are more accurate than low Machs in predicting how others answer a Mach questionnaire, and in competitive situations. Low Machs, who use a personal, empathy-based, idiographic approach with others, are more likely to select a Cooperator as a partner, but are vulnerable to being exploited by others who use the impersonal goal-oriented approach. These findings are best explained by the two-pathway Cheater model's claim that secondary sociopaths are at the end of a normal distribution of genotypes and that selection permits multiple strategies in the population that are instances of various sorts and degrees of cheating and cooperation.

Social psychology can go beyond personality and situational variables that contribute to the development of individual differences in personality and antisocial behavior, and can tell us how within-individual factors encourage or discourage cheating. Most studies show that a positive mood reflects not only past success but also anticipates future success. Sadness and feelings of failure can facilitate prosocial behavior in some children and more often in adults, but if sadness is profound enough to lead to depression, the subject often opts out of most social interaction, exhibiting asocial rather than antisocial or prosocial behavior. Secondary sociopaths, who feel both social emotions (guilt, anxiety, and sympathy) and mood change (sadness, optimism, anger), are subject to culturally induced manipulation of both social emotion and mood. Primary sociopaths, who rarely if ever feel social emotions but experience mood change, are subject to culturally induced manipulation of mood but not social emotion.

Some cultures encourage competitiveness more than others. Competition increases the use of antisocial and Machiavellian strategies. High population density (e.g., large cities) increases competition indirectly and is associated with reduced prosocial behavior and increased antisocial behavior. The two-pathway Cheater model predicts different relations of primary and secondary sociopathy, with cultural variation in which the success of sociopaths depends on their frequency in the population. Primary sociopaths have an inborn temperament, personality, and pattern of autonomic hypoarousal designed to make the child selectively unresponsive to cues necessary for normal socialization and moral development. For this reason, there will always be a small, cross-culturally similar, and unchanging baseline frequency of sociopaths. They display chronic, pathologically emotionless antisocial behavior through most of their lifetime across a variety of situations, and are equally likely to come from all kinds of socioeconomic backgrounds.

Because secondary sociopaths differentially use environmentally-contingent strategies, their frequency can vary across cultures and environmental conditions. Secondary sociopaths respond to environmental risk factors with frequent but not necessarily emotionless cheating, and their strategy choices will be more closely tied to age, fluctuation in hormone levels, their competitive status within their group, and changing environmental contingencies. Almost all upper socioeconomic class sociopaths are primary sociopaths, whereas secondary sociopaths almost always come from lower class backgrounds. Life in the upper classes evidently reduces environmental risk factors. Upward and downward social mobility affects the relative frequencies of secondary sociopaths, as they respond to different degrees of risk. Life experiences affecting fitness can move someone in and out of the secondary sociopath category. These facts—that primary sociopaths adopt a strategy that is toward the ‘obligate’ or ‘canalized’ end of the malleability spectrum and secondary sociopaths adopt a strategy toward the ‘facultative’ or ‘uncanalized’ end of the malleability spectrum—are important because the degree of malleability of a behavior is a crucial factor in how we fashion social policy to deal with it.

Copyright © 2022 by
Catherine Driscoll <>

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