Fuzzy Logic

First published Tue Nov 15, 2016; substantive revision Tue Jul 18, 2017

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Petr Cintula, Christian G. Fermüller, and Carles Noguera replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Fuzzy logic is intended to model logical reasoning with vague or imprecise statements like “Petr is young (rich, tall, hungry, etc.)”. It refers to a family of many-valued logics (see entry on many-valued logic) and thus stipulates that the truth value (which, in this case amounts to a degree of truth) of a logically compound proposition, like “Carles is tall and Chris is rich”, is determined by the truth value of its components. In other words, like in classical logic, one imposes truth-functionality.

Fuzzy logic emerged in the context of the theory of fuzzy sets, introduced by Zadeh (1965). A fuzzy set assigns a degree of membership, typically a real number from the interval \([0,1]\), to elements of a universe. Fuzzy logic arises by assigning degrees of truth to propositions. The standard set of truth values (degrees) is \([0,1]\), where \(0\) represents “totally false”, \(1\) represents “totally true”, and the other numbers refer to partial truth, i.e., intermediate degrees of truth.[1]

“Fuzzy logic” is often understood in a very wide sense which includes all kinds of formalisms and techniques referring to the systematic handling of degrees of some kind (see, e.g., Nguyen & Walker 2000). In particular in engineering contexts (fuzzy control, fuzzy classification, soft computing) it is aimed at efficient computational methods tolerant to suboptimality and imprecision (see, e.g., Ross 2010). This entry focuses on fuzzy logic in a narrow sense, established as a discipline of mathematical logic following the seminal monograph by Petr Hájek (1998) and nowadays usually referred to as “mathematical fuzzy logic” (see Cintula, Fermüller, Hájek, & Noguera 2011 and 2015). It focuses on logics based on a truth-functional account of partial truth and studies them in the spirit of classical mathematical logic (syntax, model theoretic semantics, proof systems, completeness, etc.; both, at propositional and the predicate level).

1. Fuzzy connectives based on t-norms

The standard set of truth degrees for fuzzy logics is the real unit interval \([0,1]\) with its natural ordering \(\leq\), ranging from total falsity (represented by \(0\)) to total truth (represented by \(1\)) through a continuum of intermediate truth degrees. The most fundamental assumption of (mainstream) mathematical fuzzy logic is that connectives are to be interpreted truth-functionally over the set of truth-degrees. Such truth-functions are assumed to behave classically on the extremal values \(0\) and \(1\). A very natural behavior of conjunction and disjunction is achieved by imposing \(x \land y = \min\{x,y\}\) and \(x \lor y = \max\{x,y\}\) for each \(x,y \in [0,1]\).

Another, non-idempotent, conjunction \(\&\) is typically added to account for the intuition that applying a partially true hypothesis twice might lead to a different degree of truth than using it only once. Such a conjunction is usually interpreted by a binary operation on \([0,1]\), which is not necessarily idempotent, but still associative, commutative, non-decreasing in both arguments and has \(1\) as neutral element. These operations are called t-norms (triangular norms) and their mathematical properties have been thoroughly studied (e.g., by Klement, Mesiar, & Pap 2000). Prominent examples of t-norms are the already mentioned function \(\min\), the standard product of real numbers, and the Łukasiewicz t-norm: \(x *_{Ł} y=\max\{x+y-1,0\}\). These three t-norms are actually continuous functions and any other continuous t-norm can be described as an ordinal sum of these three basic ones (see, Ling 1965; Mostert & Shields 1957).

Negation is interpreted by a non-increasing function assigning \(0\) to \(1\) and vice versa; usual choices are the Łukasiewicz negation \(\neg_{Ł} x = 1 - x\) and the Gödel negation: \(\neg_\mathrm{G} 0 = 1\) and \(\neg_\mathrm{G} x = 0\) for each \(x > 0\). It is also usual to introduce a constant symbol \(\overline{0}\) for total falsity, hence interpreted as \(0\). Finally, a suitable choice for implication is the residuum of the t-norm \(\ast\), that is, the unique function \(\Rightarrow\) satisfying the so-called residuation condition: \(x \ast y \leq z\), if and only if, \(x \leq y \Rightarrow z\). Such a function exists (and is defined as \(x \Rightarrow y = \max\{z \mid x \ast z \leq y\}\)) if, and only if, the t-norm is left-continuous.

2. MTL: A fundamental fuzzy logic

The weakest logic with connectives interpreted by truth-functions of the type described above is MTL (Monoidal T-norm based Logic, Esteva & Godo 2001). It is a logic with the primitive connectives \(\mathbin{\&}, \to, \wedge,\) and \(\overline{0}\), and derivable connectives defined as: \[ \begin{align} \varphi \lor \psi &= ((\varphi \to \psi) \to \psi) \land ((\psi \to \varphi) \to \varphi),\\ \neg \varphi &= \varphi \to \overline{0}, \\ \varphi \leftrightarrow \psi &= (\varphi \to \psi) \land (\psi \to \varphi), and \\ \overline{1} &= \neg \overline{0}. \end{align} \] MTL is defined as a consequence relation over the semantics given by all left-continuous t-norms. Namely, given a particular left-continuous t-norm \(\ast\), an evaluation \(e_\ast\) is a mapping from propositional variables to \([0,1]\), extended to all formulas by interpreting \(\&\) as \(\ast\), the implication \(\to\) as its residuum \(\Rightarrow\), and \(\land\) and \(\overline{0}\) as \(\min\) and \(0\), respectively.

A formula \(\varphi\) is a consequence of a set of formulas \(\Gamma\) in MTL, denoted \(\Gamma \models_\mathrm{MTL} \varphi\), if for each left-continuous t-norm \(\ast\) and each evaluation \(e_\ast\) such that \(e(\psi) = 1\) for each \(\psi \in \Gamma\) we have \(e(\varphi) = 1\); that is: each evaluation that makes the premises totally true must also make the conclusion totally true. Formulas \(\varphi\) that always evaluate to \(1\) (\(\models_\mathrm{MTL}\varphi\)) are called tautologies of MTL. Note that the formula \((\varphi \mathbin{\&} \psi) \to (\varphi \land \psi)\) is a tautology in MTL, i.e., the conjunction \(\&\) is stronger than \(\land\).

MTL can also be presented by a Hilbert-style proof system with the following axioms:

\[ \begin{align} (\varphi \to \psi) & \to ((\psi \to \chi) \to (\varphi \to \chi)) \\ \varphi \mathbin{\&} \psi & \to \varphi \\ \varphi\mathbin{\&}\psi & \to\psi\mathbin{\&}\varphi \\ \varphi \land \psi & \to \varphi \\ \varphi \land \psi & \to \psi \land \varphi \\ (\chi \to \varphi) & \to ((\chi\to \psi) \to (\chi \to \varphi\wedge \psi)) \\ (\varphi\mathbin{\&}\psi \to \chi) & \to (\varphi\to(\psi \to \chi)) \\ (\varphi\to(\psi \to \chi)) & \to (\varphi\mathbin{\&}\psi \to \chi) \\ ((\varphi \to \psi) \to \chi) & \to (((\psi \to \varphi)\to \chi)\to \chi) \\ \overline{0}& \to\varphi \\ \end{align} \]

and modus ponens as the only inference rule: from \(\varphi\) and \(\varphi \to \psi\), infer \(\psi\). This system is a complete axiomatization of the logic MTL: \(\Gamma \models_\mathrm{MTL} \varphi\) iff \(\Gamma \vdash_\mathrm{MTL} \varphi\), where the latter relation denotes derivability from instances of the above axioms and formulas in \(\Gamma\). The validity problem of \(\mathrm{MTL}\) is known to be decidable, however its computational complexity has not yet been determined.

3. Łukasiewicz logic

Łukasiewicz logic can be defined by adding \[((\varphi \to \psi) \to \psi) \to ((\psi \to \varphi) \to \varphi)\] to the Hilbert-style system for MTL. It corresponds to the finitary version of the consequence relation defined with respect to evaluations based on the Łukasiewicz t-norm (in symbols: for each finite set of formulas \(\Gamma\) and each formula \(\varphi\), we have \(\Gamma \models_{Ł} \varphi\) iff \(\Gamma \vdash_{Ł} \varphi\)).[2]

This logic was an early example of a many-valued logic, introduced by Łukasiewicz & Tarski (1930), well before the inception of the theory of fuzzy sets, by means of an equivalent axiomatic system (with modus ponens as the only inference rule):

\[ \begin{align} \varphi &\to (\psi \to \varphi)\\ (\varphi \to \psi) &\to ((\psi \to \chi) \to (\varphi \to \chi))\\ ((\varphi \to \psi) \to \psi) &\to ((\psi \to \varphi) \to \varphi)\\ (\neg \psi \to \neg \varphi) &\to (\varphi \to \psi)\\ ((\varphi \to \psi) &\to (\psi \to \varphi)) \to (\psi \to \varphi)\\ \end{align} \]

Łukasiewicz logic is the only t-norm based fuzzy logic where all connectives are interpreted by continuous functions, including the implication which, as the residuum of \(_{Ł}\), is given by the function \(x \to_{Ł} y=\min\{1,1-x+y\}\). McNaughton’s theorem (1951) states that real-valued functions over [0,1] that interpret formulas of Łukasiewicz logic are exactly the continuous piecewise linear functions with integer coefficients. In terms of computational complexity, the validity problem for this logic is asymptotically not worse than in classical logic: it remains coNP-complete.

4. Gödel–Dummett logic

Gödel–Dummett logic, also known as Dummett’s LC or simply Gödel logic, is another early example of a many-valued logic with truth values in \([0,1]\). It was introduced by Michael Dummett (1959) as the extension of intuitionistic logic (see entry on intuitionistic logic) by the axiom \[(\varphi \to \psi) \lor (\psi \to \varphi).\] This formula enforces a linear order in the underlying (Kripke-style as well as algebraic) semantics. It also appears in the context of Gödel’s observation that it is impossible to characterize intuitionistic logic by finite truth tables (Gödel 1932). Gödel–Dummett logic can alternatively be obtained as an axiomatic extension of MTL by adding the axiom \(\varphi \to \varphi \mathbin{\&} \varphi\), which amounts to requiring the idempotence of \(\&\), and hence making the interpretation of both conjunctions coincide. In the fuzzy logic setting the Gödel–Dummett logic can be seen as the consequence relation given by the minimum t-norm. It is distinguished as the only t-norm based logic where the truth of a formula in a given evaluation does not depend on the specific values assigned to the propositional variables, but only on the relative order of these values. In this sense, Gödel–Dummett logic can be seen as a logic of comparative truth. Like for Łukasiewicz logic, the computational complexity of testing validity remains coNP-complete.

5. Other notable fuzzy logics

Besides MTL (the logic of all left-continuous t-norms) and Łukasiewicz and Gödel–Dummett logics (each induced by one particular t-norm), one can consider logics induced by other sets of t-norms or, in general, arbitrary axiomatic extensions of MTL. In particular, the logic of all continuous t-norms (Hájek’s Basic Fuzzy Logic) is obtained by adding the axiom \[(\varphi\mathbin{\&}(\varphi\to{{\psi}})) \to (\psi\mathbin{\&}(\psi\to\varphi))\] to those of MTL. Actually, for any set of continuous t-norms there is a finite axiomatization of the corresponding logic (Esteva, Godo, & Montagna 2003; Haniková 2014). In particular the logic of the last prominent continuous t-norm (algebraic product), known as Product logic, is the extension of Hájek’s Basic Fuzzy Logic by the axiom: \[\neg\varphi \vee ((\varphi\to\varphi\mathbin{\&}{{\psi}})\to{{\psi}})\] On the other hand, not all axiomatic extensions of MTL can be given a semantics of t-norms. For example, classical logic can be axiomatized as MTL \(+\) \(\varphi\vee\neg \varphi\), but the axiom of excluded middle is not a tautology under any t-norm based interpretation.

There are also reasons to consider weaker fuzzy logics. For example, it can be argued that the assumptions forcing the interpretation of the conjunction to be a t-norm are too strong. In particular, the assumption that \(1\) is the neutral element of conjunction enforces a definition of tautology as a formula always evaluated to \(1\) and the consequence relation as preservation of the value \(1\) – that is, \(1\) is the only designated value in the semantics.[3] A natural way to introduce logics with more than one designated truth degree is to assume that the neutral element for \(\ast\) is a number \(t <1\). (It can be shown that in this situation the designated truth degrees are exactly those greater than or equal to \(t\).) Such interpretations of conjunctions are called uninorms. The resulting logic was axiomatized by Metcalfe & Montagna (2007).

Analogously one may argue against commutativity or even against associativity of conjunction. Axiomatizations of resulting logics are described in the literature (see Cintula, Horčík, & Noguera 2013; Jenei & Montagna 2003); an exception is the logic of non-commutative uninorms for which a natural axiomatic system is not known.

Finally, taking into account that fuzzy logics, unlike classical logic, are typically not functionally complete, one can increase their expressive power by adding new connectives. The most commonly considered connectives are: truth constants \(\bar r\) for each rational number \(r\in (0,1)\); unary connectives \(\sim\) and \(\triangle\) interpreted as \({\sim}x = 1-x\) and \(\triangle x = 1\) if \(x=1\) and \(0\) otherwise; a binary connective \(\odot\) interpreted as the usual algebraic product, etc. (Baaz 1996; Esteva, Gispert, Godo, & Noguera 2007; Esteva, Godo, & Montagna 2001; Esteva, Godo, Hájek, & Navara 2000).

A thorough overview of all the kinds of propositional fuzzy logics mentioned in this section (and a general theory thereof) can be found in the Handbook of Mathematical Fuzzy Logic (3 volumes, Cintula et al. 2011a,b, 2015).

6. Predicate logics

Given any propositional fuzzy logic L there is a uniform way to introduce its first-order counterpart L\(\forall\) in a predicate language \(\mathcal{P\!L}\) (defined as in the classical case). In this section, for simplicity, we present it for t-norm based logics.

The semantics is given by structures in which predicate symbols are interpreted as functions mapping tuples of domain elements into truth values. More precisely, a structure \({\mathbf M}\) consists of a non-empty domain of elements \(M\), a function \(f_{\mathbf M}\colon M^n\to M\) for each \(n\)-ary function symbol \(f\in \mathcal{P\!L}\), and a function \(P_{\mathbf M}\colon M^n\to [0,1]\) for each \(n\)-ary predicate symbol \(P\in \mathcal{P\!L}\). Fixing an evaluation \({\mathrm v}\) of object variables in \(M\), one defines values of terms (\(\|f(t_1,\dots,t_n)\|_{\mathrm v} = f_{\mathbf M}(\|t_1\|_{\mathrm v},\dots,\|t_n\|_{\mathrm v})\)) and truth values of atomic formulas (\(\|P(t_1,\dots,t_n)\|_{\mathrm v} = P_{\mathbf M}(\|t_1\|_{\mathrm v},\dots,\|t_n\|_{\mathrm v})\)). Truth values of a universally/existentially quantified formula are computed as infimum/supremum of truth values of instances of the formula where the quantified variable runs over all elements of the domain \(M\). Formally: \[ \begin{align} \|(\forall x)\varphi\|_{\mathrm v} & = \inf\{\|\varphi\|_{{\mathrm v}[x{:}a]} \mid a\in M\}\\ \|(\exists x)\varphi\|_{\mathrm v} & = \sup\{\|\varphi\|_{{\mathrm v}[x{:}a]}\mid a\in M\},\\ \end{align} \] where \({\mathrm v}[x{:}a]\) is the evaluation sending \(x\) to \(a\) and keeping values of other variables unchanged. The values of other formulas are computed using the truth functions for the propositional connectives of L.

The first-order logic L\(\forall\) is then defined as the consequence relation given by preservation of total truth (value \(1\)), as in the propositional case. More precisely, we say that a first-order formula \(\varphi\) is a consequence of a set of formulas \(\Gamma\) (in symbols: \(\Gamma \models_{\mathrm{L}\forall} \varphi\)) if \(\|\varphi\|_{\mathrm v} = 1\) for each evaluation v, whenever \(\|\psi\|_{\mathrm v} = 1\) for each evaluation v and each \(\psi \in \Gamma\).

L\(\forall\) can be given a Hilbert-style calculus with the following axioms:

  • (P) The (first-order) instances of the axioms of the propositional logic L
  • \((\forall1)\) \((\forall x)\varphi(x)\to\varphi(t)\), where the term \(t\) is substitutable for \(x\) in
  • \((\exists1)\) \(\varphi(t)\to(\exists x)\varphi(x)\), where the term \(t\) is substitutable for \(x\) in
  • \((\forall2)\) \((\forall x)(\chi\to\varphi)\to(\chi\to (\forall(x)\varphi)\), where \(x\) is not free in \(\chi\)
  • \((\exists2)\) \((\forall x)(\varphi\to\chi)\to((\exists x)\varphi\to\chi)\), where \(x\) is not free in \(\chi\)
  • \((\forall3)\) \((\forall x)(\chi\vee\varphi)\to\chi\vee(\forall x)\varphi\), where \(x\) is not free in \(\chi\).

The deduction rules of L\(\forall\) are those of L plus the rule of generalization: from \(\varphi\) infer \((\forall x)\varphi\).

For many notable propositional fuzzy logics (including MTL and Gödel logic) the above axiomatic system is sound and complete with respect to the semantics (i.e., \(\Gamma \models_{\mathrm{L}\forall} \varphi\) iff \(\Gamma \vdash_{\mathrm{L}\forall} \varphi\) for each \(\Gamma\) and each \(\varphi\); Cintula, Horčík, & Noguera 2014).

However, the first-order Łukasiewicz logic is not recursively axiomatizable as shown by Scarpellini (1962; Ragaz (1981) proved that the set of tautologies is actually \(\Sigma_2\)-complete in the sense of arithmetical hierarchy). Completeness can be achieved either by including an infinitary inference rule (Hay 1963) or by generalizing the set of truth-values (see next section). The situation is even more complicated in the case of Hájek’s Basic Fuzzy Logic, where the set of first-order tautologies of all structures given by continuous t-norms is as complex as true arithmetics (Montagna 2001).

7. Algebraic semantics

One of the main tools in the study of fuzzy logic is that of algebraic semantics (see entry on algebraic semantics). Roughly speaking, the idea is to replace the real unit interval with an arbitrary set and interpret the connectives as operations of corresponding arities on that set.

An MTL-algebra (introduced by Esteva & Godo (2001)) is a tuple \({\mathbf A} = \langle A, \&, \to, \wedge, \vee, \overline{0}, \overline{1} \rangle\) where

  • \(\langle A, \wedge, \vee, \overline{0}, \overline{1} \rangle\) is a bounded lattice
  • \(\langle A, \&, \overline{1} \rangle\) is a commutative monoid
  • \((x\to y)\vee(y\to x) = \overline{1}\)
  • \(x\mathbin{\&} y \leq z\) iff \(x \leq y\to z\) (where \(\leq\) is the lattice order induced by \(\wedge\) or \(\vee\)).

MTL-algebras are a generalization of the t-norm based semantics explained above and provide a sound and complete semantics for MTL.[4]

MTL-chains are those whose lattice order is total and they are the basic building blocks of the whole class of algebras, in the sense that each MTL-algebra can be decomposed as a subdirect product of chains. This implies that the logic is also complete with respect to the semantics of MTL-chains, which is then used as the first step in the proof of its completeness with respect to the t-norm based semantics (Jenei & Montagna 2002).

Algebraic semantics is a universal tool that can be used for any logic. In particular, for any arbitrary fuzzy logic studied in the literature (even those not supporting a t-norm based semantics such as finite-valued fuzzy logics or the logic of non-commutative uninorms) one can find a corresponding class of algebras which can be decomposed as subdirect products of chains. This fact has led Běhounek & Cintula (2006) to propose a definition of fuzzy logics as logics that are complete with respect to totally ordered algebraic structures.

The use of algebraic semantics for first-order logics usually yields lower complexity for testing validity or satisfiability than standard semantics (Montagna & Noguera 2010).

8. Proof theory

It has been a considerable challenge to come up with analytic proof systems for fuzzy logics. These are systems that share important features, like the eliminability of cuts and the subformula property, with Gentzen’s sequent calculi for classical and intuitionistic logic (see entry on the development of proof theory). A major breakthrough has been achieved with the introduction of a so-called hypersequent calculus for Gödel–Dummett logic by Arnon Avron (1991). Hypersequent calculi arise from sequent calculi by considering finite multisets or sequences of sequents, interpreted as disjunctions of sequents, as main object of inference. In the case of Gödel–Dummett logic one lifts the rules of Gentzen’s intuitionistic sequent calculus by simply adding side-hypersequents to the upper and lower sequents. For example, the sequent rule for introducing disjunction on the right hand side \[\frac{\Gamma_1 \Rightarrow \phi \hspace{3ex} \Gamma_2 \Rightarrow \psi}{\Gamma_1,\Gamma_2 \Rightarrow \phi \vee \psi}\] where \(\Gamma_1\) and \(\Gamma_2\) are finite sequences of formulas, is turned into the following hypersequent rule: \[\frac{H \mid \Gamma_1 \Rightarrow \phi \hspace{3ex} H' \mid \Gamma_2 \Rightarrow \psi}{H \mid H' \mid \Gamma_1,\Gamma_2 \Rightarrow \phi \vee \psi }\] where \(H\) and \(H'\) denote the side-hypersequents, i.e., finite sequences or multisets of sequents. This by itself does not change the corresponding logic (intuitionistic logic, in this case). The crucial additional structural rule is the so-called communication rule: \[\frac{H \mid \Gamma_1,\Pi_1 \Rightarrow \Delta_1 \hspace{3ex} H' \mid \Gamma_2,\Pi_2 \Rightarrow \Delta_2}{H \mid H' \mid \Gamma_1,\Gamma_2 \Rightarrow \Delta_1 \mid \Pi_2,\Pi_2 \Rightarrow \Delta_2}\] Here \(\Gamma_1, \Gamma_2,\Pi_1, \Pi_2\) are finite lists of formulas; \(\Delta_1\) and \(\Delta_2\) are either single formulas or remain empty; \(H\) and \(H'\) denote the side-hypersequents, like above.

To obtain a hypersequent calculus for the fundamental fuzzy logic MTL one has to add the communication rule to a sequent system for contraction-free version of intuitionistic logic. Analytic proof systems for other fuzzy logics, in particular Łukasiewicz logic, call for a more radical departure from traditional calculi, where the sequent components of hypersequents are interpreted differently than intuitionistic or classical sequents. Also so-called labeled proof systems and various tableau calculi have been suggested. A detailed presentation of the corresponding state of the art can be found in Metcalfe, Olivetti, & Gabbay 2008 and Metcalfe 2011.

9. Semantics justifying truth functionality

It is desirable, not only from a philosophical point of view, but also to a get a better grip on potential applications of fuzzy logics to relate the meaning of intermediary truth values and corresponding logical connectives to basic models of reasoning with vague and imprecise notions. A number of such semantics that seek to justify particular choices of truth functional connectives have been introduced. Just two of them are briefly described here.

Voting semantics is based on the idea that different agents (voters) may coherently judge the same proposition differently. The proportion of agents that accept a proposition \(\varphi\) as true may be seen as a truth value. Without further restrictions this does not lead to a truth functional semantics, but rather to an assignment of probabilities to propositions. But if one assigns a fixed level of skepticism to each agent and imposes some natural conditions that keep the judgments on logically complex statements consistent with those levels, then one can recover \(\min\), \(\max\), and \(1-x\) as truth functions for conjunction, disjunction and negation, respectively. Details can be found in Lawry 1998.

Another intriguing model of reasoning that provides a justification for all propositional connectives of standard Łukasiewicz logic has been introduced by Giles (1974). It consists in a game, where two players, I and you, systematically reduce logically complex assertions (formulas) to simpler ones according to rules like the following:

  • If I assert \(\varphi \lor \psi\), then I have to assert either \(\varphi\) or \(\psi\).
  • If I assert \(\varphi \land \psi\), then you choose one of the conjuncts and I have to assert either \(\varphi\) or \(\psi\), accordingly.
  • If I assert \(\varphi \to \psi\), then I have to assert \(\psi\) if you assert \(\varphi\).

The rules for quantified statements refer to a fixed domain, assuming that there is a constant symbol for each domain element one stipulates:

  • If I assert \((\forall x) \varphi(x)\), then I have to assert \(\varphi(c)\), for a constant \(c\) chosen by you.
  • If I assert \((\exists x) \varphi(x)\), then I have to assert \(\varphi(c)\), for a constant \(c\) chosen by myself.

The rules for your assertions are dual. At each state of the game an occurrence of a non-atomic formula in either the multiset of current assertions by me or by you is chosen and gets replaced by subformulas, as indicated by these rules, until only atomic assertions remain. A final game state is then evaluated according to the following betting scheme.

For each atomic formula there is a corresponding experiment which may either fail or succeed, but may show dispersion, i.e., it may yield different results when repeated. A fixed failure probability, called risk value, is assigned to each experiment and thus to each atomic formula. The players have to pay \(\$\)1 to the other player for each of their atomic assertion where the associated experiments fails. For any game starting with my assertion of \(\varphi\) my expected overall loss of money if we both play rationally can be shown to correspond inversely to the truth value of \(\varphi\) evaluated in an interpretation of Łukasiewicz logic that assigns the inverse of the risk values as truth values to atomic formulas. In particular, a formula is valid in Łukasiewicz logic if and only if, for every risk value assignment, I have a strategy that guarantees that my expected overall loss at the end of game is \(0\) or negative.

Fermüller & Metcalfe (2009) have pointed out a correspondence between optimal strategies in Giles’s game and cut-free proofs in a hypersequent system for Łukasiewicz logic. The game has also been extended by Fermüller & Roschger (2014) to characterize various types of (semi-)fuzzy quantifiers, intended to model natural language expressions like “about half” or “almost all”.

Paris (2000) provides an overview over other semantics supporting various choices of truth functions; in particular, re-randomizing semantics (Hisdal 1988), similarity semantics (e.g., Ruspini 1991), acceptability semantics (Paris 1997), and approximation semantics (Paris 2000). Let us also mention the resource-based semantics of Běhounek (2009). Moreover there are different forms of evaluation games for various fuzzy logics, besides the one of Giles for Łukasiewicz logic outlined above. An overview over those semantic games can be found in Fermüller 2015.

10. Fuzzy logic and vagueness

Modeling reasoning with vague predicates and propositions is often cited as the main motivation for introducing fuzzy logics. There are many alternative theories of vagueness (see entry on vagueness), but there is a general agreement that the susceptibility to the sorites paradox (see entry on sorites paradox) is a main feature of vagueness. Consider the following version of the paradox:

  • (1)\(10^{100}\) is a huge number.
  • (2)If \(n\) is a huge number, then \(n-1\) is also huge.

At the face of it, it seems not be unreasonable to accept these two assumptions. By instantiating \(n\) with \(10^{100}\) in (2) and applying modus ponens with (1) as the other premise we conclude that \(10^{100}-1\) is huge. By simply repeating this type of inference we arrive at the unreasonable statement

  • (3)\(0\) is a huge number.

Fuzzy logic suggests an analysis of the sorites paradox that respects the intuition that statement (2), while arguably not totally true, is almost true.

There are various ways to model this form of reasoning in t-norm based fuzzy logics that dissolve the paradox. For example, one may declare that any instance of modus ponens is sound if the degree of truth of the conclusion is not lower than that of the strong conjunction of its premises.[5] As indicated, one stipulates that every instance of (2) is true to degree \(1-\epsilon\), for some very small number \(\epsilon\). Even if we declare (1) to be perfectly true, the statement that \(10^{100}-1\) is huge, too, might then be less than perfectly true without sacrificing the soundness of instantiation and modus ponens. If, moreover, the degree of truth of the conjunction of two not perfectly true (or not perfectly false) statements is less than that of each conjunct, we may safely declare that statement (3) is perfectly false and nevertheless insist on the soundness of each step in the indicated chain of inferences. Informally speaking, the paradox disappears by assuming that repeatedly decreasing some perfectly huge number by a small amount leads to numbers of which it is less and less true that they are huge too.

An alternative truth degree based solution to the sorites paradox has been proposed by Hájek & Novák (2003). They introduce a new truth functional connective modeling the expression “it is almost true that”. In this manner they formalize sorites-style reasoning within an axiomatic theory of an appropriate t-norm based fuzzy logic.

Smith (2008; see also 2005) has argued that the so-called closeness principle captures the essence of vagueness. It expresses that statements of the same form about indistinguishable objects should remain close in respect of truth. It is a hallmark of many approaches to the paradox that employ fuzzy logic that they are compatible with this principle.[6]


Supplementary document:

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Christian G. Fermüller <chrisf@logic.at>
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