## Notes to Absolute and Relational Theories of Space and Motion

1. Descartes held that all other properties arise from the configurations and motions of such bodies — from geometric complexes. See Garber 1992 for a comprehensive study.

2. Norton (1995) offers an extensive discussion of the two interpretations possible for Mach's discussion of inertia, arguing that on balance it seems most likely that Mach advocated only a reformulation of Newtonian mechanics — i.e., what we are calling "Mach-lite".

3. Many
authors have differentiated the Galilean relativity principle from
the Special Principle of Relativity, on the grounds that the meaning
of "frame of reference" changes with the introduction of the latter
theory. The Special Principle is thus sometimes equated with the
assertion of the Lorentz covariance of physical laws. But Brown (2005)
convincingly argues that the Special Principle properly speaking
— the principle introduced by Einstein and used in the
*derivation* of the Lorentz transformations — is in fact
exactly the same as Galileo's.

4. Special relativity
applies the Galilean relativity principle to electromagnetic
theory. Since the speed of light is determined by basic equations of
that theory, if the relativity principle is to hold, we can conclude
that the speed of light must be *the same* for observers in any
inertial frame, regardless of the velocity of the light's source.
This is profoundly counter-intuitive, once one explores what it means.
Three of the immediate consequences of the constancy of light's
velocity are the *relativity of simultaneity, length
contraction* (apparent shortening, in the direction of motion, of
rapidly moving objects), and *time dilation* (apparent slowing
down of fast-moving clocks). We can explain an instance of the first
phenomenon here, using an example first crafted by Einstein. Suppose a
fast-moving train is passing a signal light on the ground. Just as the
center of the car you are in passes the lamp, it emits a flash of red
light. Since you know the speed of light is a fixed constant
*c* in inertial frames, and you are in an inertial frame, you
conclude that the flash of light arrives simultaneously at the back
and the front of your train car. The two arrival events, for you, are
simultaneous. But now consider how an observer standing next to the
signal lamp on the ground views events. The light travels at the same
speed *c* toward the back of the train and toward the
front. But the train is moving, fast, forward. So the light will reach
the rear of your car first, and then the forward-going light rays,
having to catch up to the rapidly advancing front, will arrive some
time later. That is: for the observer on the ground, the two events
(light arrives at back of car; light arrives at front) are definitely
*not simultaneous*. And if the Special Principle of relativity
is to be taken seriously, we must admit that neither observer's
perspective is “correct”; judgment that two events in
different locations are “simultaneous” is simply
*relative* – relative to state of motion, or reference
frame. (The other two surprising effects just mentioned can be deduced
from similarly simple thought-experiments, but we will not do so
here.) For a complete introduction to special relativity, the reader
may wish to look at one of the following reliable web-based
tutorials:

- Special Relativity (Andrew Hamilton)
- Relativity Tutorial (Ned Wright)
- Usenet Relativity FAQ

5. This is perhaps an unfair description of the later theories of Lorentz, which were exceedingly clever and in which most of the famous "effects" of STR (e.g., length contraction and time dilation) were predicted. See Brown 2005 for a sympathetic philosophical exposition of such precursors to STR.

6. “Something like” must be understood in a fairly loose sense; GTR by itself cannot model the chemical reactions that drive a rocket, for example, nor the solid material body of the rocket itself. What seems clear from studies of both existence theorems and numerical methods is that a large number of as-yet unexplored solutions exist that display “absolute accelerations” (especially rotations) of a kind that Mach's Principle was intended to rule out. See Living Reviews in Relativity for review articles covering these issues.

7. The claim that length
contraction and time dilation are, in a sense, not real effects at
all, is not meant to deny the reality of phenomena such as the
*net* time dilation of the Twin Paradox, or indeed to deny the
reality of *the results of applying certain measurement protocols
to bodies in motion, vs. applying them to the same bodies at
rest*. What this view maintains is that there is an important
sense in which the “moving” body does not really contract. Indeed,
there is a corresponding, important sense in which the moving body is
not *really* “moving”. That’s the point of the relativity of
inertial motion: there is no fact of the matter about whether a
particular non-accelerating object is “really” moving or not; from the
perspective of one set of frames it is not, and from the perspective
of other frames it is (with a velocity that is, in turn, obviously
frame-relative.) The difference in time ticked off on the clocks of
the twins in the Twin Paradox is intrinsic and not frame-relative, and
corresponds to the intrinsic length difference between two different
paths in spacetime that begin and end at the same points. That clocks
in relative (and inertial) motion run slow with respect to each other
is, by contrast, a merely perspectival, frame-dependent
phenomenon.