Notes to Absolute and Relational Space and Motion: Post-Newtonian Theories

1. A reference frame can be loosely thought of as a way of coordinatizing space and time – that is, assigning spatial coordinates to every point of space, and a time coordinate to every distinct moment of time – which is done starting from some reference body. For example, we might start from the Northeast corner of the Eiffel tower at a certain moment, designate it as the location (0,0,0,0), and then choose three orthogonal axes (e.g., two perpendicular lines fixed to and emerging horizontally from the corner of the Eiffel tower, and a vertical line for the 3rd axis) and a unit of distance (e.g., the kilometer) to assign spatial coordinates to other places in relation to the tower, and assign our chosen moment the time coordinate t = 0, assigning times to earlier or later moments by some time unit (e.g., hours). The reader is invited to ignore the curvature of the Earth’s surface and its rotation, and pretend that Paris is a large asteroid floating in space far from any other body, and that the spatial axes just mentioned are really Euclidean straight lines, so that the coordinate frame just introduced is like the Cartesian coordinates used in high school geometry and algebra. Then the coordinate frame we just specified would be an inertial frame, meaning that if any body (e.g., a rocket ship floating by with its engines turned off) is not subject to any external forces, then according to Newton’s 1st law it will move uniformly (constant speed and direction) and in a straight line in this coordinate frame. If we had taken the rocket as our reference body instead of the Eiffel tower we would have generated a distinct frame, also inertial, one moving at some constant velocity v relative to the other one. By contrast, if we had fixed our coordinates in a similar fashion but to a rotating body, the coordinate frame that resulted would be non-inertial, and a body not subject to external forces would not move in a straight line, nor with constant coordinate speed, in that frame. (For more extensive and rigorous discussion of these concepts, see the entries on space and time: inertial frames and Newton’s views on space, time, and motion).

2. Norton (1995) offers an extensive discussion of the two interpretations possible for Mach’s discussion of inertia, arguing that on balance it seems most likely that Mach advocated only a reformulation of Newtonian mechanics — i.e., what we are calling “Mach-lite”.

3. Many authors have differentiated the Galilean relativity principle from the Special Principle of Relativity, on the grounds that the meaning of “frame of reference” changes with the introduction of the latter theory. The Special Principle is thus sometimes equated with the assertion of the Lorentz covariance of physical laws. But Brown (2005) convincingly argues that the Special Principle properly speaking — the principle introduced by Einstein and used in the derivation of the Lorentz transformations — is in fact exactly the same as Galileo’s.

4. Special relativity applies the Galilean relativity principle to electromagnetic theory. Since the speed of light is determined by basic equations of that theory, if the relativity principle is to hold, we can conclude that the speed of light must be the same for observers in any inertial frame, regardless of the velocity of the light’s source. This is profoundly counter-intuitive, once one explores what it means. Three of the immediate consequences of the constancy of light’s velocity are the relativity of simultaneity, length contraction (apparent shortening, in the direction of motion, of rapidly moving objects), and time dilation (apparent slowing down of fast-moving clocks). We can explain an instance of the first phenomenon here, using an example first crafted by Einstein. Suppose a fast-moving train is passing a signal light on the ground. Just as the center of the car you are in passes the lamp, it emits a flash of red light. Since you know the speed of light is a fixed constant c in inertial frames, and you are in an inertial frame, you conclude that the flash of light arrives simultaneously at the back and the front of your train car. The two arrival events, for you, are simultaneous. But now consider how an observer standing next to the signal lamp on the ground views events. The light travels at the same speed c toward the back of the train and toward the front. But the train is moving, fast, forward. So the light will reach the rear of your car first, and then the forward-going light rays, having to catch up to the rapidly advancing front, will arrive some time later. That is: for the observer on the ground, the two events (light arrives at back of car; light arrives at front) are definitely not simultaneous. And if the Special Principle of relativity is to be taken seriously, we must admit that neither observer’s perspective is “correct”; judgment that two events in different locations are “simultaneous” is simply relative – relative to state of motion, or reference frame. (The other two surprising effects just mentioned can be deduced from similarly simple thought-experiments, but we will not do so here.) For a complete introduction to special relativity, the reader may wish to look at one of the following reliable web-based resources:

5. The example just mentioned, involving the spatiotemporal interval relation between a bit of the water and itself a second later, may be seen as depending on the time dilation effect in STR (or as illustrating it), but that is not essential to the overall phenomenon Maudlin is pointing out in his (1993) paper. The essential point is that once we have enough inter-particle interval distance relations — and if we have a solid chunk of matter existing over a finite time interval, automatically we have enough such relations — the embedding of all the relations into Minkowski spacetime is unique up to rigid translations, rotations and velocity boosts. The latter are things which a relationist considers to be unreal, mere artifacts of choosing a coordinate system, so in effect knowing the material relations tells you everything there is to know about the motions of bodies. By contrast, as Newton’s bucket and globes arguments showed, the classical spatial distance relations (plus absolute time intervals if you like — those were shared between absolutists and relationists) did not suffice to determine whether a body is in (absolute) rotation or not, yet this distinction is clearly physically and dynamically important.

6. This is perhaps an unfair description of the later theories of Lorentz, which were exceedingly clever and in which most of the famous “effects” of STR (e.g., length contraction and time dilation) were predicted. See Brown 2005 for a sympathetic philosophical exposition of such precursors to STR.

7. “Something like” must be understood in a fairly loose sense; GTR by itself cannot model the chemical reactions that drive a rocket, for example, nor the solid material body of the rocket itself. What seems clear from studies of both existence theorems and numerical methods is that a large number of as-yet unexplored solutions exist that display “absolute accelerations” (especially rotations) of a kind that Mach’s Principle was intended to rule out. See Living Reviews in Relativity for review articles covering these issues.

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Nick Huggett <>
Carl Hoefer <>
James Read <>

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