Solidarity in Social and Political Philosophy
The term “solidarity” first becomes prevalent in the early- to late-nineteenth century in France. Since then, it has always been used to describe a special relationship of unity and mutual indebtedness within a group. The term’s origins lie in French legal usage, in which the Roman legal concept of an obligation in solidum—a joint contractual obligation in which each signatory declared himself liable for the debts of all together—long had a place in the French code civile (Blais 2007; Hayward 1959; Wildt 1999). Solidarity expands beyond its legal origins to become a central social and political concept in response to anxiety about the centrifugal, individualizing forces of commercial and industrial society. What could replace the old social ties of church, family, and guild, all of which had been weakened by markets? What might ensure a sense of shared purpose and common good? As an answer to these questions, “solidarity” becomes a rallying cry in progressive movements across Europe, including socialism, liberal nationalism, Catholic reformism, and Solidarism.
More recently, there has been a resurgence not only in calls for solidarity but also in theorizing about solidarity. Solidarity has been invoked with increasing regularity in contemporary social movements (Movement for Black Lives, Occupy, MeToo, climate change activism), law and politics (COVID, EU, constitutions around the world, human rights), and even bioethics. There is a growing literature in sociology, political science, social theory, and social and political philosophy on the concept and its value. And yet, the idea remains hard to pin down: What is solidarity? And what, if anything, makes it valuable? In this entry, we aim to provide an overview of this recent debate, focusing on its development in social and political philosophy.
- 1. The Nature of Solidarity
- 2. Solidarity in Practice
- 3. The Value of Solidarity
- 4. Challenges to Solidarity
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Nature of Solidarity
In social and political philosophy, the concept of solidarity is primarily used to evaluate, guide, and describe activities within groups and between individuals and groups. In unpacking different accounts, it is useful to begin by listing some typical practice-embedded expressions in which the concept is used. In a conversation about our work environment, someone might say, “we should show more solidarity with one another”; in a conversation about the origins of the welfare state, someone might say, “the welfare state is an expression of solidarity among citizens”; in a conversation about the dynamics of social movements, someone might say, “the neo-Nazi protesters acted in solidarity with one another”; in a conversation about supporting the Movement for Black Lives (M4BL), someone might say, “I stand in solidarity with you in fighting oppression”; in a conversation about the moral values animating European integration as a project, someone might say, “solidarity is a foundational value of the European Union”; in a conversation about the downsides of investment banking, someone might say, “there is not much solidarity among bankers”; in a conversation about the plight of earthquake victims in Indonesia, someone might say, “solidarity requires that we send some money as soon as possible”; in responding to news that a teammate has cancer, someone might say: “we ought to shave our heads in solidarity”. What accounts of the concept can aid us in evaluating and describing the phenomenon referred to in these and similar circumstances?
At the broadest level, philosophers (such as O’Neill 1996: 201 and Miller 2017: 62) usually distinguish between two senses of solidarity: solidarity among and solidarity with. According to the former, solidarity describes a relation among members of the same social group. As we will see in more detail below, solidarity among usually requires a rough symmetry in the attitudes and dispositions of its members. For example, we might both identify as members of Danish nation, share a commitment to overthrow the occupiers, and each be willing to come to each other’s aid in fighting them. On the other hand, solidarity with describes a relation between an individual and another individual, or between a set of individuals and the members of a social group of which the former are not members (the “outgroup”). On this reading, symmetry is not required: I might act in solidarity with you as an earthquake victim when I wire money to an NGO that is operative in your city. Here I act in solidarity with you without your acting in solidarity with me (or even being disposed to act in solidarity with me were the tables to be turned). A paradigmatic example of solidarity with is the Catholic notion of solidarity understood as a form of caritas, or charity (on an alternative interpretation of solidarity in the Catholic tradition, see below). As Józef Tischner, who was influential in Poland’s solidarity movement, writes:
With whom, therefore, is our solidarity? It is, above all, with those who have been wounded by other people, with those who suffer pain that could be avoided—accidental, needless pain. This does not preclude solidarity with others, with all who suffer. However, the solidarity with those who suffer at the hands of others is particularly vital, strong, spontaneous. (Tischner 1982 : 8–9)
Philosophers divide on whether asymmetric, unilateral forms of aid and support from individuals to other individuals, or from outgroup members to ingroups counts as genuine solidarity. For some (see, e.g., Sangiovanni forthcoming), they do not. We do better, he argues, not to conceive of solidarity with as a form of solidarity at all. The unilateral, asymmetric reading, he argues, tends to vitiate the egalitarianism at the heart of solidarity, and does not fit well with the practices in which the term was, historically, most prevalent. He also argues that solidarity with in this narrower sense is not distinguishable from other, related terms, such as “humanitarian aid”, “charity”, “benevolence”, or “support for a good cause”. There is nothing gained in calling forms of humanitarian aid or support for a good cause “solidarity”, and running the two ideas together under a single banner tends to obscure the value of solidarity as a form of egalitarian collective action.
For other philosophers (e.g., Kolers 2016), solidarity (whether with or among) must always be unilateral and asymmetric. Kolers argues that paradigmatic cases of solidarity involve one group or individual (usually members of an outgroup), S, deferring to an object group, G, but not vice versa. According to Kolers,
[solidary action] is not principally justified by appeal to goals, nor do we choose sides on the basis of shared goals. To the contrary, when S is in solidarity with G, it is G, not G’s ends, that S endorses or values. S is disposed to adopt whatever goal G sets for the action or as a political aim. For instance, insofar as they are in solidarity, heterosexual persons who support the right of same-sex couples to marry do so not because they individually want same-sex marriages to be possible, but because the LGBTQ community treats that as an important goal. (Kolers 2016: 58)
Paradigmatic instances of solidarity involve members of (out)groups (e.g., heterosexuals) committing themselves to do whatever members of a disadvantaged (in)group (e.g., homosexuals) require to overcome injustice. Importantly, on this picture outgroup members commit to the group, rather than to any aim pursued by the group. As a heterosexual, I do not act in solidarity by committing directly to fighting heterosexism alongside members of the LGBTQ community; rather, to act in solidarity, I must commit to the LGBTQ community as such, and so to whatever members tell me I need to do to promote their cause, whatever cause that is.
One advantage of this view is that it captures an important ethical aspect of coalitional social movements in which more privileged (out)groups act as allies of less privileged (in)groups in fighting injustice. As has often been noted, the trouble with such coalitions is that members of privileged groups often tend to be blind to the way in which privilege colors and sometimes distorts their efforts to support the aims of the movement. Outgroup allies can sometimes reproduce, unconsciously, wider structural patterns of power and exclusion as they fight alongside ingroup members; they can perpetrate, for example, forms of epistemic injustice in seeking to impose their own agenda or ideals onto the wider movement (Deveaux 2021; Clark 2014; Medina 2013; Gould 2020; Land 2015). Kolers’ work reminds his readers that genuine solidarity requires that members of outgroups put aside their particular concerns, ideals, prejudices, and so on, and listen (Kolers 2016: 115). They must be prepared, in turn, to accept their relative epistemic limitations vis-à-vis members of ingroups who not only have “skin in the game” but often a vivid lived experience of the forms of injustice they are fighting. And they must also be prepared to defer out of respect for the disadvantaged: whether or not the disadvantaged have better epistemic access to truths about the struggle, etc., the privileged ought to defer out of respect for what is at stake for the disadvantaged.
So far, we have discussed unilateral, asymmetric accounts of our target concept. We now turn to accounts of the concept that treat the idea of solidarity among as paradigmatic. Rather than naming the set of attitudes and actions characteristic of an individual who (unilaterally) offers support or aid, the idea of solidarity among names a relation among members of the same group. The relation is generally understood to make it the case that the group exhibits a distinctive kind of unity among its members (solidus in Latin means whole or integrated). But what kind of unity? The unity in question is composed, on all plausible views, by an interlocking set of attitudes, dispositions, and characteristic actions displayed by members. It is useful to compare relations of solidarity to the relations constituting social groups as such. According to one influential definition of a social group, a social group
is a collection of individuals who perceive themselves to be members of the same social category, share some emotional involvement in this common definition of themselves, and achieve some degree of social consensus about the evaluation of their group and their membership of it. (Tajfel & Turner 2001: 100).
People waiting at a bus stop, or boarding a train, are not, in normal circumstances, a social group; employees of Google and members of the Church of England are. We can then say: For an (in)group to display solidarity, it must recognize itself as a social group: members must identify themselves based on some characteristic that marks them out as a social group. For example, members might identify as workers (on the basis, that is, of a role), as black (on the basis of racial categorization), as cancer survivors (on the basis of a common set of experiences), as environmentalists (on the basis of a shared cause), and so on. But what other conditions are necessary (or at least paradigmatic)? Identifying as a social group is not sufficient: it seems clear that we might identify as employees of Google, or as engineers, or as investment bankers, but not be in solidarity with one another.
An obvious candidate is the condition that members of the social group be disposed to put aside narrow self-interest in coming to each other’s aid when required. We might imagine, for example, that the employees of Google or investment bankers are not prepared to set aside narrow self-interest except in special circumstances (where, say, employees know one another independently). If this were true, then it seems clear that, in their normal everyday interactions, they wouldn’t be in solidarity with one another (despite their cooperation). Some philosophers believe that these two conditions—identifying as a member of a social group and a willingness, on that basis, to set aside narrow self-interest in coming to a fellow’s aid—are necessary and sufficient for solidarity. Philippe Van Parijs, for example, writes:
When I help you out of solidarity, I do so because you are “one of us”, because “I could have been you”, because, in this sense, I “identify” with you. (Van Parijs forthcoming; see also Mason 2000: 27)
To illustrate, Van Parijs gives the example of a fellow traveler returning a lost wallet, or a cyclist helping another to board a train. In both cases, someone identifies as a traveler (or as a cyclist) and, in virtue of that identification, is disposed to come to another traveler or cyclist’s aid.
An advantage of the view is that it can encompass a wide variety of different contexts. It can, for example, account for unilateral senses of solidarity, such as the Good Samaritan. As long as the Good Samaritan is motivated by a relevant self-categorization that includes the stranger, then his coming to his aid counts as solidarity. The Good Samaritan might feel disposed to aid because he has shared the experience of being a victim of injustice, or because of their shared vulnerability, say, as human beings. But its encompassing nature may also make it hard to distinguish from related notions. The account seems to collapse into the view that solidarity is another name for all responsibilities that flow (or that are perceived to flow) from membership in a social group.
Tommie Shelby offers a view that is broadly similar in structure, but strengthens the requirements for mutual identification and group cohesion. For Shelby,
I believe there are five core normative requirements that are jointly sufficient for a robust form of solidarity [identification with the group, special concern, shared values or goals, loyalty, and mutual trust]. By “robust” I mean a solidarity that is strong enough to move people to collective action, not just mutual sympathy born of recognition of communality or a mere sense of group belonging. (Shelby 2005: 68; see also May 1996: 44; cf. Feinberg 1973: 677)
Returning a lost wallet and the Good Samaritan, on this view, are ruled out since they are products of a weak sense of group belonging. One may object, however, that the view is still not restrictive enough. For example, a reading group might exhibit all five features, and move its participants to do things together, and yet it seems strained to say that a reading group is in solidarity with one another. (It is strained not so much because it doesn’t capture the ordinary English meaning, but because it seems to jar with the value and history of the practices in which the term has predominantly figured, and which make sense of the role we might want an account of solidarity to play.) It is also unclear, on this view, whether collective action is a necessary condition of solidarity, or whether two or more people can be in solidarity by holding the attitudes mentioned without ever acting together in some relevant sense. Might brothers be in solidarity by possessing all five of the listed attitudes, though they never act together in the pursuit of any goals, or come to each other’s aid in any way?
Sally Scholz offers a view of solidarity that is explicitly political and oppositional. For Scholz,
Political solidarity arises in opposition to something; it is a movement for social change that may occur at many levels of social existence. … Natural disasters may inspire strong sentiments and even bonds of connection, but they do not inspire political solidarity. Political solidarity as I present it has a social justice content or aim; it opposes injustice, oppression, tyranny, and social vulnerabilities. (Scholz 2008: 54; see also Mohanty 2003: 7)
Solidarity, on this view, is always geared toward overcoming injustice; it is essentially political. The reading group would be excluded, and so would be the Good Samaritan and sending money to earthquake victims. Scholz also argues that the concept entails the existence of positive moral obligations among participants. If participants (for example, a white supremacist group) lack positive obligations to aid each other in protesting racial integration (because such a protest would be in the service of unjust ends), then they cannot act in solidarity when they protest, come to each other’s aid, and are committed to their cause.
Andrea Sangiovanni offers a view that is less restrictive (but more restrictive than Shelby’s). In contrast to Scholz, he argues that solidarity must always be aimed at overcoming adversity, but the adversity need not be political. For example, suppose a village burns down in a fire and residents band together to rebuild it. They are committed to the endeavor and are ready to come to each other’s aid. Because their endeavor is oriented toward overcoming shared adversity it counts as solidarity. Furthermore, for Sangiovanni, the concept solidarity is not moralized: even mafiosi can be in solidarity with one another (despite the fact, that is, that their solidarity will promote bad ends). Finally, solidarity, he claims, neither merely precedes collective action (or, as Shelby argues, makes it more likely) nor is it merely a by-product of collective action, but is itself a form of collective action. As a kind of action, it does not therefore name only a set of desires and beliefs, a virtue, or a sense of fellowship with others. Rather, solidarity is any instance of collective action that has the following core features:
- Participants identify with one another on the basis of a role, condition, cause, set of experiences, or way of life on the basis of which …
… they each …
- …intend to do their part in overcoming some significant adversity, X, by pursuing, together, some more proximate shared goal, Y;
- … are individually committed (i) to X and Y and (ii) to not bypassing each other’s will in the achievement of X and Y;
- … are committed to sharing one another’s fates in ways relevant to X and Y.
- … trust one another to play their part in X and Y, trust each other’s commitment, trust that each will not bypass the other’s will, and trust each to share the other’s fate.
This view faces a number of challenges as well. First, like Shelby and Scholz, it doesn’t allow for unilateral cases of solidarity—such as the Good Samaritan and sending money to earthquake victims—to count as instances of solidarity since there is no collective action in the required sense. Second, and relatedly, it doesn’t allow for cases of “silent” or “private” solidarity (Bommarito 2016; Zhao 2019). As a young girl, Simone Weil gave up eating sugar because sugar had become unavailable to soldiers at the front. It seems plausible to say that she acted in solidarity with the soldiers. What reasons do we have to rule such cases out? And, finally, it seems to rule out protest movements that are organized on behalf of victims of injustice but not with them. Imagine we organize a protest against the French government’s closure of the refugee camps in Calais, and suppose that the refugees there do not know of, or otherwise take part in, our protest. Sangiovanni’s account seems to force us to say that we, on the outside, act in solidarity with one another but not with the refugees.
2. Solidarity in Practice
So far, we have discussed the nature of solidarity in general. In this section, we review the social and political practices in which the term has primarily figured. Whatever account of the general concept we think is best should aid us in illuminating each of these contexts (by successfully describing, evaluating, and guiding them). In the following, however, we remain neutral between different accounts of the general concept. Furthermore, we only cover a sample of such contexts. There are many more practices in which solidarity has found a place. We focus on what strike us as the historically most important and influential ones.
As mentioned above, the idea becomes prevalent in the early-nineteenth century in France. The soil in which the concept first takes root is socialism. The early socialist writers—Robert Owen (1771–1858), Henri de Saint-Simon (1760–1825), and Charles Fourier (1772–1837) (who Marx and Engels would later dismiss as “utopian”) were especially influential—decried the individualism and egoism fostered by market society (Claeys 2011). The untethering of markets from constraints of traditional law, social structures, and morality inevitably led, they argued, to social conflict and the moral, economic, and cultural degradation of the working classes. They believed that new forms of mutual aid, cooperation, and association were needed to bring each functional unit of the modern industrial economy together in a mutually supportive web, and prevent the worst effects of the competitive division of labor and the poverty it produces. In 1826, Robert Owen wrote:
There is but one mode … by which man can possess in perpetuity all the happiness which his nature is capable of enjoying,—that is by the union and co-operation of all for the benefit of each. While mankind remain congregated in large cities and towns, or live in single families apart from their species, each having distinct and opposite interests, no substantial improvement can be effected in the condition of society. To obtain the full advantages of cooperation, men must be associated in small communities, or large families, all the members of which shall be united by the bond of one common interest; the same bond of union connecting each community with every other established on similar principles. (Owen 1826–27 [2016: 69]; see also Leopold 2015)
Hippolyte Renaud gave this unified, mutually supportive social cooperation in the service of each and all a name that formed the title of his immensely popular summary of Fourier’s works, namely Solidarité (1842).
In “Socialism: Utopian and Scientific” (1876), Engels rejected the utopians’ for failing to explain how their proposed societies could ever be realized (1876 [1978: 685ff]). There was no basis for their doctrines or their faith in the empirically verifiable laws of society. Given its association with the “utopians”, it is revealing that neither Marx nor Engels ever used “solidarity” as a term in any of their systematic writings. Where they did use the term was in their speeches and letters regarding the workingmen’s associations that were springing up everywhere in defense of socialism. In 1872, in a speech given in Amsterdam after a congress of the First International, Marx says:
Citizens, let us think of the basic principle of the International: Solidarity. Only when we have established this life-giving principle on a sound basis among the numerous workers of all countries will we attain the great final goal which we have set ourselves. The revolution must be carried out with solidarity; this is the great lesson of the French Commune, which fell because none of the other centers—Berlin, Madrid, etc.—developed great revolutionary movements comparable to the mighty uprising of the Paris proletariat. (Marx 1872 [1978: 522])
And, as Karl Kautsky, one of the most influential Marxists in the late nineteenth century, writes in the Class Struggle, which was the German Social Democratic Party’s official commentary on the proposed Erfurt program of 1891:
But as soon as the workers discover that their interests are common, that they are all opposed to the exploiter, it takes the form of great organizations and open battles against the exploiting class.… And when [these elevating tendencies] have once wakened full class-consciousness in any group of workers, the consciousness of solidarity with all the members of the working-class, the consciousness of the strength that is born of union; as soon as any group has recognized that it is essential to society and that it dare hope for better things in the future,—then it is well nigh impossible to shove that group back into the degenerate mass of beings whose opposition to the system under which they suffer takes no other form than that of unreasoned hate. (Kautsky 1892: Ch. 5, Secs. 5–6; see also Wildt 1999)
From its early socialist origins, “solidarity” found its natural home as a term describing the unity of workers’ associations—a term describing, that is, their mutual identification with one another as exploited, their mutual commitment to overthrowing capitalism through organized cooperation, and their willingness to sacrifice for one another in the name of the cause.
2.2 Civic Solidarity
Civic solidarity refers to solidarity among citizens of modern states, and is often associated with the emergence and development of welfare states. The term as used in this way first became popular in the late-nineteenth century in France. The late-nineteenth century usages are outgrowths of earlier forms of socialism, but they develop the idea in directions that are less oppositional than the socialism that emerges as a political force in the wake of 1848. Two figures are associated with its popularization during this period: Léon Bourgeois and Emile Durkheim. We start with Léon Bourgeois since his account was, at the time, more influential than Durkheim’s.
In 1896, Léon Bourgeois—prime minister of France from 1895–6—published what would become the programmatic manifesto of the Solidarist movement, namely a pamphlet entitled Solidarité (Bourgeois 1902). The pamphlet begins by noting that all complex organisms reproduce themselves through an internal division of labor. Each organ has a different function; their interdependence is organized in such a way as to ensure the being’s self-preservation. Bourgeois calls this internal unity natural solidarity. He then goes on to note that societies are organized in much the same way: the more complex a society is, the more diverse and interdependent its internal division of labor. There are two differences. The first difference is that societies are made up of individuals possessed of reason and will, and so the laws of nature are not sufficient to ensure that the parts will coordinate to sustain and reproduce the life of the whole. The second difference follows directly from the first. Because the coordination necessary to maintain and reproduce a society depends on the reason and will of individuals, the laws that govern that reproduction must also work via those very same faculties. The laws governing social solidarity are, therefore, necessarily moral.
What mores ought to govern the division of labor and so, ultimately, the distribution of the benefits and burdens of joint production (la répartition des profits et des charges)? Bourgeois writes that we must look for an answer at the moral implications of the very reciprocal dependence that constitutes society in the first place. Once we do so, we will see that every individual within the societal division of labor owes the vast preponderance of what they are able to obtain from that society—for example, through their talents and abilities, or through the knowledge they acquire from that society—to two sources. First, they owe a debt to past generations and, second, to contemporaries who, in the present, reproduce and advance the institutions, knowledge, resources, and societal conventions from which they gain (almost) all that is theirs.
[Because of man’s dependence on the societal division of labor] a necessary exchange of services exists between each and all. The free development of his faculties, of his activities, in short, of his very being, can only be realized, for each individual, as a result of the concurrent contributions of other men’s faculties and activities. This free development can, furthermore, only reach its full extent as a result of the accumulated contributions of the past.
There is therefore a debt owed by each to all the rest, in virtue of the contributions and services rendered by all to each. (Bourgeois 1902: 137, translation by Sangiovanni)
Moral solidarity requires, then, citizens to identify with one another as jointly responsible for the social product, and to be prepared to discharge the social debt through common institutions designed to insure people against unemployment, sickness, and old age, to maintain jobs open to talents, and to support a public system of education. Lack of moral solidarity, Bourgeois implies, will lead inevitably to lack of coordination among the parts, and so to a breakdown in natural solidarity.
Published a few years earlier than Bourgeois’ pamphlet, Durkheim’s doctoral thesis—The Division of Labor in Society (1893)—distinguished between the mechanical solidarity typical of premodern, less complex societies and the organic solidarity of modern industrialized societies. Societies whose social cohesion is founded on mechanical solidarity are integrated through a “collective consciousness” that defines a common way of life. Where mechanical solidarity is characterized by similarity among members of a society, organic solidarity is characterized by difference. At the heart of organic solidarity is, as it was for Bourgeois, the division of labor. Modern societies must be integrated via the coordinated interdependence of an extensive division of labor. But Durkheim is adamant that the coordinated functioning of the different parts is not self-regulating. He emphasizes the need for a diffuse moral solidarity to reinforce and stabilize the functioning of the division of labor. (Top-down regulation via the state—which is “too remote” and “general”—is also not enough [Durkheim 1893 [1984: 27]].) This solidarity can no longer come from the “collective consciousness” (as it did in premodern societies): the differentiation of modern society increases individualism and diversity, undoing the bonds of similarity that tie together premodern societies. What sources are left to support the mutual “attraction”, disposition to come to other’s aid, and trust required for the cohesion of a society?
His proposed solution is clearest in the Second Preface to the Division of Labor, added in 1902. He suggests that the state alone cannot guarantee the conditions necessary for maintaining solidarity against the three predominant causes of social unrest in modern, differentiated societies. The first cause is anomie, the loss of direction and orientation that can accompany specialization. Anomie is the primary social danger accompanying the growing depth and extent of the division of labor, and threatens the sense in which we each are essential contributors to the success of society as a whole (Durkheim 1893/1902 [1984: 289–90]). The second cause is force, the sense of injustice that arises from a feeling that one’s work is not valued according to its worth and one’s own merits—the sense, in short, that one is exploited. Such grievances are especially strong when premodern elements of caste persist in modern conditions. The third cause is disuse, or the aimlessness, resentment, and lack of focus that comes from not having enough work. In each case, Durkheim argues, the citizen comes to lose a grip on his larger place in reproducing the whole; as he turns inwards, his grievances seem to him larger and his duties to others less pressing; he is less fulfilled by his labor, seeing it no longer as a reflection of his nature; mistrust takes root; he no longer sees his potential employers as cooperative partners, but begins to see them as enemies.
In the Preface, he argues that only the “professional grouping is a moral force capable of curbing individual egoism” (Durkheim 1893/1902 [1984: 11]). By “professional grouping”, Durkheim meant that the various industrial branches of an economy would be grouped into corporations (modelled on the feudal corporation). Unlike unions, corporations would constituted by both employers and employees, and would have the power to regulate wages, conditions of work, appointments and promotions; they would also have the authority to coordinate with other branches and with government. The effect of such groupings would be to recreate solidarity where it was most under pressure:
Within a political society [e.g., a corporation], as soon as a certain number of individuals find they hold in common ideas, interests, sentiments and occupations which the rest of the population does not share in, it is inevitable that, under the influence of these similarities, they should be attracted to one another. … It is impossible for men to live together and be in regular contact with one another without their acquiring some feeling for the totality which they constitute through having united together, without their becoming attached to it, concerning themselves with its interests and taking it into account in their behaviour. (Durkheim 1893/1902 [1984: 17–8])
The idea was that, in grouping together in smaller, functionally organized units individuals would regain their sense of contributing to society while, at the same time, giving everyone a felt stake in the justice and fairness required to reproduce it. In sum, organic solidarity refers to the bonds of mutual sacrifice and attraction that develop when each citizen realizes how the contribution they make to the overall functioning of the society as a whole, via their economic and social role, depends on a tightly knit, interdependent web of more particular associations.
2.3 National Solidarity
The nineteenth-century nationalist takes over the term from the socialists to describe the unity of a nation in its struggle about external forces. For the nationalist, solidarity is anchored in shared identification with an “imagined community” where membership is defined not in terms of class or social position, but in terms of an underlying way of life characterized by common folkways, mores, and a shared history of struggle. In 1882, Ernest Renan claimed that the nation is an expression of a
great solidarity (une grande solidarité), constituted by a sense of the common sacrifices that have been made and that one is disposed to make again. (Renan 1882: 29)
And Giuseppe Mazzini, whose version of liberal-republican nationalism was to have such a great influence on nationalist movements across the world, writes in 1871:
The individual’s means and his thirty or forty years of adult life are but a tiny drop in the vast Ocean of existence. As soon as he becomes aware of this, he ends up discouraged and abandons the entire undertaking. If he is a good man, he will now and again engage in simple charity. If he is evil, he will isolate himself in complete selfishness. But give this man a Country [patria] and establish a link of solidarity [solidarietà] between his individual efforts and the efforts of all subsequent generations; place him in association with the labors of 25 to 30 million men who speak the same language, have similar habits and beliefs, profess faith in the same goal, and have developed specific tools for their work as required by the general conditions of their land, and the problem will change for him at once: his strengths will be greatly multiplied, allowing him to feel up to the task. (“Nazionalismo e Nazionalità” 1871 [2009: 63])
On this understanding, the nation is understood primarily as a project in which each participates over time and across generations. This same understanding has carried over to contemporary nationalists. For them,
a common history, territory, and shared bonds of belonging give rise to a commitment to a common project, namely to reproduce and defend the patria. As in workers’ movements, the struggle, furthermore, requires a preparedness to come to each other’s aid in realizing the project.
2.4 Christian Solidarity
Solidarity becomes increasingly important in Christian, especially Catholic, thought and practice beginning at the end of the nineteenth century and takes flight with the papacy of John Paul II. In response to the rising importance of socialism and class conflict in the middle of the nineteenth century, the Church realizes the need to address the situation of the worker. In the Church’s response, Pope Leo XIII’s Rerum Novarum (1891)—a staple of Catholic social thought—tries to steal a march on the socialists by incorporating and reworking one of the socialist’s main rallying points, namely the idea of mutualism within worker’s associations. In those passages, Leo cites Ecclesiastes approvingly on the importance of fraternity:
“It is better that two should be together than one; for they have the advantage of their society. If one fall he shall be supported by the other. Woe to him that is alone, for when he falleth he hath none to lift him up”. And further: “A brother that is helped by his brother is like a strong city”. It is this natural impulse which binds men together in civil society; and it is likewise this which leads them to join together in associations. (Leo XIII 1891: §50)
But it was not until much later that the term gets used explicitly. In the 1967 encyclical Populorum Progressio, on global development and the inequality between rich and poor nations, Pope Paul VI invokes the unmistakably Solidarist notion that interdependence creates social obligations:
We are the heirs of earlier generations, and we reap benefits from the efforts of our contemporaries; we are under obligation to all men. Therefore we cannot disregard the welfare of those who will come after us to increase the human family. The reality of human solidarity brings us not only benefits but also obligations. (§17)
The origin of the Church’s union of interdependence and solidarity lies in an earlier nineteenth-century current of thought often referred to as Christian Solidarism. In Ethics and the National Economy (1918), its founder and most prominent advocate, Heinrich Pesch (1854–1926), writes:
Christianity teaches us that people, despite all individual and also social differences in occupation and ownership, are nevertheless socii, i.e., comrades, precisely by virtue of those differences. They are dependent on each other and bound together by a solidaristic community of interests in all of their industrial relationships as masters and journeymen, as employers and workers, and in the human race overall, which is the great universal family of nations. (Pesch 1918 [2004: 104])
On this corporatist understanding, it is not just the shared experience of human suffering, or the understanding of the human being as imago dei, but a recognition of the interdependence of human beings in society that grounds a demand to share one another’s fate. On this picture, we are meant to recognize how both our flourishing and our suffering is a result of mutual influence and mutual reliance in and through the multiple associations to which we belong; in response, we have obligations to share others’ fates by coming to others’ aid and by limiting the harm we do.
As is widely recognized, John Paul II was also deeply influenced by this strand of Catholic Social Thought (and its realization in Leo XIII’s Rerum Novarum). In Sollicitudo rei socialis, he writes:
When interdependence becomes recognized […], the correlative response as a moral and social attitude, as a “virtue”, is solidarity. This then is not a feeling of vague compassion or shallow distress at the misfortunes of so many people, both near and far. On the contrary, it is a firm and persevering determination to commit oneself to the common good; that is to say to the good of all and of each individual, because we are all really responsible for all. (John Paul II 1987: §V)
On this reading, the ground of solidarity is, as in Bourgeois and Durkheim, an identification based on our role in the division of labor, which includes a recognition that participation in an unjust social order perpetuates suffering, and makes us accomplices. The doctrine goes hand in hand with the Church’s teaching on subsidiarity, in which local associations—including perhaps most importantly the family—have ethical priority to more general, encompassing associations, such as the state. More general and encompassing organizing units should intervene in the affairs of the lower only to help or aid them in the accomplishment of their tasks. On this understanding, the response to individual suffering must be collective; it cannot be done by individuals acting alone, but by each body, at each level of generality, working together as a unit to preserve the common good. As Pope Francis noted in a follow-up catechism to his COVID19 encyclical Fratelli Tutti,
there is no true solidarity without social participation, without the contribution of intermediary bodies: families, associations, cooperatives, small businesses, and other expressions of society. Everyone needs to contribute, everyone. (Francis 2020)
2.5 Solidarity in social movements
In the late twentieth century, the predominant context in which solidarity has had a place are modern social movements, such as anticolonial, black, feminist, LGBTQ, and disabled struggles. It would take us too far afield to review how solidarity is deployed in each one of these movements. But it useful to give a sense of the kind of questions that have motivated those engaged in them. One of the central questions is the following: What should the basis of the black, anticolonial, women’s movements, and so on, be? Should, for example, the women’s movement be grounded in an idea of sisterhood—on what unites women as women—or on a commitment to the (feminist) cause (or both, or neither)? Should black solidarity (for example in the US) be based in a shared ethnocultural identity as a nation, or in common subjection to oppression (or both, or neither)? Should Indigenous anti-colonial movements in Canada be grounded in particular territorially-based shared ways of life, or in broader commitments to overthrowing European colonialism wherever it exists (or both, or neither)? (see, e.g., Coulthard 2014; Simpson 2017). To give a sense of the debates, we will focus on black solidarity and the idea of sisterhood.
Should solidarity among women as women be grounded in some kind of shared experience of womanhood? It has become a staple of the feminist literature that there is no shared experience of simply being a woman. The attempt to identify a canonical list of experiences that characterizes “being a woman” is likely to lead to subtle forms of exclusion. Previous such attempts, it is often argued, have reproduced the cis-gendered experiences of white, middle-class women, and have marginalized the experiences of women whose experiences do not fit on the list (Lorde 1984; Hill Collins 1990 ; hooks 2000 ; Combahee River Collective 1977/1983; Spelman 1988). See also entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender.
The alternative to grounding sisterhood in shared experience or shared oppression is to ground it in commitment to a cause or coalition against patriarchy. The trouble with this view is that it leaves open the question of how this defines a distinctive form of sisterhood, rather than a form of feminist solidarity. But is there anything distinctive about solidarity among women as women? If so, what are its grounds?
One response is to ground sisterhood not in a shared experience but in a shared condition of oppression—where that condition is experienced in different ways according to one’s overall structural position (which may be further influenced by intersecting factors, such as race, class, sexuality, and religion) (see, e.g., Young 1994).
This possible response to the challenge from exclusion invites a further objection: if sisterhood is supposed to be grounded in a shared condition defined by relations to a given set of socially conditioned material objects (primarily the socially sexed body and its reproductive functions), then doesn’t this also exclude? If this is supposed to ground an identification among women as women, then doesn’t sisterhood required constructing a shared narrative regarding what these relations are how they condition the sexed body? (Shrage 2009) But then doesn’t this just reinvite the challenge from exclusion, since different women—depending on their structural position—will find themselves subordinated and oppressed by a different conglomeration of socially salient relations and practices? Think, for example, of transgender women, or the variety of ways in which race, sexuality, class, gender, and religion intersect.
Similar questions arise when considering the nature of Black (American) solidarity. Should such solidarity be grounded in a shared ethnocultural identity, in a shared condition as oppressed, in an anti-racist cause as such, or in something else again (such as a shared fate)? (These grounds are not, of course, exclusive: one might believe that black solidarity should be grounded in both ethnocultural identity and in the sense of sharing a distinct condition of oppression.) An important strand of black nationalism—one that was especially prominent in the1960s and 70s—holds that high-sounding appeals to the possibility of integration in the name of a universal fight against injustice cannot ground a robust solidarity among blacks. A deeper, widespread engagement with a distinct culture is needed. According to this form of nationalism, Black Americans (as descendants of slaves violently abducted from Africa and elsewhere) constitute a distinct, and distinctly cultural, nation-within-a-nation (Robinson 2001; Moses 1978). Nationalists argue that, though at the moment marginalized and divided within itself, black culture calls for development and expression (for example, in the arts, music, literature, and theatre) (Cruse 1967); without it, and the sense of collective identity and pride it secures, blacks cannot securely win their freedom in a fundamentally hostile American society (see, e.g., Malcolm X 1970 ; cf. Rivers 1995).
Many black liberals demur: while black cultural, economic, social, cultural and political autonomy can be, in certain circumstances, strategically useful in the fight against anti-black racism, it is wrong-headed to insist on cultural unity as the basis of black solidarity. Insisting on cultural unity is divisive and unnecessarily exclusionary given the broad diversity of ethnic and social backgrounds in the black community. Black solidarity should be grounded, instead, on “thin” blackness, namely on shared experiences of anti-black racism (see, e.g., Shelby 2005: 245; Hill Collins 1990 ; cf. Gooding-Williams 2009).
In this section, we have reviewed some of the salient histories in which use of the term “solidarity” has figured. The survey has had two functions. First, it has served to provide an overview of the political and social uses for which solidarity has been enlisted. Doing so enables us to frame the descriptive and normative challenges that any theory of solidarity faces: Does solidarity have a single nature that is repeated across different paradigmatic instances? Or is it a malleable, vague term with no fixed content? What, if anything, makes solidarity valuable? What should the grounds of solidarity be in, for example, different social movements, in the welfare state, or in political and social associations more broadly? Second, the survey provides a testing ground for new theories of solidarity, which, we have argued, should be responsive to the concept’s history. Theories should be adopted and rejected according to whether they successfully serve to describe, evaluate, and guide the various practices in which the term figures, and has figured. While a theory might recommend conceptual change, of course, it needs to be clear why and how such a change is worth making. Either way, being aware of the concept’s history is crucial since solidarity names not just an ideal but a concrete set of practices.
3. The Value of Solidarity
It should be fairly uncontroversial that solidarity can have instrumental value: when members of a marginalized group develop bonds of solidarity by committing to each other and, as a result of being in (or acting from) solidarity, they manage to overcome their oppression, then solidarity has value because of its causal/instrumental role. Similarly, it should not be controversial that solidarity can have instrumental disvalue: even well-meaning, morally justified acts undertaken in the spirit of solidarity can lead to unforeseen and regrettable consequences. The more interesting and challenging question is whether solidarity, as a social practice, also has non-instrumental value (or disvalue). But before we move on to this issue, let’s briefly list some of the instrumental values that solidarity in different forms typically facilitates:
Most notably, solidarity improves a collective’s ability to pursue projects. By committing to each other and experiencing unity, fellows in solidarity establish a robust basis of mutual identification that allows them to solve coordination issues and pursue joint action that is more likely to succeed than if each acted on their own (Shelby 2005). Groups that display solidarity also tend to care for each other in beneficial ways, e.g., by protecting vulnerable members or limiting social inequality amongst themselves (Banting & Kymlicka 2017; Miller 2017). Beyond this, solidarity has certain epistemic and relational benefits: whether as a result of shared goals, shared experience, or shared oppression (see above), fellows in solidarity consider each other trustworthy participants in the pursuit of the common good, and they share information, jointly deliberate and learn from each other about how to understand adversity and oppression and pursue strategies to overcome it (Harvey 2007 on epistemic solidarity; Goodin & Spiekermann 2015; Wiland 2017).
Does solidarity have value beyond these good consequences? Perhaps some quick terminology is helpful. Non-instrumental value is value that does not derive from making a contribution to something else. Non-instrumental value is intrinsic if the value stems from some (necessary?) internal property of the object (see: Intrinsic vs. Extrinsic Value). Implicitly relying on such a notion of intrinsic non-instrumental value, several authors have claimed that solidarity’s value could only ever be instrumental. Rainer Forst, for example, argues that solidarity could not be “something intrinsically good, since a Mafia family very much depends on the solidarity of its members” (forthcoming) and he concludes that, therefore, solidarity is “normatively dependent”. Other authors concur with this judgment: solidarity is aimed at realizing justice or overcoming oppression, and it is valuable when and because it realizes this aim (Kohn forthcoming). The structure of the negative argument here is clear enough:
- If solidarity has non-instrumental value, then each instance of it has value
- Unity amongst mafia members is an instance of solidarity
- Unity amongst mafia members has no value
- Therefore, solidarity has no non-instrumental value.
- Therefore, no internal property of solidarity practices that is valuable as such, independent of the consequences that it produces
There is, however, an interesting overlap here with an issue we mentioned in section 2, namely whether or not solidarity ought to be moralized: according to some authors that analyze such “pernicious solidarities” as the one that prevails amongst mafia clans and white supremacists, the correct response to Forst’s case is not to reject that the idea that solidarity has non-instrumental value, but to deny premise (2): it is precisely for the reason that solidarity necessarily has some good-making internal properties that we should not consider unity amongst mafia members an instance of it.
It is not obvious how to resolve this potential disagreement. Is there perhaps some other way to proceed? A better approach, we think, is available if we scrutinize premise (1): Intrinsic value is just one way in which a practice could have non-instrumental value. Whilst it may be true that a practice only has intrinsic value if each instance of it has value, this is compatible with its being non-instrumentally valuable in non-intrinsic ways. Here are some important considerations: Only attributing instrumental value to solidarity does, intuitively, seem to run up against at least two kinds of cases. First, defenders of the non-instrumental value of solidarity may point to the intuitive force of “futile solidarity”: when the exploited workers come together to fight for their rights in solidarity, we are likely to consider this valuable even if their effort is ultimately thwarted. Second, there is the very plausible thought that, somehow, a special kind of value is realized when bad or unjust aspects of the world are brought to an end through acts of solidarity: when the workers’ combined agency causes the end of their oppression rather than, say, the unexpected change of mind of their exploitative bosses, something especially valuable has occurred.
Now of course there are things that defenders of the “instrumental only” thesis can say in response: for example, they may point out that there still are good consequences in each of these examples, even if the overall goal has not been realized. For example, there may be a sense of shared destiny or reciprocal commitment amongst workers to each other that is caused by solidarity. It is this reciprocal commitment (and what it can lead to) that has value, not solidarity as such. The problem with this response is that it seems to misdescribe the relation between solidarity and whatever good has occurred in the world. The reciprocal commitment that workers have towards each other, for example, is not “caused” by solidarity: rather, solidarity is partly or wholly constituted by it. One suggestion, then, is that solidarity has non-instrumental value of a non-intrinsic kind. What does this mean? The idea is that solidarity is part-constitutive of something that is non-instrumentally valuable. This allows for there to be some practice x that satisfies our criteria for being solidaristic, and yet, it does not have value. But it preserves the idea that solidarity is not only good for what it causes but, if the right circumstances obtain, it is an integral element in something that is intrinsically good.
There are at least two ways in which we might flesh out solidarity’s non-instrumental value, one more individualistic and one more collective. The more individualistic approach suggests that we can understand solidarity’s non-instrumental value as analogous to the value of other good dispositions and attitudes that an agent can have. Specifically, philosophers thinking about the goodness of virtue have argued that appropriately responding to something that has value is itself something of (intrinsic) value, as is negatively responding to something that has disvalue (Hurka 2001). The connection to virtue works as follows: when an agent responds to the adversity that they or others face by developing solidaristic attitudes and dispositions—say by committing to ending oppression with others picked out by the cause—then their having these solidarist attitudes is non-instrumentally valuable because they are negatively reacting to something that is of disvalue (oppression, adversity etc.). But, and here is the rub, the agent’s response is only valuable when it constitutes the correct response to the relevant feature of the world. The white supremacist’s solidarity is not valuable because the thing against which his solidarity is directed, namely racial equality, is a valuable state of affairs. But negatively responding to something that has value clearly lacks non-instrumental value. This individualist account of solidarity’s non-instrumental value is attractive because it can account equally well for cases of “solidarity amongst” and “solidarity with”. Moreover, it equally applies to cases where agents privately develop the relevant solidaristic attitudes without actually acting on them (e.g., discussed in Bommarito 2016; Zhao 2019; and Viehoff forthcoming). Insofar as we think that their attitudes are valuable, some account along these lines seems necessary to account for it.
But perhaps there is something missing from this individualistic picture: one of the objections to those suggesting that solidarity only has instrumental value relied on the idea that there is value in people realizing a goal together. Shouldn’t our account of solidarity’s non-instrumental value also be able to capture this aspect? Recent literature has accounted for this in broadly two ways (though these are not necessarily exclusive): Avery Kolers maintains that, quite independently of pursuing justified aims, solidarity groups constitute just (in his words “equitable”) relations amongst participants. For Kolers, in following the demands of solidarity and acting together,
we are not only working to (teleologically) bring about the end of oppression; rather, we constitutively embody a non-oppressive alternative world—even if, as is likely, our joint efforts ultimately fail, in part or in whole. (Kolers 2016: 123–4)
So one way of highlighting non-instrumental collective value ensues from focusing on the kind of community that relations of solidarity give rise to: in acting together in the specific way required by the ideal of solidarity, fellows already conform to norms of equity or justice that they seek to bring about more widely.
Another line of argument is developed by Sangiovanni, who argues that, when successfully pursuing valuable goals together, we create non-instrumentally valuable joint agency:
We take pleasure in the exercise of those reciprocal, mutually adjusted, and mutually reinforcing capabilities that have enabled us to overcome forms of adversity that would have been impossible to overcome alone. The collective activity of overcoming […] comes to have non-instrumental value. (Sangiovanni forthcoming)
However, and similar to the more individualistic argument, the value of jointly exercised agency is conditional: acting successfully to overcome some obstacle is non-instrumentally valuable only if the overcoming constitutes an achievement that is worthwhile.
4. Challenges to Solidarity
Turning to criticisms of solidarity in this section, we start by distinguishing different kinds of criticism along different dimensions. Perhaps most importantly, one must distinguish between, on the one hand, challenges to solidarity as a social practice (or a range of social practices), and, on the other hand, criticism of theories of solidarity. We will call criticisms of the former kind “practical challenges” to solidarity and will address those of the latter kind as “theoretical challenges”. Practical and theoretical challenges are clearly independent of each other. For example, one can think that we need a clear account of what solidarity is, even if one holds that solidarity practices have, on the whole, negative consequences for political life.
Theoretical challenges to solidarity can conceivably take many forms, but we will focus here on the related charges of conceptual incoherence and theoretical redundancy. The former challenge is that uses of solidarity, both common sense and philosophical, are simply too diffuse and incoherent to allow for any adequate and theoretically productive definition. If those using the concept of solidarity in political or philosophical debate are more likely than not to misunderstand or speak past each other, then we should not use the concept. The latter challenge is that, from a theoretical standpoint, we don’t need to add solidarity to the fundamental philosophical concepts in the discipline because we can have everything we want by reflecting on alternative concepts and theories that have already been more thoroughly developed, for example justice, community, or equality.
When it comes to practical challenges to solidarity, critics argue that solidarity tends to have negative consequences and that, therefore, we should not promote it. We can further differentiate these practical challenges in terms of, first, the kind of negative consequences that are attributed to solidarity and, second, the kind of solidarity practices that are judged to be vulnerable to this challenge. In relation to the former, the most prominent criticisms concern solidarity’s impact on the realization of other important social and political values. One historically important line of criticism to solidarity argues that solidarity threatens liberty (Arendt, Shklar, Kateb). Others worry that solidarity creates unfair forms of inequality between those within a solidary group and those who are excluded (Scheffler 2001). Whilst the criticism focus on negative effects on outsiders, critics have also argued that solidarity may have negative effects on participants. Perhaps most notably, some have claimed that solidarity stymies pluralism and diversity. A related but distinct worry is that solidarity promotes—or perhaps even requires—false beliefs and self-conceptions amongst participants (Margalit 2017; Shelby forthcoming).
Before we move on to specific arguments, a point about generality: We maintain that, for a criticism to amount to a “challenge” to solidarity, it must rise to a certain level of generality, i.e., it must apply to a range of accounts of solidarity.
4.1 Theoretical criticism of solidarity
Since we are here interested in theoretical challenges to solidarity (and not just objections to particular accounts), we focus on challenges that, if true, would undermine the very endeavor of elevating solidarity’s place amongst significant theoretical concepts in the discipline.
4.1.1 Conceptual incoherence
A first theoretical worry about solidarity is that, given the diversity of linguistic usage, the range of contexts of application, and the breadth of phenomena addressed in the philosophical literature under the label, solidarity is conceptually incoherent. How might this be the case? To use a somewhat far-fetched example, imagine that we were charged with developing an account of the descriptive features, goodness or permissibility of all human activities that start with the letter “L”. Because the actions picked out by our category are simply too heterogeneous (there is nothing interesting that laughing and lying, let alone loving and lynching have in common), any theorizing would be pointless. Could it be the case that “solidarity” picks out a set of actions and practices that are simply too heterogeneous to lead to anything theoretically insightful? Niklas Luhmann, for example, suggested that solidarity is obsolete, a mere “formula of ideology” without determinate content (Luhmann  quoted in Thome 1999: 101).
Despite the initial plausibility of this objection to theorizing solidarity, we think that solidarity theorists have powerful responses available. First, they can point to similarities that unify the descriptive, normative and evaluative features of instantiations of solidarity, even those as diverse as those mentioned above. For example, different authors have sought to show that despite their initial heterogeneity, solidarity in all these contexts descriptively entails a form of identification, or a sentiment of unity, or some orientation towards overcoming an obstacle or adversity, or some combination of these elements (Scholz 2008; Taylor 2015; Prainsack & Buyx 2017). Moreover, authors have subcategorized solidarity along social contexts—political solidarity, civic solidarity—(Bayertz 1999a; Scholz 2008), thereby organizing our heterogeneous linguistic use to allow for useful theoretical approaches to more determinate social practices of solidarity. Finally, theorists of solidarity can respond that, in providing a theoretical/philosophical account of solidarity, there is some freedom to make revisionary proposals about what should count as solidarity. Our (descriptive, normative, evaluative) understanding of solidarity is advanced if we “sharpen” our account of solidarity by excluding some peripheral uses, then that may well be legitimate and will limit the charge of incoherence. Theorists of solidarity may also point to other social and political concepts to claim that heterogeneous use both in everyday discourse and among philosophers is rarely considered a convincing reason to abstain from theorizing concepts like freedom, equality, justice, and the like. Why treat solidarity differently?
4.1.2 Theoretical redundancy
Faced with this appeal to other political concepts, critics may retreat to a related but distinct criticism: They may accept that concepts like freedom and equality too are beset with complexity and conceptual disagreements that need to be resolved. But they can then insist that there is no need to take up this difficult endeavor for solidarity because—contrary to liberty, equality etc.—there is no need for a theory of solidarity. This is the charge of theoretical redundancy: we can gain exactly the same explanatory mileage by using existing concepts and categories without theorizing solidarity. Descriptively, existing work on altruism, community and relations of loyalty might serve us just as well as accounts of solidarity: all of the relations that were described as solidaristic above are also (more or less intimate) communal relations amongst people. Normatively, the critic might suggest that we can reduce the claims generated by solidarity to requirements of justice, fairness, equality, and the like. And evaluatively, we can appeal to the general goodness of special bonds and relationships for the realization of a flourishing life, whether they are bonds of friendship, family, religion, or political community. If this were the case, then theorizing solidarity would be redundant, and ultimately, pointless. Why not, in a spirit of parsimony, simply rely on the concepts and theories we already have?
Again, we think that defenders of solidarity have good replies available: Perhaps the strongest response to the challenge of redundancy is to provide a substantive account of solidarity in terms of its distinctive descriptive, normative and evaluative features. If such an account is illuminating, then the charge of redundancy seems beside the point. More specifically, theorists of solidarity can appeal to distinctive descriptive or positive features of solidarity practices that make it inappropriate to subsume solidarity under a generic account of community and loyalty (see discussion in Kolers 2016: chapter 2). Unlike those bonds of friendship and family, for example, solidarity is purposive (goal-oriented), both in the sense that solidarity aims for the achievement of overcoming some obstacle or adversity and in the sense that fellows are picked de dicto in terms of the cause that is pursued rather than in some goal-independent manner (Arnsperger & Varoufakis 2003; Kolers 2016). In terms of normative distinctiveness, theorists of solidarity may also object to the critic’s implied assumption that a theoretical account of x’s normative properties loses its usefulness when we discover that these properties supervene on or are explained by a more general moral consideration.
4.2 Practical challenges to Solidarity
We now move on to the practical challenges of solidarity. Should we be critical of real-world solidarity practices because they lead to bad consequences? Or may there perhaps even be something constitutively problematic about solidarity movements? Three prominent objections relate to solidarity’s impact on liberty, fairness, and truth.
4.2.1 Does solidarity threaten liberty?
Does solidarity muffle liberty? In her celebrated essay the “Liberalism of Fear”, Judith Shklar claims it does. She writes:
We must therefore be suspicious of ideologies of solidarity, precisely because they are so attractive to those who find liberalism emotionally unsatisfying, and who have gone on in our century to create oppressive and cruel regimes of unparalleled horror. […] To seek emotional and personal development in the bosom of a community or in romantic self-expression is a choice open to citizens in liberal societies. Both, however, are apolitical impulses and wholly self-oriented, which at best distract us from the main task of politics when they are presented as political doctrines, and at worst can, under unfortunate circumstances, seriously damage liberal practices. For although both appear only to be redrawing the boundaries between the personal and the public […] it cannot be said that either one has a serious sense of the implications of the proposed shifts in either direction. (Shklar 1989: 36)
There is, one might think, an element of truth here: theorists of solidarity tend to emphasize that solidarity becomes important when and because we sense the need for collective resistance and unity of purpose in the face of adversity. They also stress the non-instrumental value in setting aside self-interest in a horizontal identification with others on behalf of a shared goal, where part of what is valued is our seeing, together, our collective agency reflected in the ends we pursue (see previous section).
The element of identification may seem particularly problematic. Identification requires, among other things, coming to see others as “like oneself”, and taking that similarity as a basis for joint concern, empathy, and normative orientation. So, for example, when I identify with you as a worker, I see our common role as providing an important orientation in my life. In this sense, solidarity demands that one set aside the personal for the political (thus “redrawing the boundaries” between them). The worry is that, at least in politics, solidarity’s demand for similarity, commitment, and loyalty leads to unfreedom and tyranny.
Faced with this fundamental challenge, theorists of solidarity have at least two arguments: First, they may insist that it is false to treat a commitment to solidarity as incompatible with a commitment to liberalism. To be sure, solidarities organized to promote illiberal ends by illiberal means are, well, illiberal by definition. But their disregard for individual rights or freedom or equality is not entailed or required by their solidarity. Indeed, if, as Shklar and others emphasize, liberalism demands vigilance, hatred of injustice, and a readiness to resist power when necessary, then liberalism requires solidarity. Resistance is most effective when it is conducted by groups whose grievances are shared and known to be shared. These grievances provide a spring for joint action, and a powerful source of identification. Such identification is necessary to overcome fear, and it allows people to act pro-socially by looking beyond their immediate self-interest to the larger task at hand.
A second reason why these challenges are not fully convincing is this: In Shklar the target is what we might call state-level solidarity. Though they do not name it, their target is national or patriotic solidarity—solidarity as invoked by those who have political power and who aim to rally the people against an enemy, or solidarity as it is invoked by those who believe that active, partisan political participation is essential for a flourishing life. The first response is simply to point out (as this entry does) that solidarity can be at the heart of social movements and bottom-up political action. It need not be solely focused on or through the state. The second response is that even state-level solidarity need not be so pernicious. Civic solidarity need not enforce blind conformity, disrespect difference or disagreement, or raze plurality. There is a rich tradition in the history of political ideas—stretching from Leon Bourgeois’ solidarism to present writings—that grounds civic solidarity not in some “totalizing” pre-political identity, but in the mutual interdependence of citizens and their democratic co-authorship of justice-preserving institutions.
4.2.2 Does solidarity promote false beliefs?
Solidarity, it was said, imposes not only demands on what to do but also on what fellows should believe. With regard to such beliefs, solidarity requires fellows to see each other as united by some common feature, or condition or experience. Does solidarity systematically lead to false beliefs amongst members of solidarity groups, for example about what unites them?
Perhaps most prominently, the question of the relationship between—in this case, historical—truth and the kind of collective group identification necessary for solidarity has come up in debates about (liberal) nationalism. Here, the charge against nationalist solidarity is that, for essentially instrumental purposes, national identity both relies on and promotes false beliefs amongst members about some glorified national past (Abizadeh 2004). Other forms of solidarity need not, of course, rely on some shared historical origins amongst participants. But the challenge can be generalized: insofar as solidarity requires some ground for mutual identification, whether shared experience, shared oppression, or shared goals, there is a danger that the practice systematically guides participants to overestimate those identification-grounding features at the expense of other, perhaps more salient, elements that are not shared amongst them. To go back to two earlier examples, sisterhood may require participants to see some feature of their identity (“being a woman”) as particularly important when, in fact, their de facto situation of social disadvantage is (also) fundamentally structured by other categories like race or class. Similarly, black solidarity asks participants to focus on whatever grounds commonality amongst blacks, even if their actual social position is shaped by matters of class, gender, migration status, and so on (Shelby forthcoming).
Confronted with the fact that much of what is promulgated as part of shared national history does not hold up against the historical record, liberal nationalists like David Miller (1995) have responded that “myths” about a national collective’s past need not be true so long as they serve the purpose of supporting those attitudes that underpin valuable national solidarity. But irrespective of whether or not they are useful, they are untrue, and, to the extent that the group identification necessary for national solidarity depends on it, it depends on having false beliefs.
Does this worry generalize to all forms of solidarity? One important difference between national solidarity and other forms is that most other solidarities do not typically depend on beliefs in something that is manifestly untrue. Rather, they emphasize the relevance of some genuine aspect of a person’s practical identity—whether it is shared experience, shared oppression, shared goals etc.—over others. We might add that whether or not some feature is salient for one’s practical identity is, at least to a degree, up to the relevant agent. So one conciliatory response that defenders of (non-national) solidarity might offer is that solidarity does not depend on belief in falsehoods, but rather that it expresses which aspects of their identity participants take to be important. They might add that, insofar as there is free deliberation both about what unites and, importantly, what divides participants to solidarity movements, the charge of promoting false beliefs is beside the point. In a more combative vein, they may also add that, at least in some cases, solidarity is actually a necessary element for the formation of correct beliefs about one’s own and others’ predicament. Wiland describes this as epistemic solidarity (Wiland 2017: 69). Thus, standing in solidarity with others that have suffered from similar instances of adversity and oppression can be a necessary condition for enabling each other to make sense of our predicament: We form true beliefs about our shared predicament and improve our ability to define and fight oppressive conditions by being able to trust each other’s oppression-related testimony (Goodin & Spiekermann 2015).
4.2.3 Is solidarity exclusionary / unfair towards outsiders?
Whatever else solidarity entails descriptively; it entails a special commitment to one’s solidarity fellows that one does not hold towards everybody else. And whatever normative consequences solidarity has for those in solidarity, it will ground some special claims that these fellows have on us and we on them. In this sense, solidarity, like friendship, family, and nationality, constitutes a special relationship with special obligations. Over recent decades, a number of philosophers have raised challenges to the very idea that special obligations can be justified towards those who are not part of them. Perhaps most prominently, Samuel Scheffler has raised a fairness-based “distributive objection” to all special relationships (Scheffler 2001). If fellows in solidarity form special relationships with special obligations, then, does Scheffler’s criticism apply here too?
The distributive objection builds on the idea that participants to special relationships receive special benefits from each other: qua membership, we are owed not just more from fellow participants than we are from outsiders, but we are also owed priority, in at least some instances. What the distributive objection observes is that members already benefit from the relationship goods that are constitutively tied to being in a meaningful relationship. The problem is that, then, fellows also owe less to outsiders then they did beforehand: Special relationships—including solidarity relations—thus function, to use Scheffler’s memorable phrase, like “moral tax shelters” to those who already benefit.
Whilst several authors have rejected the general thrust of the distributive objection (Kolodny 2002; Lazar 2009), we want to point to some features of solidarity that should provide specific cover against this challenge. Crucially, friends of solidarity may stress that unlike friendship or love relations, solidarity obligations are not necessarily grounded in the value of the relationship, but in relationship-independent value that comes from having these duties. Special duties of solidarity would then be justified more like role obligations—lawyers, for example, have fiduciary duties to represent their client’s interests not because of the non-instrumental value of lawyer-client relationships, but because of the advantages that vesting them with such duties has for the system’s overall ability to optimally realize impartial moral demands (such as protecting innocent defendants). On this strategy, duties of solidarity would ultimately be grounded in non-partial values like fairness and natural justice. How might this justification run? Many of our positive general duties are imperfect, so that even well-meaning people are likely to face significant obstacles in discharging them: it requires the ability to coordinate our actions in complex ways with others; and we must also be motivated to make contributions in light of other important projects and relationships. If the special obligations that flow from solidarity commitments can provide us with a robust way of solving issues of coordination and motivation (because, following a solidarity-commitment, discharging our general duties through solidarity somehow better aligns with our personal projects) then those obligations could be justified by an appeal to impartial moral considerations (Kolers 2016; Viehoff forthcoming).
But even for those who think that some duties of solidarity are grounded in the non-instrumental value of solidaristic fellowship, there are important responses available: First, solidarity (at least in its most paradigmatic forms) establishes unity amongst those suffering from injustice or oppression, so it rather far from providing some kind of indirect protection from more extensive duties towards the more vulnerable. Second, special responsibilities towards our fellows, like other special duties, are not absolute: very plausibly, they are constrained by general demands of justice. So even if special obligations among fellows in solidarity could ground some partiality, these duties would be limited by more weighty considerations of justice.
Do these responses answer all the possible objections of fairness and exclusion? Probably not; questions of permissible solidaristic partiality, especially amongst large-scale collectives like the state, clearly depend on questions of social and global justice that cannot be addressed here. So questions of the kinds of obligations that solidarity practices can ground blend into issues of justice. But that should not be surprising, nor should it prevent us from reflection on solidarity in its own right.
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