First published Mon Nov 11, 2013; substantive revision Thu May 12, 2022

Sociobiology is probably best known as the subject of E. O. Wilson’s Sociobiology: The New Synthesis (1975), in which he described it as the “systematic study of the biological basis of all social behavior” (Wilson, 1975, 4). Wilson seems to intend “the biological basis of behavior” to refer to the social and ecological causes driving the evolution of behavior in animal populations, rather than the neurological or psychological causes of behavior in individuals; however, Wilson clearly thought sociobiology and neuroscience would have important theoretical interactions (Wilson, 1975, 5). Wilson’s references to evolution are also usually references to evolution by natural selection, although he does accept that the action of selection on animal societies can result in maladaptive outcomes at the level of populations (see, for example Wilson, 1975, Chapter 4).

However, “sociobiology” as a term existed well before Wilson, sometimes to refer to the kind of work identified by Wilson in the non-human animal part of his book: methodologically adaptationist approaches to understanding the causes and nature of non-human animal behavior (see for example, Schein 1956), but also occasionally to work of this kind in humans (for example, Ashley-Montagu 1940, Hentig 1948, Healey 1949). A few scientists also continue to use the term (for example, Hrdy, 1999, uses the term for this work in both humans and non-human animals). However, during the controversy over Wilson’s book and after most scientists using approaches to non-human animals shifted to using other terms, most commonly “behavioral ecology” (Krebs and Davies, 1978).

Famously, the first and last chapters of Sociobiology addressed Wilson’s views about the amenability of human behavior to be studied by this sort of project. These views were developed to some extent in his later book, On Human Nature (Wilson, 1978). For a variety of reasons, primarily because Wilson was perceived to be arguing that many problematic social behaviors were unchangeable, the contents of these two chapters provoked an extremely acrimonious debate sometimes referred to as the “sociobiology wars” (one well regarded discussion of the history and sociology of the “sociobiology wars” is Segerstrale, 2000). Because this debate attracted so much attention, the term “sociobiology” has come to be associated popularly with Wilson’s proposed human project, or at least the description of it set up for attack by its critics (see, for example, Allen et al., 1975; Caplan, 1979; Gould, 1977, 251–259; 1978; Sociobiology Study Group of Science for the People, 1976). Wilson’s human project might be called “Pop Sociobiology” after Kitcher (1985). The critics claimed that “Pop Sociobiologists” were committed to a form of genetic determinism, an overly strong adaptationism and had a tendency to ignore the effects of learning and culture.

The term “sociobiology” is also occasionally used to refer to current evolutionary approaches to human behavior, which retain the behavioral focus to which Wilson refers (Griffiths, 2008; Sterelny and Griffiths, 1999). However, while influenced by earlier sociobiology, most modern projects studying the evolution of behavior seem to have developed a variety of theoretical and methodological features of their own (Smith et al., 2001; Winterhalder and Smith, 1992); perhaps the best way to understand sociobiology in this case is in “phylogenetic” terms, as a historical ancestor of these projects. The “descendants” of sociobiology include human behavioral ecology, evolutionary psychology (Cosmides and Tooby, 1987) and more recently, dual inheritance theory (Boyd and Richerson, 1985; Cavalli-Sforza and Feldman, 1981). These projects as a group are now sometimes referred to as the “evolutionary social sciences” (Smith et al., 2001)[1]. Over time the different theoretical views and choices of methodology have become entrenched in each project, increasing their disparity; the divisions also partly fall along disciplinary lines, with human behavioral ecologists tending to be anthropologists; evolutionary psychologists tending to be cognitive psychologists; and individuals working in dual inheritance theory tending to have some background in population biology modeling. All three evolutionary social sciences retain some of the features of the project that Wilson originally described in his book, however; in particular they retain its methodologically adaptationist approach. Of these three, it is human behavioral ecology that is most often called “sociobiology” due to its focus on the evolution of behavior (evolutionary psychology focuses on the evolution of psychological mechanisms or modules such as those for cheater detection; dual inheritance theory studies the cultural evolution of traits that are socially learned).

This survey will, therefore, focus on three main meanings of “sociobiology”. First, it will briefly describe the relatively uncontroversial non-human animal behavioral ecology that Wilson and others described as “sociobiology”. Second, it will describe and evaluate the characterization of “Pop Sociobiology” that came under attack by various scientists and philosophers in the mid to late 1970s. Third, it will describe the main features of current human behavioral ecology. The final section will discuss some of the central criticisms raised for sociobiology and behavioral ecology in the literature and explore some possible responses to these criticisms.

1. Sociobiology as Behavioral Ecology

The first meaning of “sociobiology” is a term for a range of work that is more often currently referred to as behavioral ecology. Behavioral ecology is a science that uses evolutionary theory and especially adaptationist methods to try to understand animal behavior. Consider, for example the female parasitic jewel wasp. This wasp lives and lays its eggs in blowfly pupae; after a female wasp of this species is born and reaches adulthood she mates with one of the males also occupying her pupa, and then emerges and flies off to lay her eggs in another pupa. The jewel wasp is haplodiploid, and females can control the sex of each of their offspring by controlling whether or not the egg is fertilized when she lays it. What is particularly interesting about this wasp is that the percentage of females to males she lays depends on whether she got to the pupa first. If she is first to the pupa she lays a number of eggs, with mostly females (about 91.3%) and some males (about 8.7%). However, if she lays eggs in a pupa after another female has been there (this is called superparasitism), she lays a lot more sons than daughters. Behavioral ecologists are interested in understanding why animal behaviors like this have the peculiar features they do.

Behavioral ecology is sometimes characterized in terms of its relationships to the earlier “ethology” whose most famous practitioners are probably Konrad Lorenz and Niko Tinbergen. Tinbergen (1963) famously described four types of questions that an ethologist might ask in trying to understand some pattern of animal behavior, such as the egg laying strategy of the jewel wasp above. First, the ethologist could ask questions about the proximate causes of the behavior: for example, what neurological or psychological mechanisms lead the wasp to lay her eggs in the pattern she does? What mechanisms are responsible for the development of that mechanism—what developmental processes build the neural tissue that directly causes the egg laying behavior? Second, the ethologist could ask two ultimate, evolutionary questions about the behavior: what is the evolutionary function of the behavior, i.e. how does laying eggs in that pattern contribute to the wasp’s reproductive success, to the reproductive success of its ancestors, and hence to the behavior’s history of evolution by natural selection (if that is its history) in the jewel wasp population? Also, what is the phylogeny of the behavior, i.e. where did it arise in the evolutionary tree of the jewel wasp?

Unlike ethologists, behavioral ecologists studying animal behavior at first tended to focus on the third question, the question of evolutionary function, at the expense of the others (Griffiths, 2008; Krebs and Davies, 1997). Griffiths (2008) has argued such a focus by the behavioral ecologists on questions of function at the expense of questions of causation, development and phylogeny (but especially development) was highly problematic, since the four questions cannot be properly answered independently. Development constrains the evolution of biological traits in multiple ways, and behavior especially, since behavior depends on development at both neurological and psychological levels. Behavioral ecologists, however, for a long time took the complexity of the developmental resources contributing to behavior as a reason for (at least temporarily) avoiding such studies as part of their study of the evolution of behavior. Grafen (1984) argues that the problem with developmental approaches to behavior is that they are hard and lengthy to perform, especially if the only or primary purpose of the developmental work is to check that the trait in question does indeed have an evolutionary history that can be understood using adaptationist methods. Grafen argues that if behavioral ecologists had to perform developmental or psychological studies to be relatively confident of their conclusions about the evolutionary history of traits, they would probably never get as far as evolutionary studies, since such developmental and genetic work would take a very long time. Worse, such studies might well have no inherent interest of their own and represent a waste of time and resources for the scientist—not all traits have an interesting or enlightening developmental background or are produced by interesting and unknown psychological mechanisms. Instead, Grafen argues that behavioral ecologists should use what he calls the “phenotypic gambit” in studying the evolution of behavioral traits. This involves assuming that the developmental, psychological and genetic proximate causes of a behavioral trait, such as the jewel wasp’s egg-laying strategy are of a type that will permit scientists to “pretend” that they are very straightforward when building evolutionary models, and yet still end up with models that give approximately the right answers about the primary processes, conditions and constraints acting on that trait during its evolution (for another similar view see Maynard Smith, 1982, 6ff).

Since Grafen wrote his article, however, there has been a certain shift in non-human behavioral ecology away from the phenotypic gambit and in favor of paying attention to proximate mechanisms, not simply because these enlighten whether a behavioral strategy could evolve by natural selection in any particular case, but also the nature of the fitness costs and benefits that accrue to an organism sometimes depend on how the adaptive problem they face is solved. For example, Lotem et al. (1995) appeal to the type of learning mechanism used by parenting great reed warblers to detect the presence of cuckoos in their nests: this limits how reliable their detection of cuckoo eggs can be. Similarly, Shuker and West (2004) argue that the constraints on the egg laying strategy of the parasitic jewel wasp cannot be properly understood without paying attention to the limits on the detection mechanisms the wasp uses to determine the presence or absence of other females, versus other females’ eggs in each area.

Perhaps the most important analytical tool of the behavioral ecologist is the optimality model (Maynard Smith, 1978): however, frequency dependent models, which do not assume population fixation of a trait, such as evolutionary stable strategy models (Maynard Smith, 1982) (see also the entry on evolutionary game theory) and dynamic models, such those employed in studying life history traits (Roff, 1992), are also used. Optimality models are designed to show which of a set of possible variant behavioral strategies would maximize a local fitness currency[2] under a range of ecological conditions and constraints implicitly or explicitly represented in the mathematical structure of the model. These conditions are supposed to represent the selection conditions of the trait (the conditions responsible for driving its evolution by natural selection – Brandon, 1990); however, they are usually derived by observing the conditions under which the organism is currently living, since these are assumed generally to have remained much the same as the conditions under which the organism evolved (Turke, 1990). Werren (1980) provided just such a model for the jewel wasp above; the model suggests that the reason for the change in the ratio of sons to daughters when a female wasp finds an occupied pupa is due to the potential opportunity to mate with the daughters of the first wasp. If only the first wasp lays her eggs on the pupa, then the hatching daughters mate with their brothers and all their offspring are entirely descendants of the first wasp. This means the first wasp needs to produce very few sons—only enough to mate with all the females; the second generation reproductive success of the first wasp is maximized by maximizing the number of daughters. However, where there is a superparasitic wasp, the superparasitic wasp’s sons can mate with the large numbers of daughters of the first wasp. The superparasitic wasp needs to maximize the number of the females in the pupa that breed with her sons as opposed to their brothers, whilst at the same time limiting the amount of competition amongst her sons. So if she has only a few eggs to lay, it makes sense for her to lay almost all sons; as brood sizes grow larger, it makes sense to gradually increase the proportion of daughters in the mix. Werren calculated the optimal percentages of males and females for each brood size. His observations of male to female ratios fit the predictions of this model quite well but not perfectly.

There is some debate among various philosophers and behavioral ecologists about what exactly optimality models like Werren’s are being used to demonstrate. Orzack and Sober (1994) claim that behavioral ecologists like Werren use optimality models to demonstrate that the traits in question are adaptations, i.e. that the traits have evolved by natural selection. Furthermore, Orzack and Sober take optimality models to be censored models, that is, they are designed to determine the outcome of natural selection in a population where natural selection is the only important force, and hence show, given the model correctly predicts the observed features of the trait being studied, that natural selection was the most important force in its evolution[3]. The idea then, is that the relative success of Werren’s model is supposed to demonstrate that natural selection was the most important force in the evolution of the jewel wasp’s egg-laying strategy—other forces may have been involved, but they are not as causally important. However, various other philosophers have argued that such models do not make such strongly adaptationist assumptions; Potochnik (2009), for example, argues that optimality models are only designed to show the general role that natural selection and other forces (such as developmental constraints) are playing, and are not designed to test strong adaptationist hypotheses about the behavioral strategies in question—i.e. in our case above, the success of the model is intended to show that natural selection was acting on the jewel wasp’s strategy, and that the way it was acting on the jewel wasp’s strategy was via the effects of competition between the male wasps in the pupa, the variations in brood size and the other conditions and constraints to which Werren’s model appeals. The success of the model is not intended to show that natural selection was the only important force involved in the evolution of the jewel wasp’s strategy. For other criticisms of the censored model view, see Rice (2012) and Bolduc and Cezilly (2012).

However, interestingly, some behavioral ecologists have claimed that they do not use optimality models to test whether or not natural selection is acting on a trait, but instead assume the operation of natural selection in order to test hypotheses about the conditions and constraints acting on the trait (Parker and Maynard Smith, 1990). This could be problematic, if it means behavioral ecologists baldly accept the view that natural selection optimizes most traits and never properly test this claim. However, one interpretation of Parker and Maynard Smith (1990) is not that behavioral ecologists have an unfalsifiable commitment to the idea that natural selection is an optimizer. Instead, they are claiming that testing hypotheses about the operation of natural selection itself is not what the behavioral ecologists are focusing on. The behavioral ecologists are making the preliminary assumption that a trait is an adaptation in order to test other hypotheses about it—they “pretend as if” the trait were an adaptation, and use that assumption to detect deviations from optimality that might reveal interesting tradeoffs and constraints—the nature of the deviation can suggest what might be missing from the model. This of course has the upshot that when the models initially fail, the scientists do not look for alternative non-adaptationist hypotheses, but instead initially look for new constraints, tradeoffs and conditions under which selection might be operating. For example, Giraldeau (1997) describes deviations from optimality in the evolution of photopigments in the rods (as opposed to cones) in the retinas of fish that live in certain sorts of marine environments where a shift in photosensitivity would be useful; Giraldeau uses this deviation to suggest the presence of a molecular constraint on the evolution of the rod cells. Presumably, repeated failures to find ways to fill in the gaps in these optimality models could ultimately result in the scientists concerned considering alternative, non-adaptationist explanations. So in order for the behavioral ecologists do this work they do not need to be committed to the strong view that natural selection is always the most important force in the origin of traits; this heuristic requires at most the view that natural selection usually locally optimizes (i.e. optimizes only relative to possibly severe constraints).

However, another way to understand how the behavioral ecologists are using optimality models, one that is not so often considered, is that they are interested in providing a functional description of the traits they are studying (Kitcher, 1987; see also Bolduc and Cezilly, 2012, for a similar view in terms of decision patterns rather than behavioral strategies). One of the things that may concern a behavioral ecologist is how exactly to describe the nature of the behavior that they are considering: what component behavioral dispositions (from among all of the organism’s behavior) make up each strategy, and how those dispositions hang together as an adaptation. They need to give a description of the relationship between the organism’s behavior and its environment, and how it contributes to the organism’s fitness. In the jewel wasp case, the behavioral ecologists have observed the wasps lay different egg sex ratios on different occasions. The question is how to make sense of these different sex-ratio laying behaviors: the guess is that these different behaviors hang together somehow, as manifestations of a particular egg-sex-ratio adjusting strategy; and that having this particular strategy, this particular pattern of egg-sex-ratio laying behavior, does something for the female wasp when considered as a whole. But why should a behavioral ecologist accept that any particular such a functional description is true?

An optimality model can allow a behavioral ecologist to find and test such a functional description in two ways. First, an optimality model (explicitly or implicitly) includes a strategy set, which is a set of descriptions of possible behavioral strategies; the model picks out one of these strategy descriptions as the one that is maximally adaptive. On Werren’s model, the strategy set would be an (implicit) set of descriptions of the range of possible sex-ratio adjusting strategies that a jewel wasp could use (i.e. each strategy involves a different set of choices about sex ratios in a full range of relevant conditions like parasitism, superparasitism and different brood sizes). The idea is that an optimality model can pick out which member of this set is a description of the maximally adaptive strategy – on this view of what the behavioral ecologists are doing, Werren’s model is designed to pick out the optimal sex ratio egg laying strategy description from the strategy set. The hypothesis is that this description of the maximally adaptive strategy will be the correct description of what the wasp is doing. If it is the correct description, then Werren can now predict what son/daughter ratios he should see the wasp lay in cases so far unobserved. These predictions allow him to test if the description is correct – if these predictions are true, then on this view, Werren has confirmed that the description of the particular sex-ratio adjusting strategy derived from his model is the correct description of what the wasp is doing.

Second, the description of the strategy picked out by the model is not simply a description of it as a series of behavioral dispositions (i.e. dispositions to lay different sex ratios under different conditions), but of the relationships between those dispositions and various ecological features that determine the fitness of those dispositions. For example, in the jewel wasp case, the presence of other female competitors, flexibility in brood size, the capacity of sons to mate multiple times, the impossibility of migration of sons between pupae and so on, are features of the environment that determine whether any potential egg laying strategy of the jewel wasp is maximally adaptive, and a well confirmed optimality model can show how. Consequently, contingent on obtaining the appropriate evidence that this is the correct model, the description of the strategy given by a successful model is (implicitly or explicitly) a functional description of the strategy—a description of how the behavior contributes to the fitness of the organism. For a more detailed discussion of the role of optimality modeling in biology, see the entry on adaptationism.

2. “Pop Sociobiology”

The second way that “sociobiology” has come to be understood is as a particular approach to understanding specifically human behavior which Philip Kitcher (1985) calls “Pop Sociobiology” (as opposed to his description of “narrow sociobiology” which is roughly equivalent to “behavioral ecology” above). Pop Sociobiology is so-called because it is a view about how to study human behavior described in a variety of literature written by Wilson and others[4] for a general, rather than an academic audience. In this literature, Wilson and the other “Pop sociobiologists” present some speculative and preliminary[5] sketches of how an evolutionary science of human behavior might proceed: Wilson’s main focus in On Human Nature (Wilson, 1978) and to a lesser extent the last chapter of Sociobiology (Wilson, 1975) is to show that such a science is possible, to describe some of the techniques that might be used in pursuing it, and to sketch some possible evolutionary analyses for certain particular human behaviors. Because of its presentation in the popular press, “Pop Sociobiology” was probably important in shaping popular perceptions of the nature of sociobiology in general (for example, the Time article, “Why you do what you do” 1977, 110 (Aug 1), 54) and consequently drew the ire of the critics. Unfortunately, the intensity of this debate may have led to a certain amount of mischaracterization of the sociobiologists’ views. This section will address the main concerns that the critics raised about Wilson’s early “Pop” sociobiology, and discuss whether and how far these are fair descriptions of his views.

Genetic determinism. In a variety of articles major critics of sociobiology such as Stephen J. Gould (1977, 251–259; 1978) and the so-called “Sociobiology Study Group” (hereafter SSG) (Allen et al., 1975; Sociobiology Study Group of Science for the People, 1976) claim that sociobiologists are strong genetic determinists. For example, according to the SSG Wilson believes that there are particular genes “for” behavioral traits, including indoctrinability, territoriality, warfare and reciprocal altruism, and that these genes are subject to natural selection in a relatively straightforward way. Indeed, the SSG (1976) argue that claiming that traits have a selective origin requires that there are genes “for” them; Wilson’s apparent acceptance that traits may often have a strong cultural component is said to be an error, since if this is true then evolutionary theory tells us nothing about the origin of such traits. Gould (1977) similarly claims that sociobiologists do not realize that genes only produce traits with a contribution from the environment.

Both of these claims are believed, even by other critics, to be unfair analyses of the views of the sociobiologists, and especially Wilson—for example, Kitcher, one of the strongest critics of sociobiology, takes Gould and the SSG to task on this point (Kitcher, 1985, 22–23). In On Human Nature Wilson describes genes as, essentially, difference makers—he explicitly claims that differences in genes, even for heritable traits, only explain the variance in traits across a population; they are by no means independent causes for any trait in individuals and variation in the environment also accounts for part of the variation in any trait (Wilson, 1978, 19). In at least one paper responding to the SSG Wilson says that, on the question of the relative contributions to the variation in human behavior from variation in genes vs. variation in the environment, his “own views lie closer to the environmentalist than the genetic pole” (Wilson, 1976, 183). Wilson also does seem to be trying to support his claim that there are some human behaviors which are probably highly heritable: he describes a variety of different sorts of evidence that might identify them. This evidence includes cross cultural appearance (e.g. Wilson, 1975, 550; Wilson, 1978, 20, 129); plausible homology with other closely related species (especially chimpanzees) (e.g. 1978, 20, 27, 151); early development of the trait in question (e.g. 1975, 551; 1978, 129); differences between individuals that arise without differences in their developmental environment (e.g. 1978, 128–130); genetic syndromes that cause behavioral differences (e.g. 1978, 43–45); and twin studies (e.g. 1978, 145). Finally, Wilson claims that trying to change human behavior from its heritable form usually fails or causes misery (Wilson, 1978, 20)[6]; he describes the failures of certain attempts to change the features of normal human behavior by massively changing the social environment, such as the persistence of family ties under slavery (Wilson, 1978, 136) and in the Israeli kibbutzim (1978, 134). Of course, whether or not all of the above is good evidence for his claims is very much up for debate (Kitcher, 1985; Sociobiology Study Group of Science for the People, 1976). It is worth bearing in mind that while Wilson thinks the evidence that some human behaviors are heritable is overwhelming (Wilson, 1978, 19) he does see many of his specific proposed evolutionary explanations as preliminary and speculative rather than fully formed (for example, Wilson is explicit that his discussion of homosexuality is preliminary: 1978, 146). For more discussion of the problems relating to heritability when studying the evolution of behavior, see section 4.2. below and the entry on heritability.

Ignoring learning and culture. As a concomitant of the objection that Pop Sociobiology was committed to genetic determinism, its central players are also often accused of being insensitive to the problem of learning and culture, i.e. to the problem that many traits in which they are interested are simply not subject to natural selection at all, and that this state of affairs may indeed be common in humans (Kitcher, 1985; Sociobiology Study Group of Science for the People, 1976). However, Wilson, for example, clearly recognized the important role of culture in many behavioral traits (Wilson, 1976); indeed, he thought that even minor genetic differences that made a difference in behavior could be exaggerated by acquired culture—this is the so-called “multiplier effect” (although it is seriously in question whether the multiplier effect works – Maynard Smith and Warren, 1982). Furthermore, partly in response to these concerns on the part of his critics Wilson eventually went on to publish Genes, Minds and Culture with Charles Lumsden (Lumsden and Wilson, 1981), which was an attempt to consider the effects of cultural transmission on the nature and spread of behavioral traits, and of the interaction between genes and culture. The book, however, was subject to heavy criticism (see, for example, Kitcher, 1985; Lewontin, 1981; Maynard Smith and Warren, 1982). The main concern raised was that there was little substance in the models the book provided—the most interesting features of these simply followed from the assumptions built into them, in particular, assumptions about the degree to which genes kept culture “on a leash” (Lumsden and Wilson, 1981, 13; Wilson, 1978, 167).

Strong adaptationism. The third problematic feature ascribed to Pop Sociobiology was its reliance on an overly strong form of adaptationism. In both papers by the SSG (1976) and by Gould and Lewontin in their famous “Spandrels of San Marco” paper (Gould and Lewontin, 1979), the critics of sociobiology argue that sociobiologists are committed to a “Panglossian” adaptationism. While the “Spandrels” paper is directed at “adaptationists” generally, sociobiologists were some of its clear targets (for example, David Barash’s (1976) work on jealousy in male bluebirds).

The central accusations of the “Spandrels” paper were as follows: that adaptationists treat all traits as adaptations; that when “atomizing” individuals into traits to study they take no care to establish that the traits so atomized could actually independently evolve by natural selection; that they ignore developmental constraints on evolution; that they fail to identify traits that are prevalent due to causes other than natural selection; that they fail to distinguish between current adaptiveness and a past history of natural selection; that they generate adaptationist hypotheses, fail to test them properly and replace one such hypothesis with another, ignoring other interesting kinds of evolutionary and non-evolutionary explanation. Instead, according to Gould and Lewontin, adaptationists tell purely speculative, untestable “just so” stories and present them as science fact.

Again, insofar as Wilson and other sociobiologists are being purely speculative this criticism may be warranted: quite a lot of the evolutionary explanations of particular human behaviors Wilson describes in the first and last chapters of Sociobiology and in On Human Nature are speculation on his part (although not entirely speculation). Perhaps the speculative adaptationist stories are appropriately described as “just so stories”; the question is whether such stories, treated as preliminary hypotheses, are problematic in themselves. Furthermore, while Wilson made no attempt to test any of his speculative hypotheses, behavioral ecologists do try to test adaptationist hypotheses about humans and other animals. Again, the proper question is whether these tests are appropriate or sufficient to establish the truth of the hypotheses in question. Gould and Lewontin do, however, make some more sophisticated objections to adaptationist methods; some of these will be discussed in Section 4.

3. Sociobiology as Human Behavioral Ecology

Human behavioral ecology (HBE), or human evolutionary ecology, is the current evolutionary social science most closely related to Wilson’s sociobiological project; it is the project that is sometimes still referred to as “sociobiology” by some philosophers of science (Griffiths, 2008; Sterelny and Griffiths, 1999). “Sociobiology” is most often used this way as a term of contrast with “evolutionary psychology”, another current evolutionary social science project inspired by early sociobiologists, and also much developed from how early sociobiology was conceived: see the entry on evolutionary psychology for a discussion. Other common names for HBE are “evolutionary anthropology” (Smith, 2000) or “Darwinian ecological anthropology” (Vayda, 1995) (due to most of its practitioners having a background in, or being based in anthropology departments, and using anthropological fieldwork as the main means of testing their hypotheses about human behavior). The different names tend to be used when the researchers concerned are emphasizing the connections of their field with anthropology or with non-human behavioral ecology. HBE has a great deal in common with the non-human behavioral ecology described above. In particular, it shares its focus on behavior, rather than the psychological mechanisms described in evolutionary psychology. Unlike non-human behavioral ecology it has continued to use Grafen’s (1984) phenotypic gambit, in that its practitioners usually do not attempt to discover or describe the genetic or other resources employed in the development of the behavior in which they are interested; nor, for that matter, do they usually attempt to discover the underlying psychology. There are, however, some differences of emphasis, in that the questions about human behavior addressed by the human behavioral ecologists (HBEs) are sometimes different from those addressed by the non-human behavioral ecologists.

To understand the purposes of the HBE project, let’s consider one of its classic examples: Kaplan and Hill’s (1992) work on prey choice strategies amongst the Ache foragers of Paraguay. Just as in non-human behavioral ecology, behavioral strategies in HBE are usually described as complex behavioral dispositions. Behavioral dispositions involve behavioral responses to local stimuli; behavioral strategies then involve producing a set of different responses to a set of different stimuli (i.e. the response conditions of the strategy). According to Kaplan and Hill, the Ache prey choice strategy involves choosing a variety of different potential prey items from the environment; whether or not a prey item is taken depends on a number of circumstances acting as the response conditions: for example, the presence of prey with certain specific features, such as the caloric return of the prey given the time necessary to process it (known as the profitability); the rate at which that prey occurs in the environment; whether or not the prey is encountered on their search; and the search time available on a foraging trip. HBEs usually describe behavioral strategies in terms of an “epigenetic” or decision rule, which is usually given as a mathematical function mapping values for the response conditions in the environment onto the appropriate values for the parameters of the behavioral output. Kaplan and Hill’s work also provides such an epigenetic rule (see Kaplan and Hill, 1992, 170), which describes the relationships between search time, profitability and so on, to decide which prey will be taken on encounter when the Ache are out foraging. Kaplan and Hill’s observations suggest that, on the whole, the Ache are using a strategy which is close to the maximally adaptive strategy suggested by their prey choice model. The question, then, is how to interpret Kaplan and Hill’s method; what is the purpose of showing that the Ache have a strategy of this kind?

In a few places, remarks by human behavioral ecologists suggest that the purpose of HBE is simply to demonstrate that human behavior is maximally adaptive: for example, Smith et al. (2001, 128) claim that “… human behavioral ecology applies the theoretical perspective of animal behavioral ecology to human populations, examining the degree to which behavior is adaptively adjusted to environmental (including social) conditions”. One possible interpretation of HBE work, therefore, is that they test the hypothesis that human behavior is adaptive (in contrast to the hypothesis that it consists of adaptations). By using methods derived from non-human behavioral ecology (such as optimality and game theoretic models), HBEs can demonstrate that the behaviors humans actually engage in tend to be optimal relative to the constraints and tradeoffs acting on them (i.e. they are “locally optimal”). Kaplan and Hill seek to demonstrate that the Ache’s prey choice behavior is in fact adaptive, as do other HBE studies that use the same method. On this interpretation, an important purpose of the project is to deflect some of the criticisms directed at Pop Sociobiology: HBEs explicitly accept that social learning of general purpose reasoning may be responsible for human behavioral strategies such as the Ache’s. However, this is ultimately irrelevant; one way or another, natural selection has, in effect, “seen to it” that humans behave in ways that tend to maximize their reproductive success. This is also consistent with the HBEs’ emphasis on the phenotypic gambit.

Alternatively, however, one could take these remarks to be a description of the HBEs primary method rather than the nature of their hypotheses, and that their hypotheses are (as the above quote also suggests) similar to those of non-human behavioral ecology. This is consistent with other theoretical discussions of HBE work including some by the same authors—see for example, Irons (1998), Smith (2000), Winterhalder and Smith (1992). On this interpretation, the purpose of Kaplan and Hill’s work is to test the hypothesis that humans have a behavioral adaptation for prey choice, of which the Ache’s prey choice strategy is only a local manifestation. Showing that the Ache’s behavior is highly adaptive is supposed to be a local test of the hypothesis: the Ache are a group that have to engage in prey choice and hence it is possible to test for a human behavioral adaptation in this context. By confirming this hypothesis, Kaplan and Hill can then achieve two further goals: they can determine which conditions led to the evolution of the larger prey choice strategy and, by confirming a functional description of that strategy, they can determine what causes the Ache (specifically) to choose the prey they do in their local environment.

On this interpretation, the prey choice strategy as a whole (i.e. not, for example, the Ache’s specific, locally appropriate set of prey choices, but the general human prey choice strategy of which they are a manifestation) is presumed for heuristic purposes to be an adaptation to certain conditions in the past that led to that strategy being selected for; i.e. the selection conditions for the strategy. Supposing that it is reasonable to take behavioral strategies as such to be able to be adaptations (see the later discussion in section 4) the selection conditions of a given behavioral strategy will usually include the response conditions (because presumably it takes the production of overt behavior in order for selection to act on a behavioral strategy) but possibly also features of the larger context which made it highly adaptive to respond in that way to those response conditions. In other words, in the prey choice case, profitabilities, prey densities and search time availability would presumably have been among the selection conditions of a prey choice strategy (presuming it is an adaptation). But so would larger details about the environment not explicitly included in these models, such as the limits on human capacity which determine which prey are accessible in that environment, the ecology which determines which prey are in the environment, and so on. On this interpretation, therefore, HBEs are interested in identifying the selection conditions of human behavioral strategies; this parallels standard interpretations of non-human behavioral ecology described earlier.

However, HBEs are anthropologists, and hence also want to describe the local causes of the overt behaviors they observe people engaging in in their fieldwork; this can be done by identifying the local manifestations of the response conditions of the strategies those people are using. Identifying these response conditions is a matter of identifying the correct functional description of those strategies (Kitcher, 1987). So how might such strategies he described? It is worth pointing out that this is quite difficult to do: what HBEs observe in the field is sets of overt behaviors in a context of a variety of ecological conditions any of which could be the response conditions. It may be far from obvious exactly why those behaviors are occurring, and which local conditions are the stimuli to which the behavior is a response. Indeed, it may not even be obvious which overt behaviors are manifestations of the same strategy. In the Ache case, what Kaplan and Hill observed is not a complete prey choice strategy, but a variety of occasions on which individuals or groups of Ache people took or did not take prey they encountered whilst out foraging, among many other sorts of foraging and other types of behaviors. The question is which, if any, of the overt behaviors on these occasions manifested a single prey choice strategy, and how these overt behaviors are related to each other and to the environmental conditions in which they occur. If human behavioral strategies are adaptations, however, then the relationships between behavioral responses and local ecological conditions that resemble those of the human evolutionary past can be expected to be locally optimal, ceteris paribus; this means that the response conditions of the strategy will (allegedly) be those (along with additional plausible selection conditions) that made the behavior fitness maximizing in the environment in which it evolved, and in any environment that is relevantly similar (Irons, 1998). This permits the HBEs to pick out the correct description of the strategy using an optimality model; identifying the causes of the Ache’s behavior in particular is a matter of identifying how the response conditions of that strategy manifest locally in their environment.

HBEs, like behavioral ecologists studying non-human animals, tend to use optimality modeling to find strategy descriptions and sets of plausible selection conditions that make sense of observed patterns of behavior as locally optimal adaptations, and the reasoning works in much the same way. However, there are a few differences, most notably in how models are chosen. In cases where the structure of the problem might be unique to the human case and where the current environment is expected to be different from the situation under which the strategy originally evolved, the model HBEs choose will often be unique and at least some of the proposed selection conditions identified by appealing to information about the fossil record. A nice example might be human life history, where the human situation is relatively unique: for example, compared to other primates humans have unusually long lives and childhoods, and long life after menopause. As a consequence, the human behavioral ecologists have to appeal to the fossil record in detail to determine what sorts of evolutionary transitions might have been involved (Hawkes, 2003; Kaplan et al., 2000). Where the structure of the adaptive problem humans face and the conditions acting on their behavior is expected to mirror those in non-human animals and to be very similar to those humans encountered in their evolutionary past, the choice of model is often a standard one from non-human behavioral ecology; the proposed selection conditions can be based on the current conditions observed in foraging societies. In the Ache foraging case, this is exactly what happens: the prey choice models used by Kaplan and Hill are those used to understand similar sorts of strategies in non-human animals. This is because Kaplan and Hill expect the relevant conditions acting on human prey choice—such as profitabilities and search times—to mirror very closely those acting on non-human animals.

Some differences also arise in how models are tested in HBE verses non-human animal behavioral ecology. The description of that strategy picked out by the model will usually include descriptions of potential behavioral responses to conditions (or values for parameters of those responses) that go beyond what has already been observed; this means the model predicts that these responses should also occur if the description of the strategy is correct. For example, in Kaplan and Hill’s prey choice case, the model predicts patterns of Ache prey choice that the observers had not yet seen, such as which prey the Ache should and should not take on encounter and under what circumstances. The model, therefore, can be tested by looking for a situation in which the response conditions of the strategy obtain and observing whether the behavior in response to those conditions is as the model suggests. This is partly why such rules are tested in foraging societies—because many of these strategies have response conditions which reflect conditions presumed to be present in the human evolutionary past, and which may obtain in foraging societies but not in industrial of agricultural societies. For example, obviously in Kaplan and Hill’s foraging case, few if any industrial or agricultural societies routinely engage in foraging that is a primary source of nutrition, and hence don’t present an opportunity for individuals to do prey choice of the right type. The other reason for performing these tests in foraging societies is because the HBEs want to understand the local causes of overt behavior in these societies in particular.

However, just as in non-human behavioral ecology, differences between the predicted and described behavioral strategies require scientists to build new models, or suggest additional conditions or constraints to add to the original models; there must be independent evidence that these conditions or constraints obtain. Kaplan and Hill’s observations do depart from what their model predicts: the Ache engage in a number of prey choice decisions that are not obviously fitness maximizing. In particular, men often seem to ignore many calorie rich food sources from plants and sometimes smaller animals, and women do not pursue larger game. The question then is how to proceed: HBEs often suggest changes to the model that might account for these failures of prediction; often, they do give some independent evidence for their suggestions. For example, one of Hawkes’ proposed explanations for why male hunting behavior often fails to meet prey choice expectations (similar failures are found in many societies besides the Ache) is that men pursue large game for reasons other than merely collecting calories—they are also interested in showing off in order to get other fitness rewards, such as additional sexual partners or better alliances with other men. Hawkes was able to show that men’s prey choice decisions were consistent with this view (Hawkes, 1991).

4. Central criticisms of Sociobiology and Behavioral Ecology

There are a number of philosophical criticisms of behavioral ecology and its methods; this section will address some of these criticisms.

4.1 Adaptationism

Perhaps the most important of all of the criticisms of “Pop Sociobiology” was that it was excessively adaptationist; similar sorts of criticisms are leveled at modern descendants of sociobiology, such as behavioral ecology. Behavioral ecologists, including HBEs, are really methodological adaptationists (Godfrey Smith, 2001), in that they assume that natural selection is optimizing the trait they are studying as a heuristic, in order to establish other things about that trait; as such, no strong commitment about the power of natural selection is necessarily required on their part (as discussed earlier). This did lead many behavioral ecologists to regard Gould and Lewontin’s (1979) criticisms as a cautionary tale, rather than as properly directed at them—see, for example, Gould and Lewontin’s objection that adaptationist hypotheses were untestable, which the behavioral ecologists could easily rebut (Mayr, 1983). Similarly, Parker and Maynard Smith (1990) responded to Gould and Lewontin’s objection that adaptationists do not properly account for phylogenetic and developmental constraints; Parker and Maynard Smith argued that they are taken into account—even where developmental constraints and tradeoffs are not explicitly represented in optimality models, they are often built into the strategy set or are otherwise implicit in those models. However, it is reasonable to point out that Parker and Maynard Smith’s paper did not fully respond to Gould and Lewontin’s objection: Gould and Lewontin recognized that adaptationist models appeal to constraints; their worry was that such constraints are appealed to ad hoc to fill in gaps in models, and are not subjected to any external test.

Another objection to adaptationist methods from Gould and Lewontin that has persisted as a criticism of behavioral ecology is that these methods do not allow scientists to consider non-adaptationist explanations for the traits to which they are applied, such as whether those traits were fixed by drift or are simply side effects of other traits (i.e. whether they are “spandrels”). In principle, correctly pursued, adaptationist methods can help identify cases where a trait is a non-adaptation: drift, for example, can be identified by comparing the distribution of traits expected under selection and under drift with actual population distributions (Sober, 2005); the question is whether the types of methods used in behavioral ecology are the most efficient at detecting these cases (Lewens, 2009). Some philosophers have argued that methodological adaptationism is more pernicious in practice than it looks in principle, because real evolutionary social scientists are not good at dropping adaptationist hypotheses for a trait even when there is a strong case to be made that they should (see, for example, Lloyd, 2005, esp. Chapter 8). For further discussion of all these problems, see the entry on adaptationism.

4.2 The Heritability of Behavioral Traits

While it seems that the accusation that the early “Pop” sociobiologists were genetic determinists was probably unfair, there is a related objection that can be raised to both “Pop” sociobiology and to the later forms of human and non-human behavioral ecology, i.e. that any trait’s being an adaptation requires that that trait be heritable, and most human behaviors are not heritable. To say a trait is heritable in the simplest sense is just to say that if the parent has that trait, then the trait tends also to appear in the offspring (i.e. to say the trait is heritable simply means that the trait is inherited reliably). The more demanding population genetic definition of heritability is that a heritable trait T is one where variation in T can be accounted for primarily by variation in genes as opposed to variation in the environment (see also the entry on heritability). Heritability in this sense is supposed to be required for natural selection because in order for natural selection to spread a variant T in a population, when T increases the average number of offspring of its possessors, those offspring have to reliably also have T if T is to spread at the expense of the other variants. The problem, however, is that many human behavioral traits do not seem likely to be heritable in this way: they tend to vary greatly across and even within cultures and environments, whereas human genetic variation is much too low to account for such differences (Buller, 2005; Cosmides and Tooby, 1987).

However, HBEs can get around this problem, by pointing out that local patterns of overt behavior are manifestations of more general strategies; differences in the environment cause the manifestations of different elements of these complex behavioral dispositions humans possess. For example, the patterns of foraging behavior of the Ache people in the Paraguay rain forest (Hill and Hurtado, 1996) and the Inuit in the Arctic (Smith, 1991) are very different, and the genetic differences between these groups are insufficient to explain them. However, both could be simply local manifestations of a larger and more general foraging strategy (or strategies) which humans possess, which could be heritable and an adaptation. A behavioral strategy is, after all, simply a complex behavioral disposition, which involves responding in a variety of specific ways to a set of environmental cues, most of which would be achieved by having an appropriate psychological mechanism or mechanisms underlying the set of dispositions. In which case, heritability of a behavioral strategy only depends on there being a psychological mechanism or mechanisms that produces that strategy reliably, and that mechanism’s itself being heritable. Of course, whether there are such heritable mechanisms for the behavioral strategies in which the HBEs are interested is likely to be a matter of some controversy.

What’s more, some philosophers have argued that it is possible for traits to be adaptations in the standard sense even when they are not heritable according to the population genetic definition[7]. Despite the claim above that heritability in the population genetic sense is required as a condition of the action of natural selection, technically all that is required for natural selection to occur on a trait T is for T to be heritable in the weaker sense, i.e. that it be robustly transmitted, such that the trait variant in a parent tends to turn up reliably in the offspring. The reason heritability in the population genetic sense was believed to also be necessary for natural selection was that genes were believed to be the only developmental resource transmitted to offspring, so only if variation in traits followed variation in genes would traits be subject to natural selection for the reasons described above. However, recently a variety of philosophers and scientists have argued (Odling-Smee et al., 2003; Sterelny, 2003, 2007, 2012) that natural selection can occur on traits even if traits vary most with the environment rather than genes, so long as environments can themselves be transmitted down lineages; Sterelny’s suggestion is that this might be achieved by robust niche construction. This has an interesting consequence: if highly reliably transmitted cultural traits could be subject to natural selection, standard evolutionary methods and models of the sorts used in behavioral ecology could be used to understand the evolution of such traits.

This is the not the end of the problem, however. Some philosophers have argued that not all traits that are culturally transmitted or learnt can be properly understood using adaptationist methods, because many of these traits are not heritable even in this weaker sense, and hence cannot be adaptations (Driscoll, 2009; Driscoll and Stich, 2008; Kitcher, 1990). Worse, such traits could appear highly adaptive on evolutionary models. For example, traits which are subject to highly adaptive individual learning or adaptive social transmission processes in populations (Henrich and Boyd, 1998; Henrich and Gil-White, 2001) are nevertheless not adaptations because they are not shaped by natural selection[8]. This is because in many of these cases, the features of the environment that make the trait appear adaptive may not actually have featured as selection conditions in the causal history of the trait (or perhaps as causes in any sense). In such cases, evolutionary methods popular in sociobiology and the current evolutionary social sciences (such as optimality modeling) will make traits appear to be adaptations to those conditions when they are not. For a more detailed discussion of dual inheritance theory, gene culture co-evolution and the associated theory, see the entry on cultural evolution.

4.3 Behavioral vs. Psychological Focus

Another problem for behavioral ecology and sociobiology is their focus on trying to understand the biological basis of behavior as such. The behavioral focus made sense to those behavioral ecologists influenced by Lorenz and Tinbergen’s ethology, but once cognitive psychologists became interested in applying evolutionary thinking to their work, the effects of the cognitive revolution in psychology began to have an effect on some of the “sociobiological” thinkers, and they transformed sociobiology into evolutionary psychology (Cosmides and Tooby, 1987; Tooby and Cosmides, 1990). The result of the cognitive revolution in psychology was that many psychologists came to regard the proper target of explanation in psychology to be genuinely psychological states or mechanisms rather than behavioral dispositions (as in Skinnerian Behaviorism) (Chomsky, 1959). In cognitive science since the middle of the twentieth century, psychological states and mechanisms have largely been understood in computational and materialist terms, that is, that the mind is the brain, and that brain states and mechanisms are essentially computational states and computers respectively (though almost certainly not serial computers). Psychological descriptions, then, are simply descriptions of these brain systems in computational or information-processing terms; generally they appeal to representations, decision rules and algorithms that brain systems process. The shift in methodology and theory represented by this change in approach was extremely significant. But it also appears to have made cognitive psychologists interested in evolution averse to thinking of behavioral dispositions as proper targets of evolutionary explanation, just as they were averse to thinking of them as the proper targets of psychological explanation (Cosmides and Tooby, 1987). This issue never seems to have arisen for the human behavioral ecologists; indeed, not only is behavior treated as the only proper target of evolutionary explanation, but psychology is explicitly ignored in favor of behavior for methodological reasons—the focus on behavior is part of the “phenotypic gambit” (Grafen, 1984) which (as described above) simplifies evolutionary modeling and the process of deriving explanations from it in human behavioral ecology.

The importance of the issue to the evolutionary psychologists has led to a series of arguments traded between the human behavioral ecologists and evolutionary psychologists for preferring behavior over psychology and vice versa. Two main arguments have been raised in favor of considering behavior the proper target of explanation, both from. The first is purely practical: behavior is relatively straightforwardly observable whereas psychological mechanisms are not, to the extent that the nature of only a few psychological mechanisms has been uncontroversially demonstrated (one of the few examples might be the mechanisms for learning language) (Alexander, 1990). The second is that only behavior can be an adaptation because only behavior is the actual causal nexus between the organism and its environment (Alexander, 1990; see the same idea in early form in Skinner, 1984).

The central problem with both of these arguments is that, while they are true of overt behavior, they are not true of the behavioral dispositions or strategies (complex behavioral dispositions) which are the actual targets of explanation in behavioral ecology—or at least, no more true than of psychological mechanisms. Behavioral dispositions do not causally interact with the environment except insofar as they lead to the actual manifestation of overt behavior; they are also no more “straightforwardly observable” than psychological mechanisms since they cannot be observed until overt behavior in manifested, and even then distinguishing between different strategies with overlapping component behavioral dispositions is also difficult.

Arguments for the claim that only psychological mechanisms should be considered to be adaptations rest on the idea that behavior is really only ever a manifestation of the underlying psychology. Behavior is not an adaptation so much as it is the effect of an adaptation. Cosmides and Tooby (1987) also argue that the really interesting evolutionary generalizations emerge at the level of psychology, not behavior. Again, however, this argument depends on understanding “behavior” as “overt behavior”, individual chunks of physical activity that are not necessarily reproduced over time and which do not occur in evolutionary social science generalizations, verses understanding “behavior” as “complex behavioral strategies”, which do seem potentially transmissible (via the psychological mechanisms that support them). It is also notable that such strategies are the subject of a significant evolutionary literature—such as evolutionary game theory, on which Cosmides and Tooby themselves depend: the argument for expecting their famous “Cheater Detection” module (Cosmides, 1989; Cosmides and Tooby, 1992) is derived from Axelrod and Hamilton (1981) and Trivers’ (1971) work showing that TIT FOR TAT, which requires its players to be able to detect cheaters on reciprocally altruistic interactions, is an evolutionary stable strategy[9].

More recently, philosophers have also presented some arguments for one side or the other of this issue. Buller (2005, 50–52), for example, argues that behaviors cannot be adaptations because they are not heritable, whereas psychological mechanisms are. However, Buller’s discussion does not make the distinction between overt behaviors and behavioral strategies described above. Buller argues that behaviors could disappear from the population for generations if the necessary response conditions never arose, but yet still emerge again if the stimulus reappeared, and this suggests that these behaviors are not inherited as such rather than the underlying psychological mechanism. In this he is right as long as he means the overt behaviors; behavioral dispositions or strategies could also remain present and be inherited in the absence of the response conditions. Moreover, Buller’s description of a “psychological mechanism” in this context sounds rather like a behavioral disposition (2005, 52–53).

Another argument in the philosophical literature for thinking that behaviors are not the proper targets of natural selection explanations is that behaviors are not quasi-independent (Lewontin, 1978) in the way they need to be to evolve by selection in their own right (Sterelny, 1992; Sterelny and Fitness, 2003; Sterelny and Griffiths, 1999). This is because many behavioral strategies will depend on multi-purpose mechanisms that cannot change during evolution without those changes ramifying to the other strategies those mechanisms produce. However, Driscoll (2004) argues that this is not necessarily the case; multi-purpose mechanisms, in order to be able to produce more than one strategy, would have to have branching algorithms; variation in any of these mechanisms necessary to generate variation in any one strategy need only occur on the branch relevant to the strategy in question and need have little or no effect on the other branches. Instead, whether an evolutionary explanation is properly directed at the behavioral or psychological level depends on the case.

5. Conclusion

Sociobiology, despite its complicated history, remains of interest to philosophers and has some import for certain important philosophical debates. One such question is whether human beings should be understood to have a nature, a set of traits which for Wilson in particular are those heritable traits that have been fixed in the population by natural selection (Wilson, 1978). Consequently, this ‘nature’ can be discovered and understood using the standard adaptationist methods used in other areas of biology. Most importantly, Wilson suggests that some of the characteristics that make up human nature are specifically behavioral.

Quite apart from the fundamental interest of the question of whether there is a human nature, the issue is important because it might have a significant moral or social upshot: what society we can have, and indeed what society we should have might depend on what human nature is like (Wilson, 1978). It was this concern that ignited the “sociobiology wars” in the early days after the publication of Sociobiology. The “Sociobiology Study Group” was concerned that Wilson was trying to argue that many problematic or harmful features of current societies, such as oppressive gender roles, negative race relations and interpersonal aggression might be unchangeable (Sociobiology Study Group of Science for the People, 1976). Philosophers of biology have strongly resisted the idea that humans have a ‘nature’ in anything like the traditional sense of a fixed essence (Hull, 1986; Lewens, 2012; Lloyd and Crowley, 2002) but there is also some debate about whether humans could be said to have a nature in the sense of a set of evolved traits in much the way that Wilson suggests (e.g. see Machery, 2008, 2012; for a critique see Powell, 2012). Philosophers in this area are instead focusing on notions of human nature that take into account the flexibility of human development and the capacity of human beings to construct their own development and hence their own ‘nature’ (Griffiths, 2009; Ramsey, 2013; Stotz, 2012).

Another hope on the part of philosophers is that understanding the evolution of cognition might give us some insight into the nature of certain human psychological traits that have particular philosophical interest. One such trait is our moral psychology. Moral psychology is of interest to philosophers who hold naturalistic views of ethics because they believe moral values depend in part on features of that psychology; understanding that psychology and how it evolved would give us insight into what the correct moral values are. Understanding the origins of human moral psychology might also help answer certain metaethical questions (Street, 2006). As Wilson hoped, scientists working in disciplines which are the modern descendants of sociobiology have contributed to our understanding of the way that norms, including moral norms, might have become established in human evolution (see, for example, Henrich and Boyd, 2001; Sripada, 2005). Philosophers still strongly disagree, however, on how the evolution of moral psychology, especially for the acquisition of norms, should be understood (Dwyer, 2006; Sripada and Stich, 2006; Sterelny, 2010).

Other debates surrounding sociobiology are still ongoing. For example, while methodological adaptationism has become and remained the standard approach in behavioral ecology, not all philosophers are convinced that this is an entirely benign practice – there are still concerns about the assumptions that this methodology requires (see, for example, Lewens, 2009; Lloyd, 2005). Similarly, there has been an increasing interest in the role of culture in the nature and history of human behavior; work studying the evolution of culture has increased since Lumsden and Wilson (1981) published their book. Philosophers and scientists are still addressing questions about how and how far cultural traits can be said to evolve; and, as discussed above, whether traits that have evolved in this way can be considered adaptations in any sense (Driscoll, 2011; Fracchia and Lewontin, 1999, 2005; Henrich et al., 2008; Sperber, 2006; Sterelny, 2006).


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Thanks to Colin Allen for many helpful comments on an earlier version; and to John Carroll and Johannes Hafner for some helpful pointers.

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