Notes to Solidarity in Social and Political Philosophy

1. Compare the common refrain heard within the feminist movement, where orthodox “second-wave” feminism is often charged with being too white, (unconsciously) exclusionary, and middle class. See, e.g., Zakaria 2021; Spelman 1988; Crenshaw 1991; hooks 1981 [2015].

2. We thank Barry Maguire for discussion.

3. We take no stand here on the metaphysics of race. The idea of solidarity among blacks as black is consistent with skepticism about whether there are such things as “races”. See, e.g., Appiah 1985; Glasgow 2009. For a skeptic, solidarity among blacks as black could be grounded in, say, common experiences of subjection to a racialized order in which certain people are classified as black (even if the classification fails to track any real properties).

4. For accounts of solidarity that emphasize mutual identification, see Shelby 2005; Van Parijs forthcoming; Sangiovanni forthcoming; May 1996.

5. Scholz also offer a more general definition of solidarity (of which political solidarity is just one instance). See Scholz 2008: 19.

6. See also Pierre Leroux’s De l’humanité, who contrasted solidarity with charity, using the former term to refer roughly to social bonds grounded in practices of mutual aid and association that are triggered by mutual and enlightened self-interest rather than an open-ended love of mankind (Leroux 1840 [1845: 157–76]).

7. On John Paul II and Solidarnosc, see Garton Ash 1983 [2002]; Michnik 1985.

8. See, for example, the helpful discussion on the “solidarity of interdependence” in Potter 2009.

9. We thank Meghan Clark for discussion and pointers.

10. See also current debates on intersectionality, e.g., Carastathis 2014; Crenshaw 1991, which put into question the forms of power and exclusion that go into any attempt to define a paradigmatic form of oppression or experience or essence that all women are supposed to share.

11. For relevantly similar criticisms of solidarity, see: Arendt 1951 [1973: 465–66] and Kateb 1989: 188

12. On welfare state solidarity and its relation to justice, see also Bayertz 1999a: 21–6.

13. Bourgeois 1902. See also Sangiovanni forthcoming.

14. Cf. Jodi Dean’s conception of reflective solidarity (Dean 1995: 123)

Copyright © 2023 by
Andrea Sangiovanni <>
Juri Viehoff <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free