Sorites Paradox

First published Fri Jan 17, 1997; substantive revision Mon Mar 26, 2018

The sorites paradox originated in an ancient puzzle that appears to be generated by vague terms, viz., terms with unclear (“blurred” or “fuzzy”) boundaries of application. ‘Bald’, ‘heap’, ‘tall’, ‘old’, and ‘blue’ are prime examples of vague terms: no clear line divides people who are bald from people who are not, or blue objects from green (hence not blue), or old people from middle-aged (hence not old). Because the predicate ‘heap’ has unclear boundaries, it seems that no single grain of wheat can make the difference between a number of grains that does, and a number that does not, make a heap. Therefore, since one grain of wheat does not make a heap, it follows that two grains do not; and if two do not, then three do not; and so on. This reasoning leads to the absurd conclusion that no number of grains of wheat make a heap.

The same form of reasoning is familiar in everyday life. Dorothy Edgington observes:

There’s the ‘mañana paradox’: the unwelcome task which needs to be done, but it’s always a matter of indifference whether it’s done today or tomorrow; the dieter’s paradox: I don’t care at all about the difference to my weight one chocolate will make. (1997: 296)

The puzzle can be expressed as an argument most simply using modus ponens:

  • 1 grain of wheat does not make a heap.
  • If 1 grain doesn’t make a heap, then 2 grains don’t.
  • If 2 grains don’t make a heap, then 3 grains don’t.
  • If 999,999 grains don’t make a heap, then 1 million grains don’t.
  • 1 million grains don’t make a heap.

The argument is a paradox because apparently impeccable reasoning from apparently impeccable premises yields a falsehood. The argument can be run equally in the opposite direction, from the premise that one million grains make a heap: if one million grains make a heap, then one million less one grain make a heap; and if one million less one grain make a heap, then one million less two grains make a heap; etc. It follows, absurdly, that even a single grain makes a heap. Thus soritical reasoning appears to show both that no number of grains make a heap and that any number of grains make a heap.

What conclusion should we draw from this untoward result? Is there something wrong with the paradoxical argument, or does the use of vague predicates really lead to absurdity?[1] In part because we use these ordinary words successfully all the time, and do not normally land in absurdities like the ones above, most theorists of vagueness suppose that the paradox is solvable, i.e., that the paradoxical argument is defective and we can discover the defect. In what follows we consider some of the principal attempts to solve it.

1. The Sorites in History

The Megarian philosopher Eubulides (4th century BC) is usually credited with the first formulation of the puzzle. (The name ‘sorites’ derives from the Greek word soros, meaning ‘heap’.) Although we don’t know his motivations for introducing it (along with several other legendary puzzles), the paradox was later used by Greek philosophers as a dialectical weapon, most notably by the Sceptics against the Stoics’ claims to knowledge.

Curiously, the paradox attracted little subsequent interest until the late 19th century. Marxist philosophers in the neo-Hegelian tradition, like Plekhanov (1908 [1937: 114]), cited the paradox as evidence of the failure of “customary” logic and the utility of the ‘logic of contradiction’. In this way some Marxists sought to establish the triumph of the dialectic. Meanwhile, in Anglo-American philosophy, formal logic regained its central place, and its classical formalisation left no room for the vagueness of natural language. Vagueness and the associated paradox were seen as lying beyond the scope of logic and so posing no challenge to it. However, since the demise of the ideal language doctrines of the latter half of the twentieth century (see §3.1), interest in the idiosyncrasies of natural language, including its vagueness, has greatly increased.

2. Different Formulations of the Paradox

At least three conditions must be met for an argument to be an instance of the sorites paradox. (1) It must be possible to construct a sorites series for the predicate in question, viz., a finitely-membered ordering of values on a dimension decisive of the predicate’s application. A sorites series for ‘tall’ is an ordering on the dimension of height (an ordering of heights), for ‘old’ an ordering on the dimension of age (an ordering of ages), and so forth. (2) Neighboring values in the series must be only incrementally different, i.e., either indiscriminable or just slightly different. An incremental difference is supposed to guarantee that if a vague predicate applies to one of a pair of neighbors, it applies equally to the other. (Following Wright [e.g., 1975], the property of applying across incremental differences on a decisive dimension is often called the tolerance of a vague term.) (3) The predicate must be true of the first value in the series and false of the last.

The paradox is often presented in the conditional form discussed above. More formally: let ‘\(\Phi\)’ be a soritical predicate and let ‘\(\alpha_{n}\)’ (where n is a natural number) represent a value in a sorites series for ‘\(\Phi\)’. Then the paradox can be represented most simply this way, using Modus Ponens:

Conditional Sorites

\[ \begin{align} & \Phi\alpha_{1}\\ &\textrm{If } \Phi\alpha_{1} \textrm{ then } \Phi\alpha_{2}\\ &\textrm{If } \Phi\alpha_{2} \textrm{ then } \Phi\alpha_{3}\\ &\textrm{Etc.}\\ &\textrm{If } \Phi\alpha_{n-1} \textrm{ then } \Phi\alpha_{n}\\\hline &\Phi\alpha_{n} \textrm{ (where \(n\) can be arbitrarily large)} \end{align} \]

A different formulation of the paradox replaces the set of conditional premises with a universal generalization and proceeds by mathematical induction. Let ‘n’ be a variable ranging over the natural numbers and let ‘\(\forall n(\ldots n\ldots)\)’ assert that every number n satisfies the condition ...n.... Further, let us represent the claim ‘For any \(n\), if \(\alpha_n\) is \(\Phi\) then \(\alpha_{n+1}\) is \(\Phi\)’ as ‘\(\forall n (\Phi\alpha_n \rightarrow \Phi\alpha_{n+1})\)’.

Mathematical Induction Sorites

\[\begin{align} &\Phi\alpha_1 \\ &\forall n (\Phi\alpha_n \rightarrow \Phi\alpha_{n+1}) \\\hline &\forall n(\Phi \alpha_n) \end{align}\]

For example, since a man with 1 hair on his head is bald, and since, for any number of hairs n, if a man with n hairs is bald then so is a man with n+1 hairs, every number n is such that a man with n hairs on his head is bald.

Another version of the puzzle is a variant of the inductive form. We know that a sorites series for ‘bald’ contains some numbers of hairs such that men having those numbers of hairs are not bald. By the least number principle (equivalent to the principle of mathematical induction) there must be a least number, say i+1, such that a man with i+1 hairs on his head is not bald. Since a man with 1 hair on his head is bald, it follows that i+1 must be greater than 1. Hence the series contains a number of hairs n (=i) such that a man with n hairs is bald whilst a man with n+1 hairs is not. Let ‘\(\exists n(\ldots n\ldots)\)’ assert that some number n satisfies the condition ...n.... Then we can schematize the latter reasoning this way:

Line-drawing Sorites

\[\begin{align} &\Phi\alpha_1 \\ &{\sim}\forall n(\Phi \alpha_n) \\\hline &\exists n \ge 1 (\Phi\alpha_{n} \amp {\sim}\Phi\alpha_{n+1}) \end{align}\]

The line-drawing and inductive forms of the puzzle illustrate well the soritical predicament; apparently, competent users of ‘bald’ both must, and must not, draw a line in the series. For convenience in what follows, most of the examples are framed in terms of the conditional or inductive forms of the paradox. Of course, an adequate resolution of the sorites will presumably need to disarm all versions of it.

We should mention also an informal version of the paradox, known as the “forced march sorites” (Horgan 1994a; Soames 1999). Here it is framed in terms of the hypothetical classifications that would be made by a competent speaker proceeding step by step along a sorites series. A competent speaker must say that a single grain of wheat does not make a heap; but if that’s right, then she must also say that two grains do not make a heap; and that three grains don’t; and so on until she must say that, e.g., one million grains don’t make a heap. As will emerge, the forced march sorites plays an important role in several treatments of the paradox.

It is worth noting that the popular definition of vagueness in terms of soriticality (e.g., Wright 1976; Bueno & Colyvan 2012) may well be incorrect. If the sorites is a resolvable fallacy, as most theorists of vagueness believe, then vagueness is not after all a source of paradox. Maybe someone will say that even after the correct diagnosis of the puzzle has been discovered, the argument will remain a paradox because it will still appear to consist in unimpeachable reasoning from true premises to a false conclusion. But such a view makes vagueness far too contingent a property; for all we know, once we have discovered the proper solution to the puzzle, the major premise will no longer appear true. It may appear true to the uninitiated, but this too would be a dubious way to define vagueness—viz., as the property of generating an argument that previously appeared, or appears to the uninitiated, paradoxical. Bueno and Colyvan say that “a predicate is vague just in case it can be employed to generate a sorites argument” (2012). But what does ‘can be employed’ mean here? If a sorites argument is a fallacy, a vague predicate cannot be correctly employed in it. Is the criterion supposed to be that a vague predicate is a term which, when employed incorrectly, appears temporarily (to the uninitiated?) to generate a sorites paradox? (Raffman 2014: 18–19)

In all likelihood, soriticality is an illusory feature of words like ‘old’ and ‘rich’; their vagueness is real. If that’s right, then apparent soriticality may be best viewed as a temporary symptom of vagueness, or perhaps as an element of its “surface characterization” (Smith 2008, e.g., 132; see Smith’s third chapter for insight as to what vagueness is).

3. Responses to the Paradox

As with any paradox, four broad types of response appear to be available. One might:

  1. deny that logic applies to soritical expressions.

Alternatively, one might accept that the paradox is a legitimate argument to which logic applies, but then deny its soundness by either

  1. rejecting some premise(s), or
  2. denying that it’s valid.

The most drastic response would be to

  1. embrace the paradox and conclude that vague terms are either incoherent or vacuous.

In what follows, we consider the major philosophical treatments of the sorites and the ways in which they have employed these strategies to dissolve the puzzle.

3.1 Ideal Language Approaches

Committed as Frege and Russell (see entries on Gottlob Frege and Bertrand Russell) were to ideal language doctrines, it is not surprising to find them pursuing a type (1) response (e.g., Frege 1903[1960], Russell 1923). A key attribute of the ideal language is said to be its precision; hence the vagueness of natural language, including all soritical terms, is a defect to be eliminated. If that’s right, then contrary to what many theorists believe, soritical terms cannot be marshalled to challenge classical logic. Logic simply does not apply to them. Echoing this response, Quine contends that although eliminating vague terms may incur some cost to ordinary ways of talking, it’s a cost worth paying insofar as it allows us to preserve the “sweet simplicity” of classical logic (1981: 31–37).

However, with the demise of ideal language doctrines and subsequent revival of interest in ordinary language, vagueness was no longer regarded as a superficial or easily dispensable feature. If logic was to have teeth, it had to apply to natural language as it stands; soritical expressions are unavoidable and the paradox must be faced head on. Responses of type (2) do just this and are the most common family of responses. Logic is seen as applicable to natural language, in particular to the paradoxical argument, and the latter is diagnosed as resting on a faulty premise.

3.2 The Epistemic Theory

Most theorists of vagueness conceive of vagueness as a semantic phenomenon, as somehow rooted in the meanings of words like ‘tall’ and ‘old’. As we shall see, semantic theories typically introduce special nonclassical logics and/or semantics in order to resolve the paradox (and accommodate the phenomenon of borderline cases). In contrast, epistemicists think that vagueness is just a form of ignorance: vague terms have sharp boundaries whose locations are hidden from us. In fact, heaps are sharply divided from non-heaps, and tall heights are sharply divided from average ones, but we cannot discover where those divisions lie (e.g., Sorensen 1988, 2001; Williamson 1994a,b, 2000; Graff 2000, Fara 2008; Rescher 2009). On this view, the sorites paradox is dispatched immediately: the major premise, or one of the conditional premises, is simply false. And bivalence is preserved: any application of a vague term either is true or is false, though we cannot always know which.

What facts about the world or natural language or competent speakers could serve to fix sharp boundaries for vague words? According to Williamson (e.g., 1994b: 184), meaning supervenes on use; in other words, the locations of the sharp boundaries of a vague term are a function of speakers’ dispositions to use it as they do. (Insofar as the use of a vague term varies across time, its boundaries may be unstable.) Of course, we cannot know the totality of those dispositions, and we do not know the relevant function; and our ignorance of these factors blocks one path to knowledge of the locations of the term’s boundaries.

Another possible route to knowledge of the boundary locations is blocked by the fact that our knowledge of the application of a vague term is inexact. Inexact knowledge is governed by margin for error principles, viz., principles of the form ‘If x and y differ incrementally on a decisive dimension and x is known to be \(\Phi\) (old, blue, etc.), then y is \(\Phi\)’.[2] For example, where knowledge is inexact, we can know of a blue object that it is blue only if objects whose colors are incrementally different are blue as well—hence, only in clear cases. In contrast, in the borderline or “penumbral” region of a sorites series for ‘blue’, where the boundary lives, some shade of blue is only incrementally different from, indeed may look the same as, a shade that is not blue; and we cannot know where this difference lies. Consequently, if we classify the former shade as blue, that classification is correct by luck, and so does not constitute knowledge. (On the plausible assumption that seeing that something x is blue is sufficient for knowing that x is blue, it follows that some blue things are such that we cannot see that they are blue, even under ideal viewing conditions.)

The virtues and the appeal of the epistemic theory are significant, and it has earned its share of supporters. At the same time, the view may be hard to accept. Even its proponents grant that epistemicism is intuitively implausible; and it seems to multiply mysteries. As a first approximation, the epistemicist says that

vague terms have unknowable sharp boundaries that are fixed by an unknown function of their unknowable (i.e., not fully knowable) patterns of use.

However, it seems that the function too must be unknowable, not just unknown; for how could we recognize it if we came across it? How could we tell whether we’d gotten hold of the right function but by determining whether it yields the correct boundaries as its values? If that’s right, then the epistemicist’s thesis must actually be that

vague terms have unknowable sharp boundaries that are fixed by an unknowable function of their unknowable patterns of use.

(Raffman 2014: 10) To be sure, explanations are provided for our irremediable ignorance in these cases: for example, we can’t know where the sharp boundaries lie because our knowledge is inexact, and we can’t know the total pattern of the term’s use because “the data are infinite” (Williamson 1994b: 184–185), and so on. Nevertheless, epistemicism may have the feel of a “just so” story.[3] (See §5.1 for further discussion of Williamson.)

Graff Fara defends a different strain of epistemicism (Graff 2000, Fara 2008). Åkerman and Greenough (2010) observe that her account

is a form of epistemicism in that vague predicates draw sharp, bivalent, boundaries.[4] Unlike the epistemicism of Sorensen (1988) and Williamson (1994a,b), however, it is constitutive of vagueness that the boundary can shift as a function of changes in [speakers’ interests].[5] (2010: 277)

Such a sharp boundary is unknowable because (among other things) it is constantly moving around in a sorites series, changing location with the speaker’s interests in such a way that he never encounters it (Fara 2008: 328). As Stanley puts it,

when we look for [a] boundary of the extension of [a vague term] in its penumbra, our very looking has the effect of changing the [extension] of the vague expression so that the boundary is not where we are looking. (2003: 269)

Thus we can never discover where the boundary lies, and each conditional premise seems true so long as we are considering it. (The role of interest-relativity in Graff Fara’s account is discussed further in §3.3.4.)

Retention of classical logic and bivalence is supposed to be a chief advantage of the epistemic approach over other views (e.g., Williamson 1992: 162). Indeed, because bivalence is widely supposed to entail sharp boundaries, many theorists of vagueness believe that, for all intents and purposes, epistemicism is the only theory that can employ a bivalent semantics (e.g., Rosenkranz 2003, Keefe 2000).[6] In particular, they believe that no semantic theory of vagueness can be classical. Subsequent developments cast doubt on this view, however; see §3.3.5.

3.3 Semantic Approaches

As indicated above, vagueness is usually taken to be a semantic feature of language. And if it is a semantic feature, its logic and/or semantics cannot be classical, or so the standard thinking goes. Starting in the later part of the 20th century, a number of non-classical logics and semantics have been developed for vague terms, each advancing its proprietary resolution of the sorites paradox. The extent of the proposed logical innovation varies.

Most semantic theories of vagueness and treatments of the sorites conceive of the application of a vague term as indeterminate in a certain range of cases. Specifically, in a sorites series for vague predicate ‘\(\Phi\)’, it is said to be indeterminate—there is “no fact of the matter”—which value is the last \(\Phi\) value. The indeterminacy is usually thought to be manifested in the predicate’s possession of (possible) borderline cases. Borderlines are variously conceived as neither definitely (or determinately) \(\Phi\) nor definitely not \(\Phi\), or as such that the sentence ‘x is \(\Phi\)’ is neither true nor false, or neither super-true nor super-false, or neither true to degree 1 nor false to degree 1, for example.[7] The shared idea seems to be that the regions of borderline cases in a sorites series for ‘\(\Phi\)’ constitute the predicate’s blurred boundaries; and that because the series contains these indeterminate values, the major premise (or one or more conditional premises) of the paradox is either less than true or flat-out false. In what follows we review some of the major semantic treatments of the paradox.

3.3.1 Supervaluationism

In accord with a principle of least mutilation, one approach adapts Van Fraassen’s supervaluation semantics (1966) to the sorites paradox and vagueness more generally (e.g., Fine 1975; Keefe 2000). As a result, it endorses a non-bivalent logic that, at least on the face of it, retains the classical consequence relation and classical laws while admitting truth-value gaps. On this view, the challenge posed by the sorites paradox can be met by logical revision in the metatheory alone, and a type (2) response is advocated.

Unlike the epistemic conception of vagueness, a semantic conception will treat the apparent semantic indeterminacy of vague predicates as real. Borderline cases are values to which the predicate neither definitely applies nor definitely does not apply, where ‘definitely’ gets a semantic analysis as opposed to an epistemic one. The positive extension of a predicate is given by those values to which the predicate definitely applies, the negative extension by those values to which the predicate definitely does not apply, and the remaining (penumbral) cases are values to which the predicate neither definitely does, nor definitely does not, apply. Consistently with a view of vagueness as a semantic deficiency (e.g., Fine 1975) or as semantic indecision (e.g., Lewis 1986), supervaluationists define a notion of “super-truth” (“super-falsity”) as the status of being true (false) irrespective of how the semantic deficiency or indecision is resolved or precisified, i.e., true (false) on every precisification of the predicate. Applying the predicate to something in its positive extension results in a super-true sentence, while applying it to something in its negative extension results in a super-false sentence. Equating super-truth with truth simpliciter and super-falsity with falsity simpliciter then results in a non-bivalent logic with borderline cases giving rise to truth-value gaps.

With validity then defined in the usual way as preservation of truth (simpliciter), the supervaluationist account of validity coincides with classical validity. In particular, treating laws as zero-premise arguments, supervaluationism preserves all classical laws. Thus, despite its abandonment of bivalence, supervaluationism validates the law of excluded middle. For example, irrespective of the vagueness of ‘heap’ it is logically true of any number of grains of wheat that it either does or does not make a heap. As a consequence, supervaluation semantics is not truth-functional. It countenances instances of true disjunctions neither of whose disjuncts is (super) true. Conjunction and the conditional exhibit analogous non-classical features.

Since all of the forms taken by the sorites paradox are classically valid, they are also supervaluationally valid. The conclusion of the conditional form using Modus Ponens is resisted by noticing that some conditional premise fails to be true; though, admittedly, none is false. The conditional sorites is valid but unsound. More revealing is the diagnosis of the version employing a universal major premise. This version is also deemed unsound due to the failure of one of the premises—the universal premise. The universally quantified conditional is not true; in fact it is false. While there is no one conditional premise that is false, it is nonetheless true according to supervaluation theory that some conditional is. That is to say, it is true that some n is such that it’s not the case that if \(\Phi\alpha_{n}\) then \(\Phi\alpha_{n+1}\) (where ‘\(\Phi\)’ is soritical relative to the subjects of the form \(\alpha_{n}\)).

Since supervaluation semantics admits that the falsity of ‘\(∀n(\Phi\alpha_{n} \rightarrow \Phi\alpha_{n+1})\)’ is logically equivalent to the truth of ‘\(\exists n(\Phi\alpha_n \amp {\sim}\Phi\alpha_{n+1})\)’, the line-drawing form of the sorites is sound: it is supervaluationally valid since classically valid and its premises are uncontestably true. What supervaluation semantics claims to provide is a formal account of how, contrary to appearances, such a conclusion could be true; it is true since true no matter how one resolves the indeterminacy of the vague term involved (i.e., the soritical predicate).

In this way the sorites paradoxes are said to be defused. With vagueness viewed as a semantic phenomenon, classical semantics is no longer appropriate as a semantics of vague language and supervaluation semantics is proposed in its place. One immediate concern facing this solution is the fact that it ultimately treats the mathematical induction and line-drawing forms of the sorites in the same manner as the logically conservative epistemic theory does. We are forced to accept the avowedly counterintuitive truth of ‘\(\exists n(\Phi\alpha_n \amp {\sim}\Phi\alpha_{n+1})\)’ which seems to postulate the existence of a sharp boundary, yet the existence of such a boundary is just what the semantic theory of vagueness is meant to deny. Supervaluationists respond by denying that the conclusion of the line-drawing sorites expresses the existence of a sharp boundary. Though committed to the claim expressed by

\[\tag{a} \mathrm{T} ‘\exists n(\Phi\alpha_n \amp {\sim}\Phi\alpha_{n+1})\apos, \]

semantic precision is properly captured only by the expression

\[\tag{b} \exists n \mathrm{T} ‘(\Phi\alpha_n \amp {\sim}\Phi\alpha_{n+1})\apos \]

and this is clearly denied by supervaluation theory. Whilst it is true that there is some cut-off point, there is no particular point of which it is true that it is the cut-off point. Since only the latter sort of cut-off point is taken to be a sharp boundary, no commitment is made to such a boundary of which we are ignorant (contra the epistemic theorist).

With this explanation, however, doubts arise as to the adequacy of the logic. Not only must (b) be properly taken to represent the semantic precision of ‘\(\Phi\)’ but we must also be prepared to admit that some existential statements can be true without having any true instance, thus blocking any inference from (a) to (b). Just as the failure of the metatheoretic principle of bivalence in conjunction with the retention of the law of excluded middle commits the supervaluationist to the presence of true disjunctions lacking true disjuncts, so too must we countenance analogous non-standard behavior in the logic’s quantification theory. In effect, the counterintuitive aspects of the epistemic theory are avoided only at a cost to other intuitions.

At this point the supervaluationist might seek to explain these semantic anomalies by showing how they are mandated by a proper understanding of the underlying phenomenon of vagueness. More exactly, the suggestion is that a view of vagueness as merely semantic, not reflecting any underlying phenomenon of metaphysical vagueness (i.e., a view of vagueness as merely representational) might underpin a supervaluationist approach. Fine (1975) appears to promote this representational view when defending the law of excluded middle, for example, and Varzi (2001) amongst others also defends supervaluationism in this way. (If successful, such a defense would also provide a principled justification of the common de facto linkage of supervaluation theory and a representational view of vagueness.) If this explanation is to be pursued, then the formal machinery of supervaluationism solves the paradox only in conjunction with a denial of metaphysical vagueness. The metaphysical debate is ongoing. Keefe (2000), on the other hand, opts for a risky pragmatic defense: though counterintuitive, the semantic anomalies that afflict supervaluationism should be accepted because they are part of a theory that fares better overall than any other; no additional defense is necessary.

Williamson (1994a) points to two further problems apparently afflicting the supervaluationist account. First, classical inferences like conditional proof, constructive dilemma, and reductio ad absurdum no longer hold in a language extended to express vagueness by the addition of a determinately operator ‘D’ or similar. The logic of the extended language is decidedly non-classical. (Dummett [1975] offers an alternative definition of validity that does not encounter this problem, but Williamson raises other objections to it. However, Graff Fara [2003] shows that if we strengthen the notion of consequence to penumbral consequence, we get failures of these principles even in the absence of a determinately operator.) Second, problems arise also with regard to the phenomenon of higher order vagueness. In accommodating higher order vagueness, the supervaluationist must admit that his proffered concept of truth, viz., super-truth, lacks properties that truth is standardly thought to possess. Contrary to claims by supervaluationists, then, truth is not super-truth (see Keefe 2000 for a rebuttal).

3.3.2 Relatives of Supervaluationism

Some criticisms of supervaluationism are mounted from positions closer to the supervaluationist’s own perspective, sharing some of its central insights while abandoning others.

While agreeing to the type (2) response advocated by supervaluationists, Burgess and Humberstone (1987) take issue with the theory’s much-discussed retention of the law of excluded middle, adopting instead a variant of supervaluationist logic that abandons the classical law in the face of apparent counter-examples presented by vagueness. (For discussion and criticism from a supervaluationist perspective see Keefe 2000: ch.7.)

Another variant of supervaluationism is Jaśkowski’s paraconsistent (see the entry on paraconsistent logic) “discussive logic” which underwrites a type (3) response to the conditional sorites. A decade before Mehlberg (1958) first proposed what was, in effect, a supervaluationist treatment of vagueness, a student of Łukasiewicz (see entry), Stanisław Jaśkowski, published an account of a logic that he proposed as a logic of vague concepts. It was, in fact, the first formal system of paraconsistent logic. (Interestingly, both Mehlberg and Jaśkowski were students of the Lvov-Warsaw School of philosophy (see entry) where Łukasiewicz was a professor.) Paraconsistent approaches to the sorites paradox had been advocated by Marxists for some time, with borderline case predications providing paradigm examples of dialectical situations. The paradox was commonly cited as evidence of the inadequacy of classical logic; but it was not until Jaśkowski’s pioneering work that the proposal received formal explication. This logic, sometimes now referred to as “subvaluationism” to emphasise its duality with the more familiar supervaluationism, represents the postulated semantic indeterminacy as semantic overdetermination, rather than the underdetermination typical of truth-value gap responses to the phenomenon of vagueness. While arguing for a supervaluationist semantics for vagueness, Fine (1975) noted that the (subvaluationist) truth-value glut approach can be arrived at by a simple reinterpretation of the truth-value gap approach advocated therein. (For more on this system and a limited defense thereof see Hyde 1997. For criticism see Keefe 2000: ch.7 and Beall & Colyvan 2001.)

3.3.3 Degree and Many-Valued Theories

In contrast to the non-truth-functional logics outlined above, several truth-functional non-classical logics have been proposed, and in particular, many-valued logics (see the entry on many-valued logic). Again vagueness is seen as a properly semantic phenomenon, with the attendant indeterminacies providing cases of semantic underdetermination or overdetermination, but truth-functionality is preserved. The approaches vary as regards the number of non-classical truth-values deemed appropriate to model vagueness and defuse the sorites paradox.

An initial proposal, first developed in Halldén 1949 and Körner 1960 and revamped in Tye 1994, uses a three-valued logic. The motivation for such a logic is similar to the supervaluationist’s. Just as a vague predicate divides objects into the positive extension, negative extension and penumbra, vague sentences can be divided into the true, the false and the indeterminate. Unlike supervaluation semantics, however, the connectives are all defined truth-functionally. Though Halldén proposed Kleene’s weak three-valued tables, Kleene’s strong three-valued tables have dominated as the preferred choice. (For the relevant tables see Haack 1974: Appendix.) A recent variation on this theme is Field 2003, which supplements Kleene’s strong tables with an improved, non-truth-functional conditional and distinguishes the three-valued semantics from the common truth-value gap approach.

The particular response to the sorites paradox then further depends on the definition of validity adopted. A common generalisation of the concept of validity to many-valued logic involves the designation of certain values. A sentence holds (or is assertible) in a many-valued interpretation just if it takes a designated value. Validity may then be defined as the necessary preservation of designated value. (In classical logic, of course, only truth is designated and thus the generalised concept reduces to the classical concept of necessary truth-preservation.) There are then two non-trivial choices: let the set of designated values be {true} or {true, indeterminate}. The former proposal, advocated by Körner and by Tye, results in a type (2) response to the paradox. The latter proposal results in a paraconsistent logic and yields a type (3) response (see the section on many-valued systems in the entry on paraconsistent logic). When coupled with the Kleene strong tables, it results in the paraconsistent system LP, elsewhere proposed to deal with the liar paradox and offered as a logic of vagueness in Weber (2010).

While some are motivated to adopt the foregoing three-valued approaches for their truth-functionality, others find the consequences unacceptable. Those who, for example, find supervaluationist arguments for classical laws plausible will balk at excluded middle claims sometimes being other than wholly true or contradictions sometimes being other than wholly false, as may be the case in such systems. A further concern with such approaches, also applicable to supervaluationism, is that the invoked tripartite division of sentences seems to face objections similar to those that led to the abandonment of the bipartite division effected by two-valued classical logic. Due to the phenomenon of higher order vagueness (in particular second order vagueness) there would seem to be no more grounds for supposing there to exist a sharp boundary between the true sentences and indeterminate ones or the indeterminate sentences and false sentences than there was for supposing a sharp boundary to exist between the true sentences and the false ones. The phenomenon of vagueness that drives the sorites paradox no more suggests two sharp boundaries than it did one. Vague concepts appear to be concepts without boundaries at all. No finite number of divisions seems adequate. Tye (1994) seeks to avoid such difficulties by employing a vague metalanguage; Sainsbury (1990) proposes that vague terms are “boundaryless”, and that belonging to the extension of a vague predicate is more like being attracted to a magnetic pole than like fitting into a pigeon hole (as conventional wisdom might have it).

Goguen (1969) and Zadeh (1975), on the other hand, suggest replacing classical two-valued logic with an infinite-valued one. Hyde (2008) also adopts this approach, though the infinite-valued semantics is considered a purely formal device and not a commitment to degrees of truth (see Cook 2002 in this connection). Infinite-valued or fuzzy logics (see the entry on fuzzy logic) have, however, also been promoted precisely for their recognition of degrees of truth. Just as baldness comes in degrees so too, it is argued, does the truth of sentences predicating baldness of things. The fact that John is more bald than Jo is reflected in the sentence ‘John is bald’ having a higher degree of truth than ‘Jo is bald’. Smith (2008) advocates a fuzzy logic for just this reason.

Infinite-valued logics are then developed to solve the sorites paradox in a variety of ways. As with all many-valued logics, the connectives and validity can be defined variously, giving rise to a number of distinct logics. A standard proposal proceeds by way of the continuum-valued, truth-functional semantics of Łukasiewicz (see Haack 1974: Appendix). As with the three-valued case, the type of response offered to the paradox also crucially depends on the definition of validity. Where validity is defined as preservation of designated value and only the maximum value is designated, the conditional sorites admits of a type (2) response, as in Hyde 2008. However, reinstating the validity of classical laws on this general approach would require designating more than the maximum value, and a type (3) response results. In contrast, Machina (1976) suggests defining validity as preservation of the lowest degree of truth possessed by any of the argument’s premises. On this approach, the conditional sorites is invalid and thus a type (3) response again ensues. Edgington (1996) expounds a distinctly different non-truth-functional degree theory that preserves the principle of bivalence and classical logic. On this approach the conditional form of the sorites is valid and a type (2) response is advocated. Smith (2008) combines a non-bivalent, truth-functional degree theory with classical logic through a distinctive definition of validity. Smith’s unique approach provides another type (2) response to the paradox.

As with three-valued approaches, a number of problems beset infinite-valued approaches to vagueness. Firstly, where the infinitude of semantic values are taken to model degrees of truth, the very idea of a degree of truth needs explanation. Secondly, if numerical truth-values are used some justification seems required for the particular truth-value assignments. Thirdly, the full implications of abandoning the well-understood classical theory in favour of degree theory need spelling out before a proper evaluation of its worth can be made. (On these points see Sainsbury 1995: ch.2; Keefe 2000: ch.4. For an extended defense see Smith 2008: ch.5.) Furthermore, it is far from clear whether such an approach successfully avoids problems of higher order vagueness. And the assumption of a totally ordered truth-set is overly simple. Not all natural language sentences are comparable as regards their truth. Due to the multi-dimensional nature of a concept such as redness, we may be unable to say of two reddish patches differing in hue or brightness or colour-saturation, whether one is redder than the other. (On the latter points see Williamson 1994a: ch.4; Keefe 2000: ch.4. Smith [2008: ch.6] argues that the so-called problem of higher order vagueness is in fact a distinct phenomenon and proposes a distinct response.)

Smith defends the view he calls fuzzy plurivaluationism, blending together elements of degree theories and supervaluationism. The plurivaluationist semantics departs from the supervaluationist in assigning to each vague predicate multiple precise classical extensions (“acceptable interpretations”) and abandoning the semantic notion of super-truth. He replaces super-truth with “just a level of talk” governed by the instruction ‘Say that a sentence is simply true if it is true on every acceptable interpretation’ (2008: 109–110). Smith writes:

The plurivaluationist will tell us that ‘This leaf is red’ and ‘This leaf is not red’ can be said neither to be simply true nor [to be] simply false, while ‘This leaf is red or not red’ can be said to be simply true….[W]e have no violation of truth-functionality [because t]here is no level of semantic fact at which…a disjunction is assigned the value True, while neither of its disjuncts is. For the only semantic facts are the facts about what is happening in each acceptable interpretation—and these are entirely classical (hence truth-functional). What we have is just a level of talk laid on top of these semantic facts. The talk sounds non-truth-functional, but it is in fact epiphenomenal…[I]t does not literally describe a non-truth-functional semantic reality. (2008: 110)

While “simple truth” may differ significantly from super-truth, the plurivaluationist endorses the notion that properties defined across multiple valuations (interpretations) play a significant role in the verbal behavior of competent speakers.

3.3.4 Contextualism and Its Relatives

Dissatisfied with many-valued and supervaluationist approaches, Kamp (1981) introduced a contextualist solution to the paradox. Focussing on the inductive form of the sorites, Kamp maintained that every instantiation of the major premise is true in its individual context, where a context consists of the sentences (containing the given predicate) previously accepted as true. (For Kamp, a context just is a set of sentences.) Each instance is true because its antecedent must be added to the operative context before its consequent is evaluated, and the neighboring values referred to in the antecedent and consequent are only incrementally different. In a classical semantics the universal major premise would then be true as well; but Kamp adopts a non-classical definition dictating that the universal premise is true in contexts (i) where its instances are true and (ii) that remain coherent when the universal premise itself is added. The trouble is that adding that premise produces an incoherent context that “assign[s] opposite truth values to one and the same sentence” (Kamp 1981: 252). Hence the premise is false, despite all of its instances being true. The contextual relativity of this view is intuitively appealing, and it is free of the need to explain why each instance of the universal premise seems true when at least one must be false. At the same time, the nonstandard semantics for the universal quantifier may seem unintuitive.

Inspired by Kamp, a subsequent contextualist approach (Raffman 1994) has it that the major premise of the paradox is false but seems true for at least two reasons. First, we confuse it with the true claim that if \(\alpha_{i}\) is \(\Phi\) then \(\alpha_{i+1}\) is \(\Phi\) when the two values are considered together, pairwise. The pairwise claim, though true, does not license the paradoxical conclusion, which makes reference only to a value considered individually. The second reason is a hypothesis, viz., that the major premise can be false, while seeming true, because the speaker performing a forced march undergoes a characteristic change in her verbal dispositions at the moment of switching from ‘\(\Phi\)’ to ‘not-\(\Phi\)’. This dispositional change constitutes a change of context (akin to a Gestalt-shift) that allows the co-ordinated extensions of ‘\(\Phi\)’ and ‘not-\(\Phi\)’ to shift so that the values \(\alpha_{i}\) and \(\alpha_{i+1}\) flanking the switching place are now both classified as not-\(\Phi\); in particular, \(\alpha_{i}\) is classified as \(\Phi\) before the switch and as not-\(\Phi\) afterward. Thus neither predicate is ever applied in such a way that it distinguishes between the two values relative to the same context, and so the speaker is able to switch from ‘\(\Phi\)’ to ‘not-\(\Phi\)’ without crossing a boundary. The major premise seems true because we fail to realize that truth can be secured for all of its instances together only by equivocating on context.

The latter view has been criticized for (among other things) applying only to the forced march paradox as opposed to the sorites proper; the sorites concerns a series of values (properties like colors, heights, ages, etc.) in the abstract, independently of anything to do with speakers’ verbal dispositions or behaviors. To put the criticism another way, Raffman’s account may explain why the major premise of the forced march sorites seems true, but it does not touch the paradox proper. Inasmuch as their solutions often involve a dynamical element, other contextualist treatments of the paradox may be vulnerable to this objection as well.

Soames (1999, 2002) maintains that vague terms are context-sensitive in the manner of indexical expressions. Stanley (2003) objects that if Soames is right, then a diagnosis of the paradox as equivocating on an implicit contextual parameter is precluded because indexicals do not admit of variable interpretation in verb phrase ellipsis. Consider the statement ‘Jack is tired now and Jill is too’. Both the first and second (implicit) occurrences of the indexical ‘now’ must receive the same interpretation: Jack and Jill are tired at the same time. As a result of this fixity of interpretation, versions of the sorites paradox that employ such ellipses are not open to contextualist resolution, even in the presence of the relevant sort of contextual variation. Stanley provides the following example:

If that\(_{1}\) is a heap then that\(_{2}\) is too, and if that\(_{2}\) is, then that\(_{3}\) is, and if that\(_{3}\) is, then that\(_{4}\) is, … and then that\(_{n}\) is…(2003: 272)

where ‘that\(_{n}\)’ refers to the nth element of a sorites series for ‘heap’. If ‘heap’ is indexical, as Soames proposes, there is no room to suppose that its extension shifts from conjunct to conjunct in Stanley’s formulation. Defending the contextualist, Raffman (2005) responds by denying that vague terms are indexicals. She contends that in verb phrase ellipsis, vague terms should be understood on the model of ‘That elephant is big, and so is that flea’. Here the extension of ‘big’ varies between the two conjuncts despite the ellipsis (Ludlow 1989).

Although Graff Fara defends an epistemic solution to the paradox, she proposes a dynamical contextualist explanation of the intuitive appeal of the conditional premise(s). On her view, vague predicates express properties that are interest-relative in the sense that their extensions are determined by what counts as significant for a speaker at a time. The premises of the paradox seem true because a speaker performing a forced march has a “standing interest in efficiency that causes [him] to avoid making discriminations that are too costly” (Fara 2008: 327-8). For example, for any pair of neighboring, incrementally different heights in a sorites series for ‘tall’: when the speaker is actively considering the pair, so that the similarity between the two heights is salient, the cost of discriminating between them outweighs the benefits:

[S]uppose my primary purpose is to choose a cherry tree for the yard. A discrimination between two cherry trees that are very similar in height will be very costly given my interest in efficiency. But the discrimination will be costlier still when I am actively considering the two trees as live options for my purpose. (Fara 2008: 328)

Owing to the high cost, the two heights in question will be treated as “the same for present purposes”, and if one of the trees is tall, so is the other. In effect, the application of ‘tall’ is governed by an interest-relative form of tolerance. (Presumably the speaker’s interest must invariably be in cost whenever he considers saliently similar values; in particular, the latter interest cannot be superseded by a different one, like, say, an interest in the location of the sharp boundary.)

Some contextualizers, like Burns (1991), make use of the idea that a predicate’s sharp boundaries never lie where one is looking, to defend a purely pragmatic analysis of the sorites paradox that leaves classical semantics and logic intact; others see consequences for logic and semantics and advocate a non-classical approach. Shapiro’s (2006) book develops a dynamical contextualist theory employing a distinctive variant of supervaluationist logic and semantics to provide a type (2) solution to the paradox. Soames (1999) appeals to context-sensitivity to defend a three-valued logic of vague predicates, postulating boundaries between the determinate exemplars, the determinate non-exemplars, and the borderline cases. Coupled with Kleene’s strong, three-valued semantics, this non-classical contextualism denies the truth of the universally quantified major premise of the paradox while nonetheless also denying its falsity. (Tappenden [1993] suggests a similar three-valued approach that appeals to context to explain the apparent truth of the universally quantified premise, but his use of the notion of context here differs subtly from that of Kamp and Soames.) The conditional sorites also admits of solution. Accepting the standard three-valued truth-conditions for the universal quantifier, Soames (1999) takes the conditional sorites to have some non-true conditional premise.

For criticisms and a helpful taxonomy of different varieties of contextualism (with particular attention to the distinction between “extension-shifting” and “boundary-shifting” forms of the view), see Åkerman 2009 and Åkerman & Greenough 2010.

3.3.5 The Multiple Range Theory

The multiple range (“multi–range”) theory is a semantic theory of vagueness that purports to retain classical logic and bivalence.[8] Here, the vagueness of an expression consists in its having multiple equally permissible, arbitrarily different ways of being applied, relative to a given context (Raffman 2014: ch.4). In a sorites series, the vagueness of a term is reflected in its possession of multiple equally permissible, arbitrarily different places to stop applying it. Any adequate theory of vagueness must acknowledge the existence of permissible stopping places in a sorites series, since competent users of a vague term are required to stop applying it before the end. For example, in a sorites series of ages proceeding from a clearly old age of 90 to a clearly middle-aged (hence not old) age of 50, say for Americans in 2018—make the context as fine-grained as you like—speakers can permissibly stop applying ‘old’ at 70, or at 67, or 65, or 63.5, etc.[9] Different speakers will stop at different ages, and the same speaker will stop at different ages on different occasions. Any particular stopping place in the series is arbitrary, hence without legislative force; speakers cannot justifiably charge each other with error when they stop at different places. In contrast, a boundary would be legislative; speakers who failed to stop applying ‘old’ at its boundaries would be making mistakes. The distinction between boundaries and permissible stopping places is a cornerstone of the multi–range approach.

This multiplicity of application is said to be reflected in the predicate’s semantics in the form of multiple ranges of application. A range of application is just an abstract representation, in the semantics, of a permissible way of applying the predicate. More formally: a range is a set of values (e.g., ages) to whose instantiations the predicate can competently be applied. In a series from 90 to 50, one range of application of ‘old’ might contain the ages 90–70, another 90–65, another 90–63.5, and so forth; and the ages (e.g., 90–70) in those various ranges will be instantiated by different people at different worlds.

According to the multi–range view, a sentence applying a vague term to a given value is true relative to each of its ranges that contain that value, and false relative to each of the others. Some ranges of ‘old’, ‘borderline’, and ‘middle–aged’ are pictured in the figure below.

Figure 1: Some ranges of application of ‘old’, ‘middle-aged’, and ‘old[middle-aged] borderline’

Note that each predicate has some ranges that overlap with some ranges of the other two. The figure indicates that for a 63-year-old, the sentence ‘x is old’ is true relative to the 3rd range of ‘old’ and relative to the 4th range and relative to the 5th, and false relative to the 1st and to the 2nd. The sentence ‘x is middle-aged’ is true relative to the 1st range of ‘middle-aged’ and to the 2nd, and false relative to each of the others. The sentence ‘x is borderline old’ is true relative to each range of ‘borderline’ except the 4th, and false relative to the latter.

Raffman warns against two potential confusions. (1) Ranges of application are not precisifications (2014: 102–3). To see why, note that on the multi–range view, the predicate ‘borderline’ has ranges of application like any other vague term; ranges of application of ‘borderline’ contain borderline values. In contrast, by their nature, precisifications contain no borderline values. Second, a range of (e.g.) ‘old’ contains only old ages, whereas a precisification of ‘old’ contains old ages and not-old (e.g., middle-aged) ages. Therefore a range contains only a permissible stopping place, whereas a precisification contains a sharp boundary. Consequently, third, whereas a range specifies a way in which competent speakers can actually apply the term, a speaker who applied ‘old’ according to a precisification would be (mis)applying it as if it had sharp boundaries. Fourth, the multi–range view contains no analogue of super-truth; ordinary truth is truth relative to a single range. (2) Ranges of application are not (aspects of) contexts. Among other things, whereas speakers typically are (or can be) aware of the context they are relativizing to, and can choose a given context for a certain reason, they do not (cannot) choose the ranges to which they will relativize their applications of a vague term. Rather, speakers simply choose how they will classify a given value, and that classification is relativized—automatically, as it were, in virtue of the semantics of the term—to each of its ranges that contains the value in question. Relativization to ranges is not something speakers do. (In this connection it is worth noting that whereas contextualist treatments of the sorites are typically coupled with a distinct type of semantics for vague terms, e.g., an epistemicist or supervaluationist or three-valued semantics, the multi-range solution employs a proprietary multi-range semantics.)

On the multi–range view, the sorites is said to dissolve because, on pain of equivocation on ranges, every line in the paradox must have its truth-value relative to the same ranges of application of ‘old’. And since each range contains a last age—a permissible stopping place—the major premise of the paradox is false relative to each range of the predicate for any context.

The multi-range theorist hypothesizes that the major premise of the paradox seems true because we confuse it with two pragmatic rules for the use of vague words (2014: 172–5):

  • (I) For any vague term ‘\(\Phi\)’: If \(\alpha_{n}\) and \(\alpha_{n+1}\) are only incrementally different on a decisive dimension, then any differential application of the predicate as between them, i.e., any application of ‘\(\Phi\)’ to one but not to the other, must be arbitrary. (That is: arbitrary as opposed to impermissible).
  • (II) For any vague term ‘\(\Phi\)’: If \(\alpha_{n}\) and \(\alpha_{n+1}\) are only incrementally different on a decisive dimension, then if \(\Phi\alpha_{n}\) then \(\Phi\alpha_{n+1}\), insofar as \(\alpha_{n}\) and \(\alpha_{n+1}\) are considered pairwise.[10]

Of its aspects discussed here, the multi–range approach has been criticized most prominently for its commitment to an extreme relativism about truth. Opponents object that it is one thing to relativize truth to possible worlds, and to such contextual factors as speakers, times, spatial locations, comparison classes, speaker interests and purposes, stakes, and standards of assessment; and quite another to relativize truth to factors that vary even after all of those contextual parameters have been fixed. The extremely fine-grained relativity proposed by the multi–range theorist seems to stretch the notion of truth to the breaking point. Also, questions arise about the (higher order) vagueness of the predicate ‘range of application’ itself; and it’s not clear that speakers ever follow a rule like (I) above. See Åkerman 2014, Égré 2015, Sainsbury 2015, Scharp 2015, and Caie 2015 for these and other criticisms; and Raffman 2015 for some replies.

While there isn’t space to review them here, we should note that theorists of vagueness have done a variety of revealing empirical studies investigating ordinary speakers’ use of vague terms. Just for example, see Égré 2009, Ripley 2011, Alxatib & Pelletier 2010, Serchuk et al. 2011, Huang 2012, 2013, Égré et al. 2013.

3.4 Embracing the Paradox

Several philosophers have endorsed a type (4) response, drawing the radical conclusion that the paradox is unsolvable; we are just stuck with it. The question then is what the paradox shows. Dummett (1975), for example, maintains that vague observational predicates whose application is supposed to be governed by a nontransitive indiscriminability relation are incoherent. Such a view appears fatal to the familiar notion of a determinate shade of color (see, e.g., Jackson 1975; Wright 1975; Peacocke 1992; Graff 2001; Mills 2002; Hellie 2005; Chuard 2007 for discussion).

A different type (4) response holds that, contrary to appearances, conditional sorites paradoxes are sound. For example, it is true, after all, that no number of grains of wheat make a heap. However, such a view immediately runs into trouble because the paradoxes come in pairs. As observed above, there are negative and positive versions of the puzzle depending on whether the soritical predicate is negated. To accept all sorites arguments as sound requires assent to the additional claim that, since one grain of wheat makes a heap, any number does. A radical incoherence follows since there is a commitment to all and any number both making a heap and not making a heap. Similarly, everyone is bald and no one is; everyone is rich and no one is, and so on.

The problem is that the soundness of any positive conditional sorites undercuts the truth of the unconditional premise of the corresponding negative version, and vice versa. Unless one is prepared to accept a pandemic of contradictions in natural language, not all sorites can be sound. Unger (1979) and Wheeler (1979) propose a more restricted embrace. Dissatisfied with responses of types (1) and (3), one accepts the applicability and validity of classical norms of reasoning. Nonetheless, dissatisfaction with responses of type (2) considered so far—rejecting some conditional premise—leaves open the option of either rejecting the minor (unconditional) premise or accepting it and, with it, the soundness of the paradox. What is advocated is the soundness of those sorites which deny heapness, baldness, hirsuteness, richness, poverty, etc. of everything—a type (4) response—and the corresponding falsity of the unconditional premise of all respective positive variants of the argument—a type (2) response. Terms like ‘heap’, ‘bald’, ‘hirsute’, ‘rich’ and ‘poor’ apply to nothing. (For criticisms, see Williamson 1994a: Ch. 6.)

4. Unification with the Liar Paradox

The sorites paradox has traditionally been seen as unrelated in any substantially interesting way to the semantic and set-theoretic paradoxes of self-reference. However, McGee (1991) and Tappenden (1993) proposed a unified treatment of the liar and sorites paradoxes based on similarities between vague predicates and the truth predicate. More recently, Field (2003: 262) speaks of

some temptation to connect up the [semantic paradoxes and the paradoxes of vagueness] by viewing the semantic paradoxes as due to something akin to vagueness or indeterminacy in semantic concepts like ‘true’.

Field 2008 further develops this theme, though it is devoted primarily to a resolution of the liar, Curry’s and other paradoxes. Field’s approach is by way of a logic that abandons the law of excluded middle.

Some see unification as much more clearly indicated by the supposed fact that the semantic and sorites paradoxes themselves are “of a kind”. Thus Colyvan (2009) points to a number of ways in which paradoxes might be thought to be of a kind per se, concluding that the liar and the sorites are examples and thus deserving of a similar solution. Priest (2010) adds weight to this claim, arguing that both the paradoxes of self-reference and the sorites paradox have a common underlying structure, satisfaction of what Priest calls “the inclosure schema”. On the assumption that this common structure is sufficient to warrant a similar treatment, Priest advocates a paraconsistent response to the sorites having elsewhere defended a paraconsistent response to the paradoxes of self-reference. In fact, as with paradoxical sentences, some vague sentences involving borderline cases will furnish examples of true contradictions, dialethias.

5. Philosophical Lessons

Having considered several major families of responses to the logical and semantic challenges posed by the sorites, it is worth reflecting upon some of the broader philosophical issues that the problem raises. Since the deeply puzzling phenomenon of vagueness manifests itself first and foremost as a linguistic phenomenon, it is unsurprising that the responses variously intersect with problems concerning meaning, truth and reference.

5.1 Meaning as Use

A challenge posed for the epistemic theorist’s response is that on such a view the commonly supposed connection between meaning and use appears to be strained if not severed altogether (see again §3.2). While the margin-for-error principle discussed in Williamson 1994a might serve to explain how we could be ignorant of the postulated sharp boundaries, it might be thought that since our use of vague terms does not draw sharp boundaries, it could not contain them given the generally accepted connection between meaning and use. As Williamson reports this concern others might have, “the epistemic view of vagueness sets truth-conditions floating unacceptably free of our dispositions to assent and dissent” (1994a: 205). It seems that such a view must abandon the idea that our use determines meaning.

One obvious response is that the connection between meaning and use is not as strong as might be supposed. Nature might also sometimes play a role in determining meaning, e.g., in the case of natural kind terms; but for a predicate like, say, ‘thin’, it is unlikely that nature provides what our use does not. Williamson further responds by pointing out that the determination thesis at issue is really a supervenience thesis—meaning supervenes on use—and this thesis can be agreed to by epistemicists. Granted, the epistemicist cannot say exactly how meaning supervenes on use, and so cannot calculate the meaning or truth-conditions of an application of a vague term from facts about use. However, the response continues, this inability is something which all theorists ought to accept. To suppose that the epistemic theory must make good on this count is to place unreasonable expectations on the theory (see Williamson 1996 and Burgess 2001 for further discussion).

The supervenience thesis is also challenged by symmetry considerations. When confronted with a borderline case of ‘thin’, the argument goes, a language user will neither assent to the application of the term nor to the application of its negation. Patterns of dissent are similarly symmetrical with respect to the two claims.[11] And yet despite this symmetry at the level of use it must be broken at the level of truth and falsity where one of the terms or its negation truly applies according to the theory; one or the other claim is true and the other false. If our patterns of use leave the matter equally unsettled either way then how can the truth of the matter be settled without arbitrariness and a severing of the connection between meaning and use? The answer, Williamson suggests, lies in the fact that truth and falsity are not symmetrical notions. Falsity obtains in the absence of truth, so where there is symmetry at the level of use, falsity reigns. Whether this response succeeds is debated in Burgess 2001 and Weatherson 2003.

5.2 Truth and the T-schema

As already noted in connection with supervaluationism, theories that abandon bivalence have been charged with having to reject the required Tarskian constraint on truth encapsulated in his T-schema: ‘p’ is true if and only if p. The rejection of bivalence in the context of the T-schema is said to lead to absurdity (Williamson 1994a: ch. 7; see Wright 1994 for criticism). This charge applies more generally to any non-bivalent theory of vagueness coupled with the T-schema. If validated, the pressure to abandon bivalence in the presence of vagueness would then cast doubt on a deflationary account of truth. Many will find this consequence untoward. Field (2008), for example, is devoted to saving this account of truth from a range of paradoxes and rejects a truth-value gap approach.

Supervaluationists have responded by noting that though the T-schema is not true, a corresponding mutual entailment thesis is not threatened: “‘p’ is true” entails and is entailed by ‘p’. However, the latter claim is strictly weaker than the corresponding claim involving the conditional according to supervaluationism, and one may wonder whether the weaker commitment is sufficient to capture what matters about truth (see Keefe 2000: ch. 8). Others have taken issue with the Williamson argument by pointing out that in the context of nonbivalent approaches to vagueness, negation can be variously defined and that the argument supposes a rejection of bivalence invoking a particularly strong reading of negation. In response Williamson contends that while an appropriately weak account of negation can be offered sufficient to undermine the argument for a general acceptance of bivalence, in the special case of vagueness the phenomenon of higher-order vagueness provides the materials for similarly reducing this weaker rejection to absurdity. (See Williamson 1994a: 193f. and Pelletier & Stainton 2003 for further discussion.)

The claim then is that even if there were a sense in which truth was non-bivalent and nonetheless satisfied the T-schema, thus making available a deflationary account, the particular nature of the problem posed by vagueness precludes such a synthesis. The depth of the problem, as evidenced by the phenomenon of higher-order vagueness, shows that it cannot be accounted for by a rejection of bivalence alone.

5.3 The Inscrutability of Reference

Attempts to solve the sorites paradox also throw issues of reference into sharp relief. Unlike epistemic responses to the sorites which postulate inscrutable boundaries, supervaluationism is frequently associated with a semantic approach to vagueness seemingly committed to the inscrutability of reference.

Consider a sorites paradox using the predicate ‘is on Everest’ using the series of millimetre discriminations along a line from its peak to the valley floor below. The first point (the summit) is clearly on Everest. The last (in the valley) clearly is not. And there is no clear point in between where we would draw the sharp boundary separating the mountain from its surrounds. The vagueness or indeterminacy that underwrites this sorites paradox is, on this approach, not a result of epistemic limitations, nor a result of indeterminacy in Everest itself but, rather, arises as a result of indeterminacy surrounding what to count as the referent of the term. According to the supervaluationist, vagueness is a matter of semantic indecision, as it is frequently put. In the case to hand, there is simply no fact of the matter as to exactly what portion of earth is referred to. There is a range of admissible candidates, all with equal claim to be Everest, amongst which we have simply not decided, nor (to paraphrase Lewis) is anyone stupid enough to try. In such a case, overlapping the problem of the many (see the entry on the problem of the many), the theory commits to a singular term ‘Everest’, though apparently a denoting phrase, lacking any unique determinate referent. This accords with Russell’s much earlier analysis of vagueness as “one-manyness in denotation”.

As Keefe (2000: ch. 7.1) points out, supervaluationism thus understood nonetheless makes true the claim that there is but one (sharply bounded) Mt Everest (thus claiming a solution to the problem of the many, and to the foregoing sorites paradox since it is true that there is a sharp cut-off point to being on Everest) even if there is no one (sharply bounded) mountain of which it is true that it is the thing referred to by ‘Everest’ (and thus no point on the mountain of which we can say that it is truly the cut-off point). There is but one Everest but there is no fact of the matter what it is.

As with earlier problems concerning the role of existential quantification in supervaluationism, one can debate whether this is a consequence to be embraced or an untoward consequence undermining the theory being advanced. It is certainly surprising that reference is inscrutable in this way. Moreover, such cases are not the exception; given the ubiquity of vague singular terms such cases appear to be the rule (see Lewis 1993; McGee & McLaughlin 2000; Morreau 2002).


  • Åkerman, Jonas, 2009, “Contextualist Theories of Vagueness”, Philosophy Compass, 7(7): 470–480. doi:10.1111/j.1747-9991.2012.00495.x
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