First published Thu Jul 4, 2002; substantive revision Tue Aug 29, 2017

The nature of species is controversial in biology and philosophy. Biologists disagree on the definition of the term ‘species,’ and philosophers disagree over the ontological status of species. Yet a proper understanding of species is important for a number of reasons. Species are the fundamental taxonomic units of biological classification. Environmental laws are framed in terms of species. Even our conception of human nature is affected by our understanding of species. In this entry, three issues concerning species are discussed. The first is the ontological status of species. The second is whether biologists should be species pluralists or species monists. The third is whether the theoretical term ‘species’ refers to a real category in nature.

1. Overview

What are biological species? At first glance, this seems like an easy question to answer. Homo sapiens is a species, and so is Canis familiaris. Many species can be easily distinguished. When we turn to the technical literature on species, the nature of species becomes much less clear. Biologists offer over twenty definitions of the term ‘species’ (Hey 2001). These definitions are not fringe accounts of species but prominent definitions in the biological literature. Philosophers also disagree on the nature of species. Here the concern is the ontological status of species. Some philosophers believe that species are natural kinds. Others maintain that species are particulars or individuals.

The concept of species plays an important role both in and outside of biology. Within biology, species are the fundamental units of biological classification. Species are also units of evolution—groups of organisms that evolve in a unified way. Outside of biology, the concept of species plays a role in debates over environmental law and ecological preservation. Our conception of species even affects our understanding of human nature. From a biological perspective, humans are the species Homo sapiens.

This entry discusses three issues concerning species. The first issue is their ontological status. Are species natural kinds, individuals, or sets? The second issue concerns species pluralism. Monists argue that biologists should attempt to find the correct definition of ‘species.’ Pluralists disagree. They argue that there is no single correct definition of ‘species’ but a plurality of equally correct definitions. The third issue concerns the reality of species. Does the term ‘species’ refer to a real category in nature? Or, as some philosophers and biologists argue, is the term ‘species’ a theoretically empty designation?

2. The Ontological Status of Species

2.1 The Death of Essentialism

Since Aristotle, species have been paradigmatic examples of natural kinds with essences. An essentialist approach to species makes sense in a pre Darwinian context. God created species and an eternal essence for each species. After God’s initial creation, each species is a static, non evolving group of organisms. Darwinism offers a different view of species. Species are the result of speciation. No qualitative feature—morphological, genetic, or behavioral—is considered essential for membership in a species. Despite this change in biological thinking, many philosophers still believe that species are natural kinds with essences. Let us start with a brief introduction to kind essentialism and then turn to the biological reasons why species fail to have essences.

Kind essentialism has a number of tenets. One tenet is that all and only the members of a kind have a common essence. A second tenet is that the essence of a kind is responsible for the traits typically associated with the members of that kind. For example, gold’s atomic structure is responsible for gold’s disposition to melt at certain temperatures. Third, knowing a kind’s essence helps us explain and predict those properties typically associated with a kind. The application of any of these tenets to species is problematic. But to see the failure of essentialism we need only consider the first tenet.

Biologists have had a hard time finding biological traits that occur in all and only the members of a species. Even such pre Darwinian essentialists as Linnaeus could not locate the essences of species (Ereshefsky 2001). Evolutionary theory explains why. A number of forces conspire against the universality and uniqueness of a trait in a species (Hull 1965). Suppose a genetically based trait were found in all the members of a species. The forces of mutation, recombination and random drift can cause the disappearance of that trait in a future member of the species. All it takes is the disappearance of a trait in one member of a species to show that it is not essential. The universality of a biological trait in a species is fragile.

Suppose, nevertheless, that a trait occurs in all the members of a species. That trait is the essence of a species only if it is unique to that species. Yet organisms in different species often have common characteristics. Again, biological forces work against the uniqueness of a trait within a single species. Organisms in related species inherit similar genes and developmental programs from their common ancestors. These common stores of developmental resources cause a number of similarities in the organisms of different species. Another source of similar traits in different species is parallel evolution. Species frequently live in similar habitats with comparable selection pressures. Those selection pressures cause the prominence of similar traits in more than one species. The parallel evolution of opposable thumbs in primates and pandas is an example.

The existence of various evolutionary forces does not rule out the possibility of a trait occurring in all and only the members of a species. But consider the conditions such a trait must satisfy. A species’ essential trait must occur in all the members of a species for the entire life of that species. Moreover, if that trait is to be unique to that species, it cannot occur in any other species for the entire existence of life on this planet. The temporal parameters that species essentialism must satisfy are quite broad. The occurrence of a biological trait in all and only the members of a species is an empirical possibility. But given current biological theory, that possibility is unlikely.

Other arguments have been mustered against species essentialism. Hull (1965) contends that species have vague boundaries and that such vagueness is incompatible with the existence of species specific essences. According to Hull, essentialist definitions of natural kinds require strict boundaries between those kinds. But the boundaries between species are vague. In all but a few cases, speciation is a long and gradual process such that there is no principled way to draw a precise boundary between one species and the next. As a result, species cannot be given essentialist definitions. (Hull’s argument against species essentialism is very similar to one of Locke’s (1690[1975], III, vi) arguments against kind essentialism.)

Sober (1980) raises a different objection to species essentialism. He illustrates how essentialist explanations have been replaced by evolutionary ones. Essentialists explain variation within a species as the result of interference in the ontogenetic development of particular members of that species. Organisms have species specific essences, but interference often prevents the manifestations of those essences. Contemporary geneticists offer a different explanation of variation within a species. They cite the gene frequencies of a species as well as the evolutionary forces that affect those frequencies. No species specific essences are posited. Contemporary biology can explain variation within a species without positing a species’ essence. So according to Sober, species essentialism has become theoretically superfluous.

In a pre Darwinian age, species essentialism made sense. Such essentialism, however, is out of step with contemporary evolutionary theory. Evolutionary theory provides its own methods for explaining variation within a species. It tells us that the boundaries between species are vague. And it tells us that a number of forces conspire against the existence of a trait in all and only the members of a species. From a biological perspective, species essentialism is no longer a plausible position. Nevertheless, as we shall see in Section 2.6, some philosophers have recently tried to revive species essentialism.

2.2 Species as Individuals

Let us turn to the prevailing view of the ontological status of species. Ghiselin (1974) and Hull (1978) suggest that instead of viewing species as natural kinds we should think of them as individuals. Hull draws the ontological distinction this way. (Instead of the phrase ‘natural kind,’ Hull uses the term ‘class.’) Classes are groups of entities that can function in scientific laws. One requirement of such laws is that they are true at any time and at any place in the universe. If ‘All copper conducts electricity’ is a law, then that law is true here and now, as well as 100,000 years ago on some distant planet. Copper is a class because samples of copper are spatiotemporally unrestricted —copper can occur anywhere in the universe. Individuals, unlike classes, consist of parts that are spatiotemporally restricted. Think of a paradigmatic individual, a single mammalian organism. The parts of that organism cannot be scattered around the universe at different times if they are parts of a living, functioning organism. Various biological processes, such as digestion and respiration, require that those parts be causally and spatiotemporally connected. The parts of such an organism can only exist in a particular space-time region. In brief, individuals consist of parts that are spatiotemporally restricted. Classes consist of members that are spatiotemporally unrestricted.

Given the class/individual distinction, Ghiselin and Hull argue that species are individuals, not classes. Their argument assumes that the term ‘species’ is a theoretical term in evolutionary theory, so their argument focuses on the role of ‘species’ in that theory. Here is Hull’s version of the argument, which can be dubbed the ‘evolutionary unit argument.’ Since Darwin, species have been considered units of evolution. When Hull asserts that species are units of evolution, he does not simply mean that the gene frequencies of a species change from one generation to the next. He has a more significant form of evolution in mind, namely a trait going from being rare to being prominent in a species. A number of processes can cause a trait to become prominent in a species. Hull highlights selection. Selection causes a trait to become prominent in a species only if that trait is passed down from one generation to the next. If a trait is not heritable, the frequency of that trait will not increase cumulatively. Hereditary relations, genetic or otherwise, require the generations of a species to be causally and hence spatiotemporally connected. So, if species are to evolve in non trivial ways by natural selection, they must be spatiotemporally continuous entities. Given that species are units of evolution, species are individuals and not classes. (For recent responses to the Evolutionary Unit Argument see Dupré 2001, Reydon 2003, Crane 2004, and Crawford 2008.)

The conclusion that species are individuals has a number of interesting implications. For one, the relationship between an organism and its species is not a member/class relation but a part/whole relation. An organism belongs to a particular species only if it is appropriately causally connected to the other organisms in that species. The organisms of a species must be parts of a single evolving lineage. If belonging to a species turns on an organism’s insertion in a lineage, then qualitative similarity can be misleading. Two organisms may be very similar morphologically, genetically, and behaviorally, but unless they belong to the same spatiotemporally continuous lineage they cannot belong to the same species. Think of an analogy. Being part of my immediate family turns on my wife, my children and I having certain biological relations to one another, not our having similar features. It does not matter that my son’s best friend looks just like him. That friend is not part of our family. Similarly, organisms belong to a particular species because they are appropriately causally connected, not because they look similar (if they indeed do).

Another implication of the species are individuals thesis concerns our conception of human nature (Hull 1978). As we have seen, species are first and foremost genealogical lineages. An organism belongs to a species because it is part of a lineage not because it has a particular qualitative feature. Humans may be a number of things. One of them is being the species Homo sapiens. From an evolutionary perspective, there is no biological essence to being a human. There is no essential feature that all and only humans must have to be part of Homo sapiens. Humans are not essentially rational beings or social animals or ethical agents. An organism can be born without any of these features and still be a human. From a biological perspective, being part of the lineage Homo sapiens is both necessary and sufficient for being a human. (For further implications of the individuality thesis, see Hull 1978 and Buller 2005.)

2.3 Species as Sets

Some philosophers think that Hull and Ghiselin too quickly dismiss the assumption that species are natural kinds. Kitcher (1984) believes that species are sets of organisms. Thinking of species as sets is an ontologically neutral stance. It allows that some species are spatiotemporally restricted sets of organisms, that is, individuals. And it allows that other species are spatiotemporally unrestricted sets of organisms.

Why does Kitcher believe that some species are individuals and other species are spatiotemporally unrestricted sets? Following the biologist Ernst Mayr, Kitcher suggests that there are two fundamental types of explanation in biology: those that cite proximate causes and those that cite ultimate causes. Proximate explanations cite the more immediate cause of a trait, for example, the genes or developmental pathways that cause the occurrence of a trait in an organism. Ultimate explanations cite the evolutionary cause of a trait in a species, for example, the selection forces that caused the evolution of thumbs in pandas and their ancestors.

For each type of explanation, Kitcher believes that there are corresponding definitions of the term ‘species’ (what biologists call ‘species concepts’). Proximate explanations cite species concepts based on structural similarities, such as genetic, chromosomal and developmental similarities. These species concepts assume that species are spatiotemporally unrestricted sets of organisms. Ultimate explanations cite species concepts that assign species evolutionary roles. These species concepts assume that species are lineages and thus individuals.

Kitcher is correct that biologists attempt to explain the traits of organisms in two ways: sometimes they cite the ultimate, or evolutionary, cause of a trait; other times they cite a structural feature of an organism with that trait. A problem with Kitcher’s approach is his characterization of biological practice. Biologists since Darwin have taken species to be evolutionary units. A glance at a biology text book will reveal that the evolutionary approach to species is the going concern in biology. The groups that correspond to Kitcher’s structural concepts are not considered species by taxonomists. Groups of organisms that have genetic, developmental, behavioral and ecological similarities, are natural kinds in biology, but they are not considered species. Consider such groups of organisms as males, females, tree nesters and diploid organisms. These groups of organisms cut across species. For instance, some but not all humans are males and many organisms in other species are males. Male is a kind in biology, but it is not a species. Kitcher’s motivation for asserting that species are sets is to allow spatiotemporally unrestricted groups of organisms to form species. That motivation, however, is not substantiated by biological theory or practice.

2.4 Species as Homeostatic Property Cluster Kinds

Another response to the species are individuals thesis is offered by proponents of an alternative approach to natural kinds. According to Boyd (1999a, 1999b), Griffiths (1999), Wilson (1999), Millikan (1999), and Wilson et al. (2007), species are natural kinds on a proper conception of natural kinds. These authors adopt Boyd’s Homeostatic Property Cluster (HPC) theory of natural kinds. HPC theory assumes that natural kinds are groups of entities that share stable similarities. HPC theory does not require that species are defined by traditional essential properties. The members of Canis familiaris, for example, tend to share a number of common properties (having four legs, two eyes, and so on), but given the forces of evolution, no biological property is essential for membership in that species. For HPC theory, the similarities among the members of a kind must be stable enough to allow better than chance prediction about various properties of a kind. Given that we know that Sparky is a dog, we can predict with greater than chance probability that Sparky will have four legs.

HPC kinds are more than groups of entities that share stable clusters of similarities. HPC kinds also contain “homeostatic causal mechanisms” that are responsible for the similarities found among the members of a kind. The members of a biological species interbreed, share common developmental programs, and are exposed to common selection regimes. These “homeostatic mechanisms” cause the members of a species to have similar features. Dogs, for instance, tend to have four legs and two eyes because they share genetic material and are exposed to common environmental pressures. An HPC kind consists of entities that share similarities induced by that kind’s homeostatic mechanisms. According to Boyd, species are HPC kinds and thus natural kinds because “species are defined … by … shared properties and by the mechanisms (including both ”external“ mechanisms and genetic transmission) which sustain their homeostasis” (1999b, 81).

HPC theory provides a more promising account of species as natural kinds than essentialism. HPC kinds need not have a common essential property, so the criticisms of species essentialism are avoided. Furthermore, HPC theory allows that external relations play a significant role in inducing similarity among the members of a kind. Traditional essentialism assumes that the essence of a kind is an internal or intrinsic property of a kind’s members, such as the atomic structure of gold or the DNA of tigers. HPC theory is more inclusive because it recognizes that both the internal properties of organisms and the external relations of organisms are important causes of species-wide similarities. For instance, HPC theory but not essentialism cites interbreeding as a fundamental cause of similarity among the organisms of many species.

While HPC theory is better at capturing the features of species than essentialism, does HPC theory provide an adequate account of species as natural kinds? Here are two potential problems with HPC theory. HPC theory’s objective is to explain the existence of stable similarities within groups of entities. However, species are also characterized by persistent differences. Polymorphism (stable variation within a species) is an important feature of nearly every species. Species polymorphisms are easy to find. Consider sexual dimorphism: within any mammalian species there are pronounced differences between males and females. Or consider polymorphism in the life cycles of organisms. The lives of organisms consist of dramatically different life stages, such as the difference between the caterpillar and butterfly stages of a single organism. HPC theorists recognize the existence of polymorphism, but they do not recognize polymorphism as a central feature of species in need of explanation. HPC theorists privilege and attempt to explain similarities. In addition to Boyd’s ‘homeostatic’ mechanisms we need to recognize ‘heterostatic’ mechanisms that maintain species variation. (For further discussion of polymorphism in species see Ereshefsky and Matthen 2005 and Magnus 2008.)

A second concern with HPC theory involves the identity conditions of species. The members of a species vary in their traits. Moreover, they vary in their homeostatic mechanisms. Over time and across geographic regions, the members of a single species are often exposed to different homeostatic mechanisms. Given such variation, what causes organisms with different traits and exposed to different homeostatic mechanisms to be members of the same species? The common answer is genealogy: the members of a species form a continuous genealogical entity on the tree of life. A species’ homeostatic mechanisms are mechanisms of one species because they affect organisms that form a unique lineage. Boyd and promoters of HPC theory recognize the importance of genealogy and see historical relations as one type of homeostatic mechanism. However, Boyd does not see genealogy as the defining aspect of species, and this goes against a fundamental assumption of biological systematics: species are first and foremost continuous genealogical entities. Boyd is quite clear that similarity and not genealogical connectedness is the final arbitrator of species sameness (1999b, 80). This assumption makes sense given that Boyd believes that species are kinds and kinds are ultimately similarity-based classes that play a role in induction. But this view of the identity conditions of species conflicts with the standard view in biological systematics that species are continuous genealogical lineages (Ereshefsky 2007).

2.5 Species and Population Structure Theory

Another approach to species, which is in line with the view that species are individuals, is offered by Ereshefsky and Matthen’s (2005) “Population Structure Theory” (PST). PST treats similarity as just one type of trait distribution in species. PST does not privilege similarity over polymorphism, so PST offers a more inclusive account of trait distributions in species than HPC theory. In addition, PST highlights a common type of explanation in biology, namely one that cites the population and inter-population structures of species. Such population structure explanations explain trait distributions in species, whether those distributions involve similarity or dissimilarity.

Population structure explanations are pervasive in biology. Consider a population structure explanation of sexual dimorphism within a species. Male elk have a number of similarities, including having large, fuzzy antlers. What explains this similarity? One cause, the proximal cause, is the individual development of each male elk. Another explanation, the distal cause, turns on relationships between male and female elks. Male antlers are the result of sexual selection. Such selection requires the participation of both male and female elk. Looked at in this way, we see that the existence of similarities within lower level groups (here within the genders) depends on higher level groups (here species) and the diversity within them. That is, polymorphism at the higher level, and the population structure that binds polymorphism, is essential in explaining lower level similarities within the genders and other sub-groups of a species.

Population structure explanations are common, and arguably essential, for understanding diversity and similarity within species. Such explanations are also essential for understanding the identity conditions of species. As we have seen, species are first and foremost genealogical entities. Genealogy is an inter-population structure: species are lineages of populations. So according to biological systematics, species identity is defined in terms of population and inter-populational structures, not organismic similarity. PST theory properly captures the identity conditions of species.

2.6 The New Biological Essentialism

Griffiths (1999), Okasha (2002), and LaPorte (2004) have suggested a form of species essentialism which can be called ‘relational essentialism’. According to relational essentialism, certain relations among organisms, or between organisms and the environment, are necessary and sufficient for membership in a species. Such relations, argue Griffiths, Okasha, and LaPorte, are species essences. For example, they suggest that being descendent from a particular ancestor is necessary and sufficient for being a member of a species.

Devitt (2008) rejects relational essentialism. He argues that relational essentialism fails to answer two crucial questions. The taxon question: Why is organism O a member of species S? The trait question: Why do members of species S typically have trait T? Devitt suggests that to answer these questions species need intrinsic essences; and because relational essentialism only posits relational essences, relational essentialism fails to answer these questions. Devitt’s target is not merely to discredit relational essentialism, but also to argue for a new form of intrinsic biological essentialism. According to Devitt (2008), a species’ essence is the cluster of intrinsic properties and perhaps the relations that cause the typical traits of a taxon’s members. Let us consider Devitt’s critique of relational essentialism. In doing so, we will learn about both relational essentialism and Devitt’s intrinsic biological essentialism.

Recall the trait question: Why do zebras have stripes? Devitt (2008, 352ff.) argues that explanations that merely cite relations are insufficient to explain the traits typically found among zebras. We must cite intrinsic properties as well, and such properties are essential intrinsic properties of zebras. Devitt is right that we need to cite more than relations to explain why zebras have stripes. Generally, to explain the occurrence of a homologue, such as stripes in zebras, we need to cite both relations among organisms and intrinsic factors within organisms. More precisely, embryonic zebras have developmental mechanisms that cause zebras to have stripes. These mechanisms are intrinsic features of embryonic zebras. But those developmental mechanisms must be passed down from parent to offspring, via genealogical relations. So a robust explanation of why zebras have stripes cites both the relations and intrinsic properties that cause stripes.

Given the observation that we should cite both genealogy and developmental mechanisms to understand why zebras have stripes, should we infer, as Devitt does, that the taxon Zebra has an intrinsic essence? Some argue ‘no’ (Ereshefsky 2010a). Biologists explain the characters of organisms by citing other characters, without the added metaphysical claim that a character cited in an explanans is essential for membership in a taxon. Consider how a biologist explains the occurrence of stripes in a zebra. In its embryonic state, a zebra has an ontogenetic mechanism that causes it to develop stripes. That developmental mechanism is neither necessary nor sufficient for membership in Zebra. Some zebras lack that mechanism. Moreover, the developmental mechanism that causes stripes in zebras causes stripes in a variety of mammals, including cats. Generally, the intrinsic properties that cause organismic traits do not coincide with taxonomic boundaries: they cross-cut such boundaries. The belief that such intrinsic properties are essential for taxon membership is not part of biological theory.

Let’s turn to the taxon question: Why are certain organisms members of species S? Relational essentialists argue that modern species concepts posit relational properties, such as interbreeding, genealogy, and occupying a specific niche, as the defining features of species. Relational essentialists tell us that biologists do not posit intrinsic properties as the defining features of species. Devitt responds (2008) that citing the relations among the organisms of a species does not explain why particular organisms are members of a certain species. According to Devitt, saying that organism O can interbreed with other Homo sapiens leaves unanswered why those other organisms are Homo sapiens. There’s an unanswered regress: why are any of them Homo sapiens? According to Devitt, to answer that question we must cite essential intrinsic properties in organisms.

Has Devitt made the case for intrinsic essentialism? Perhaps not. Once again, Why are certain organisms members of species S? According to our best biological theory, if S is an interbreeding species, then those organisms have intrinsic reproductive mechanisms that allow them to interbreed with one another. However, we do not know which intrinsic mechanisms are mechanisms that cause an organism to be a member of a particular species. We need some way of determining which mechanisms cause an organism to be a member of one species versus a member of another species. Here we must turn to relations: particular population and genealogical relations among organisms. The answer to why particular reproductive mechanisms are mechanisms of species S is that those mechanisms occur in organisms whose populations are genealogically connected in a single lineage. Relations are explanatorily prior in explaining taxon identity, not intrinsic properties.

To reinforce this point, consider which aspects of an organism can be changed while it remains a member of the same species, and which aspects cannot be changed. The intrinsic reproductive mechanisms within the organisms of a species can be changed, but being part of the same lineage or gene pool cannot be changed. To make this more concrete consider the case of ring species. A ring species consists of a geographic ring of populations such that organisms in contiguous populations can successfully mate, but organisms in populations at distant links in the ring cannot successfully mate. Interestingly, the organisms in distant populations of a ring species have different reproductive mechanisms (Mayr 1963, 512ff.). Suppose Joe is a member of a ring species. Joe could have had a different intrinsic reproductive mechanism than the one he has. Imagine counterfactually that he is a member of a different population of his ring species, namely one with different reproductive mechanisms than those found in his actual population. In this counterfactual situation Joe is still a member of his species so long as we do not remove him from the lineage and gene pool of that ring species. Generally, an organism in a species can have a different reproductive mechanism and still be a part of that species. But an organism cannot be removed from its original lineage and put in another lineage and remain part of the original species. When it comes to species membership, intrinsic mechanisms within the organisms of a species can vary, but certain relations among its organisms cannot vary (Ereshefsky 2010a). (For other critiques of Devitt’s intrinsic essentialism see Barker 2010 and Lewens 2012.)

Do the results of this section thus far imply that relational essentialism is correct? Consider two traditional requirements of essentialism highlighted by Okasha (2002). The membership requirement: the essence of a kind provides the necessary and sufficient conditions for membership in that kind. The explanatory requirement: citing a kind’s essence is central in explaining the properties typically associated with the members of that kind. Given these two requirements Okasha offers the following argument. Because certain relations are necessary and sufficient for membership in a species, such relations satisfy the membership requirement of essentialism. However, those relations do not satisfy the explanatory requirement. According to Okasha, relations such as genealogy and interbreeding fail to explain the traits typically found among the members of a species. Instead, we must cite the “genotype and its developmental environment” (2002, 204) to explain such traits. Despite failing to meet the explanatory requirement, Okasha thinks that certain relations are taxon essences. Okasha writes that there is no a priori reason to retain the explanatory requirement of essentialism and suggests that it should be dropped. With the explanatory requirement out of the way and the membership requirement satisfied, Okasha concludes that species have relational essences.

The problem with Okasha’s relational essentialism is that if the relations that serve as the identity conditions for a species are not central in explaining the typical traits among a species’ members, then such relations are not essences. Okasha too quickly jettisons a core feature of essentialism: that the essence of a kind plays a central role in explaining the typical features of a kind’s members. Essentialists, from Aristotle to Locke, from Kripke to Devitt, believe that essences figure centrally in explaining the traits typically found among the members of a kind. If we give up that explanatory component of essentialism we give up a core feature of essentialism, a feature that distinguishes real essences from nominal essences. Nominal essences demarcate membership in a kind, but they do not explain the typical traits of a kind. Arguably, any approach to natural kinds that aims to capture the kinds of science should preserve this explanatory feature of kinds. So in the end, relational essentialism is not essentialism because it fails to satisfy a core aim of essentialism. (For a detailed response to Okasha’s relational essentialism see Pedroso 2014.)

3. Species Pluralism

Biologists offer various definitions of the term ‘species’ (Claridge, Dawah, and Wilson 1997). Biologists call these different definitions ‘species concepts.’ The Biological Species Concept defines a species as a group of organisms that can successfully interbreed and produce fertile offspring. The Phylogenetic Species Concept (which itself has multiple versions) defines a species as a group of organisms bound by a unique ancestry. The Ecological Species Concept defines a species as a group of organisms that share a distinct ecological niche. These species concepts are just three among over a dozen prominent species concepts in the biological literature.

What are we to make of this variety of species concepts? Monists believe that an aim of biological taxonomy is to identify the single correct species concept. Perhaps that concept is among the species concepts currently proposed and we need to determine which concept is the right one. Or perhaps we have not yet found the correct species concept and we need to wait for further progress in biology. Pluralists take a different stand. They do not believe that there is a single correct species concept. Biology, they argue, contains a number of legitimate species concepts. Pluralists believe that the monist’s goal of a single correct species concept should be abandoned.

3.1 Varieties of Pluralism

Species pluralism comes in various forms (for example, Kitcher 1984, Mishler and Brandon 1987, Dupré 1993, and Ereshefsky 2001). Kitcher and Dupré offer forms of species pluralism that recognize the species concepts mentioned above—biological species, phylogenetic species, and ecological species—as well as other species concepts. As we saw in Section 1.2, Kitcher accepts species concepts that require species to be individuals, and he accepts species concepts based on the structural similarities of organisms. The latter type of species are not spatiotemporally continuous entities. Such species merely need to contain organisms that share theoretically significant properties. Dupré’s version of species pluralism is more robust. He recognizes all of the species concepts found in Kitcher’s version of pluralism. Dupré’s pluralism also allows species concepts based on similarities highlighted by non biologists. For example, Dupré accepts species concepts based on gastronomically significant properties.

If one thinks that the term ‘species’ is a theoretical term found within evolutionary biology, then one might find Dupré’s version of pluralism too promiscuous. If the question is how the term ‘species’ is defined in biology, then how it is defined outside of biology does not count. Think of a parallel situation in physics. When we are interested in the scientific meaning of the term ‘work’ we do not attend to its meaning in the sentence ‘How was work today?’ Similarly, the use of the word ‘species’ by culinary experts does not reveal the theoretical meaning of ‘species.’

Kitcher’s pluralism is more circumspect: it limits species concepts to those that are legitimized by theoretical biology. Still, one might worry that Kitcher’s form of pluralism is too liberal. Kitcher’s pluralism allows that some species are spatiotemporally continuous entities (individuals), while other species may be spatiotemporally unrestricted entities (natural kinds). As we saw in Section 2.1, Hull’s evolutionary unit argument states that within the purview of evolutionary biology, species must be individuals. Kitcher’s pluralism does not satisfy this requirement. If one assumes that ‘species’ is a theoretical term in evolutionary theory and that species are individuals, then Kitcher’s pluralism is too inclusive.

Another version of species pluralism is found in Ereshefsky (2001). This version of pluralism adopts Hull’s conclusion that species must be spatiotemporally continuous lineages. Nevertheless, this version of pluralism asserts that there are different types of lineages called ‘species.’ The Biological Species Concept and related concepts highlight those lineages bound by the process of interbreeding. The Phylogenetic Species Concepts highlight those lineages of organisms that share a common and unique ancestry. Ecological approaches to species highlight lineages of organisms that are exposed to common sets of stabilizing selection. On this form of species pluralism, the tree of life is segmented by different processes into different types of species lineages.

It is worth noting that the motivation behind Dupré’s, Kitcher’s and Ereshefsky’s versions of pluralism is ontological not epistemological. Some authors (for example, Rosenberg 1994) suggest that we adopt pluralism because of our epistemological limitations. The world is exceedingly complex and we have limited cognitive abilities, so we should accept a plurality of simplified and inaccurate classifications of the world. The species pluralism offered by Dupré, Kitcher, and Ereshefsky is not epistemologically driven. Evolutionary theory, a well substantiated theory, tells us that the organic world is multifaceted. According to Dupré, Kitcher, and Ereshefsky, species pluralism is a result of a fecundity of biological forces rather than a paucity of scientific information.

3.2 Responses to Pluralism

Not everyone is willing to accept species pluralism. Monists (for example, Sober 1984, Ghiselin 1987, Hull 1987, de Queiroz 1999, Mayden 2002, Brigandt 2003, Pigliucci 2003, Wilkins 2003, and Richards 2010) have launched a number of objections to species pluralism. One objection centers on the type of lineage that should be accepted as species. Some monists allow the existence of different types of base lineages but contend that only one type of lineage should be called ‘species’ (Ghiselin 1987). For instance, supporters of the Biological Species Concept believe that lineages of interbreeding sexual organisms are much more important in the evolution of life on this planet (Eldredge 1985, Lee 2003, Coyne and Orr 2004). They argue that only the Biological Species Concept, or some interbreeding concept, should be accepted.

However, adopting only an interbreeding approach to species has its costs: it would exclude all asexual organisms from forming species. Interbreeding requires the genetic contributions of two sexual organisms. Asexual organisms reproduce by themselves, either through cloning, vegetative means or self fertilization. Some reptiles and amphibians reproduce asexually. Many insects reproduce asexually. And asexuality is rampant in plants, fungi and bacteria. In fact, asexual reproduction is the prominent form of reproduction on Earth (Hull 1988, Templeton 1989). If one adopts an interbreeding approach to species, then most organisms do not form species. This seems a high price to pay for species monism.

Another objection to species pluralism is that pluralism is an overly liberal position (Sober 1984, Ghiselin 1987, and Hull 1987). Pluralists allow a number of legitimate species concepts, but how do pluralists determine which concepts should be accepted as legitimate? Should any species concept proposed by a biologist be accepted? What about those concepts proposed by non biologists? Without criteria for determining the legitimacy of a proposed species concept, species pluralism boils down to a position of anything goes.

Species pluralists respond to this objection by suggesting criteria for judging the legitimacy of a proposed species concept. (Dupré 1993, Ereshefsky 2001). Such criteria can be used to determine which species concepts should be accepted into the plurality of legitimate species concepts. Candidate criteria are the epistemic virtues that scientists typically use for determining the scientific worthiness of a theory. For example, in judging a species concept, one might ask if the theoretical assumptions of a concept are empirically testable. The Biological Species Concept relies on the assumption that interbreeding causes the existence of stable lineages. It also assumes that organisms that cannot interbreed do not form stable lineages. Whether interbreeding and only interbreeding causes the existence of stable lineages is empirically testable. So the Biological Species Concept has the virtue of empirical sensitivity. Other criteria for judging species concepts include intertheoretic coherence and internal consistency. Pluralists can provide criteria for discerning which concepts should be accepted as legitimate. Thus the ‘anything goes’ objection can be answered.

A recent response to species pluralism is de Queiroz’s (1999, 2005, 2007) General Lineage Concept. De Queiroz suggests that despite differences among various species concepts, all such concepts agree on one thing: species are “separately evolving metapopulation lineages” (2005, 1263). De Queiroz writes that his conception of species is the “single, more general, concept of species” that reconciles all other species concepts (2007, 880). What is the relationship between the General Lineage Concept and those concepts? De Queiroz suggests that the General Lineage Concept provides the necessary criterion for being a species. The properties that other species concepts disagree over, for example, a lineage’s occupying a unique niche, being monophyletic, or being reproductively isolated, are contingent properties of species. They are “secondary” properties of species (de Queiroz 2005, 1264). All species taxa must be metapopulation lineages, but they can vary in their secondary properties. De Queiroz contrasts the necessary property of species from their secondary properties in another way. Whereas the necessary property cited by the General Species Concept captures the fundamental nature of species, the secondary properties of species are merely “operational criteria” (2007, 882) for “inferring the boundaries and numbers of species” (2005, 264). According to de Queiroz, disagreements among other species concepts merely concern operational and evidential issues. Proponents of other species concepts are confusing “methodological” disagreements with “conceptual” ones (de Queiroz 2005, 1267).

One potential problem with de Queiroz’s attempt to unify the species category is that proponents of other species concepts would disagree with de Queiroz’s assertion that their disagreements are merely over evidence for the numbers and boundaries of species. Proponents of the interbreeding, ecological and phylogenetic approaches believe that they are identifying different types of lineages (interbreeding lineages, ecological lineages, phylogenetic lineages), not merely disagreeing over evidence for the same type of lineage. For example, when supporters of the interbreeding approach say that asexual organisms do not form species they are making a conceptual or ontological claim, not an operational claim. De Queiroz’s unified approach seems to mischaracterize disagreements among proponents of other species concepts.

Another problem is how the General Lineage Concept distinguishes species from higher taxa. According to de Queiroz, species are single lineages whereas higher taxa are clades of multiple lineages. What, then, distinguishes a single lineage from a branch with multiple lineages according to the General Lineage Concept? De Queiroz (2005, 1265) writes that the General Lineage Concept does not need to cite the secondary properties mentioned in other species concepts to answer this. However, de Queiroz offers no alternative criteria for determining when a single lineage becomes a branch of multiple lineages. Moreover, the secondary properties of other species concepts are commonly used to make that determination. Therein lies a problem with the General Lineage Concept’s attempt to unify the species category. According to the General Lineage Concept, species are lineages. But to determine what is a lineage we must turn to other species concepts, and in doing so the heterogeneity of the species category rears its head again. De Queiroz attempts to unify the species category by asserting that all and only lineages are species. But that just masks the heterogeneity of the species category because what constitutes a lineage has multiple answers, and those answers vary according to which species concept one adopts.

3.3 Microbiology and Pluralism

Much of the debate over species pluralism focuses on multicellular organisms. In other words, the debate focuses on how to sort mammals, birds, fish, plants, and other multicellular organisms into species. However, most of life is not multicellular. Most organisms in the world are single cell microbial organisms (Rossello-Mora and Amann 2001). Just as biologists sort multicellular organisms into species, microbiologists sort microbial organisms into species. Advancements in genetic technology in the last twenty yeas have caused an increase in taxonomic work in microbiology, including ways to think about microbial species. Microbial biologists have their own species concepts—definitions of ‘species’ that apply to only microbial organisms. Microbial species concepts vary, and as we shall see, cross-classify microbial organisms into different species. Once again we come to the question of species pluralism.

Consider some of the species concepts developed by microbiologists. One microbial species concept, the Recombination Species Concept, asserts that species are groups of microbes whose genomes can recombine (Dykuizen and Green 1991). The motivation behind this species concept is that though microbes generally do not reproduce sexually, they form gene pools of organisms connected by recombination. Another microbial species concept is Cohan’s (2001, 467) ecological concept in which a “species in the bacterial world may be understood as an evolutionary lineage bound by ecotype-periodic selection.” According to Nesbo et al. (2006) and others, these two microbial species concepts sometimes sort the same organisms into different species. A third microbial species concept, the Phylo-Phenetic Species Concept (Rossello-Mora and Amann 2001), is different than the first two. While the Recombination and Ecological Concepts are based on biological theory about the nature of microbial species, the Phylo-Phenetic Species Concept is designed to obtain stable classifications of species that can be used in medical and microbial research.

Yet another approach to microbial species uses genetic data to determine phylogenetic relations and assigns organisms to species according to those relations. Microbiologists use various types of genetic data for recognizing microbial species, such as 16S rRNA genes, DNA:DNA hybridization, ANI or average nucleotide identity, and core or house-keeping genes. Using such genetic data to classify microbes into species is complicated by the existence of lateral gene transfer. Lateral gene transfer occurs when microbes share genetic material with microbes near them. Lateral gene transfer is not the transfer of genetic material due to reproduction, but a different way microbes share genes. Lateral gene transfer is frequent in microbes. (See O’Malley 2014 for an explanation of lateral gene transfer.) Given the frequent occurrence of lateral gene transfer among microbes, different parts of a microbe’s genome will have different evolutionary histories. Microbiologists use different genes when classifying microbes into species. As a result, they obtain different classifications of species.

Stepping back from these details, we see that depending on the microbial species concept or the type of genetic data used, microbiologists will obtain different species classifications for a particular set of organisms. One might wonder if this situation gives us reason to be species pluralists when it comes to microbiology. Is one microbial species concept, or one type of genetic data, better than all the rest and we should adopt monism? Or is there no best way to sort microbes into species but a variety of equally adequate ways? If the latter is correct then we should be pluralists concerning microbial species. For further discussion of microbiology and species pluralism, see O’Malley and Dupré 2007, Franklin 2007, Morgan and Pitts 2008, Doolittle and Bapteste 2007, Doolittle and Zhaxybayeva 2009, Ereshefsky 2010b, and O’Malley 2014.

4. Does the Species Category Exist?

There is one other item concerning species pluralism worth discussing. Suppose one accepts species pluralism. The term ‘species’ then refers to different types of lineages. Some species are groups of interbreeding organisms, other species are groups of organisms that share a common ecological niche, and still other species are phylogenetic units. Given that there are different types of species, one might wonder what feature causes these different types of species to be species?

Perhaps they share a common property that renders them species. If one adopts the thesis that all species are genealogical lineages, then a common feature of species is their being lineages. However, this feature is also shared by other types of taxa in the Linnaean Hierarchy. From an evolutionary perspective, all taxa, whether they be species, genera, or tribes, are genealogical lineages. We need to locate a feature that is not only common in species but also distinguishes species from other types of taxa.

Biological taxonomists often talk in terms of the patterns and processes of evolution. Perhaps there is a process or a pattern that occurs in species but not in other types of taxa. Such a process or pattern would unify the types of lineages we call ‘species.’ Let us start with process. The Biological Species Concept highlights those species bound by the process of interbreeding. The Ecological Species Concept identifies those species unified by stabilizing selection. The species highlighted by Phylogenetic Species Concepts are unified by such historical processes as genetic and developmental homeostasis. A survey of these different species concepts reveals that species are bound by different types of processes. So no single type of process is common to all species. Arguably, none of these processes are unique to species either (Mishler and Donoghue 1982).

What about pattern? Do species display a pattern that distinguishes them from other types of taxa? If by pattern we mean ontological structure, then species have different patterns. Species are individuals, but they are different types of individuals. Species of asexual organisms and species of sexual organisms have different structures. Both types of species contain organisms that are genealogically connected to a common ancestor. But the organisms in a sexual species are also connected by interbreeding. Thus species of sexual organisms form causally integrated entities: within a given generation, their members exchange genetic material through sexual reproduction. Species of asexual organisms do not form causally integrated entities: their organisms are merely connected to a common ancestor.

There are other suggestions for the common and unique pattern of species. Many observe that the organisms of a species often look the same or that the organisms of a species share a cluster of reoccurring properties. To the extent that this is true, it is also true of genera and some other higher taxa. The members of some genera tend to look the same and have a cluster of stable properties. Another suggestion for the pattern that distinguishes species is their ability to evolve as a unit—species are the units of evolution, other types of taxa are not. But again, many higher taxa have such unity as well (Mishler and Donoghue 1982).

The above survey of candidate unifying features is far from exhaustive. But the result is clear enough. Species vary in their unifying processes and ontological structure. Furthermore, many features that biologists and philosophers highlight as unique to species occur in many higher taxa as well. Given this survey, what position should we adopt concerning the nature of species? There are several options. According to one option we should keep looking for the unifying feature of species. This is the option favored by some monists (Sober 1984). Contemporary biology may not have discovered the unifying feature of species, but that does not mean that biology will not find such a feature in the future. To give up the search for the unifying nature of species would be too hasty.

Another option starts with the assumption that the search for the unifying feature of species has gone on long enough. Biologists have looked long and hard for the correct definition of ‘species.’ The result of that search is not that we do not know what species are. The result is that the organic world contains different types of species. The conclusion drawn by some pluralists (Kitcher 1984, Dupré 1993) is that the term ‘species’ should be given a disjunctive definition. Species are either interbreeding lineages, or ecological lineages, or phylogenetic units, or ….

A third option, like the previous one, assumes that biologists have looked long enough for the unifying feature of species. In that search, biology has learned that there are different types of lineages called ‘species.’ But proponents (Ereshefsky 1998) of this option do not opt for a disjunctive definition of ‘species.’ According to this option, we should doubt the very existence of the category species. Those lineages we call ‘species’ vary in their patterns and processes. Furthermore, the distinction between species and other types of taxa is riddled with vagueness. Consequently, we should doubt whether the term ‘species’ refers to a real category in nature.

To better understand this third option it is useful to see more precisely what is being doubted. Biologists make a distinction between the species category and species taxa. Species taxa are the individual lineages we call ‘species.’ Homo sapiens and Canis familiaris are species taxa. The species category is a more inclusive entity. The species category is the class of all species taxa. The third option does not call into question the existence of Homo sapiens or Canis familiaris or any other lineage that we call ‘species.’ The third option just calls into question the existence of the categorical rank of species. (For a recent defence of the reality of the species category see Currie 2016.)

5. Darwin and Species

What did Darwin mean by the word ‘species’? Answers to that question vary (see Ghiselin 1969, Mayr 1982, Beatty 1992, Stamos 2007, Mallet 2008, Kohn 2008, Wilkins 2009, and Ereshefsky 2010c). Nevertheless, it seems that Darwin was an anti-realist when it comes to the species category, though a realist concerning those taxa called ‘species’ by competent naturalists. Consider what he wrote to his friend, the botanist Joseph Hooker.

It is really laughable to see what different ideas are prominent in various naturalists’ minds, when they speak of ‘species’; in some, resemblance is everything and descent of little weight—in some, resemblance seems to go for nothing, and Creation the reigning idea—in some, sterility an unfailing test, with others it is not worth a farthing. It all comes, I believe, from trying to define the indefinable. (December 24, 1856; in F. Darwin 1887, vol. 2, 88)

For Darwin, the word ‘species’ is indefinable. And he thought it was indefinable because he was skeptical of the distinction between species and varieties. For example, in the Origin of Species, he writes, “I look at the term species as one arbitrarily given for the sake of convenience to a set of individuals closely resembling each other, and that it does not essentially differ from the term variety” (1859 [1964], 52). In other words, ‘species’ is indefinable because there is no difference between species and varieties. But why would Darwin think there is no distinction between species and varieties? Darwin offers three reasons (Ereshefsky 2010c). First, Darwin argues that no process distinguishes varieties from species. Second, he contends that any differences drawn between them lie on a seamless continuum and are drawn for pragmatic reasons. Third, Darwin rejects the distinction between varieties and species because it is built on ideas concerning creation rather than natural selection. In what follows we will just look at why Darwin thought there was no process difference between species and varieties.

Chapter 8 of the Origin of Species titled “Hybridism” is devoted to discussing whether hybrid sterility serves as an adequate criterion for distinguishing species from varieties. Such naturalists as John Ray and Buffon held that hybrid sterility marked the species/variety boundary. They believed that offspring from parents of different species are sterile, whereas offspring from parents of different varieties of the same species are fertile. Much of Darwin’s chapter on hybridism is dedicated to providing counterexamples to the claim that hybrid sterility marks a distinction between species and varieties. In the end, Darwin rejects hybrid sterility as a criterion for distinguishing species and varieties. He writes, “It can thus be shown that neither sterility nor fertility affords a clear distinction between species and varieties” (1859 [1964], 248).

Further evidence that Darwin doubted a process distinction between species and varieties is found in Chapter 4 of the Origin, titled “Natural Selection.” Darwin proposes two principles, which he calls The Principle of Character Divergence and The Principle of Extinction. Together these principles explain the origin of new taxa and morphological gaps among taxa. The Principle of Character Divergence has a familiar Darwinian starting point. Suppose that a geographic region contains several closely related groups of organisms. Within one of those groups, some organisms are selected because they have a trait that gives them an adaptive advantage. Divergent selection occurs in future generations when organisms with even better adapted forms of that trait are selected, eventually causing pronounced morphological gaps between that group of organisms and its parent and sister groups (Darwin 1859 [1964], 112ff.). Darwin illustrates this process with a number of examples. Consider his example of a pigeon fancier (1859 [1964],112). A pigeon fancier is struck by the slightly longer beak of some birds. He then selects birds with slightly longer beaks in that generation, and continues to do so in subsequent generations until there is a pronounced morphological gap between the selected group and the original stock. Darwin argues that the process of divergent selection causes the origin of new taxa and is the source of branching on the tree of life.

The Principle of Extinction further explains the gaps we find in biodiversity. As groups become more distinctive and better adapted to their environment, their parental and sister groups are pushed to extinction. This extinction of “intermediates,” as Darwin calls them, causes the observed gaps among taxa (1859 [1964],121ff.). Extinction, in other words, prunes branches on tree of life so that it has the shape we observe. Together, the Principles of Character Divergence and Extinction explain the origin of varieties and species, and the observed patterns of biodiversity in the world. The relevant point for our discussion of Darwin is that there is no special speciation mechanism that marks the difference between species and varieties. As Kohn (2008) notes, Darwin did not use the word ‘speciation’ in the Origin. For Darwin, the origin of varieties and species is due to divergent selection. As Darwin writes: “The origin of the existence of groups subordinate to groups, is the same with varieties as with species, namely, closeness of descent with various degrees of modification” (1859 [1964], 423).

Thus far it has been suggested that Darwin doubted the existence of the species category because he doubted the distinction between species and varieties. What about those taxa called ‘species’ by competent naturalists, are they real taxa for Darwin? It seems that Darwin was a realist when it comes to taxa. A passage at the start of the Origin’s chapter on classification, Chapter 13, confirms this. Darwin writes that “[f]rom the first dawn of life, all organic beings are found to resemble each other in descending degrees, so that they can be classed in groups under groups. This classification is evidently not arbitrary like the grouping of the stars in constellations” (1859 [1964], 411). Those taxa (“groups”) identified by competent naturalists can be real. And classifications of groups within groups, if properly constructed, reflect the hierarchical arrangement of taxa in the world. Thus, Darwin’s skepticism of the species category did not extend to taxa and those taxa called ‘species.’

6. Summary

This encyclopedia entry started with the observation that at an intuitive level the nature of species seems fairly obvious. But a review of the technical literature reveals that our theoretical understanding of species is far from settled. The debate over the nature of species involves a number of issues. One issue is their ontological status: are species natural kinds or individuals? A second issue concerns pluralism: should we adopt species monism or species pluralism? A third issue, and perhaps the most fundamental issue, is whether the term ‘species’ refers to a real category in nature. Even Darwin, it seems, doubted that ‘species’ refers to a real category in nature.


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