First published Fri Aug 25, 2017

Evolution in its contemporary meaning in biology typically refers to the changes in the proportions of biological types in a population over time (see the entry on the concept of evolution to 1872 for earlier meanings). As evolution is too large of a topic to address thoroughly in one entry, the primary goal of this entry is to serve as a broad overview of contemporary issues in evolution with links to other entries where more in-depth discussion can be found. The entry begins with a brief survey of definitions of evolution, followed by a discussion of the different modes of evolution and related philosophical issues, and ends with a summary of other topics in the philosophy of evolution focusing particularly on topics covered in this encyclopedia.

1. Definitions of Evolution

The definition of evolution given at the outset of this entry is very general; there are more specific ones in the literature, some of which do not fit this general characterization. Here is a sampling.

Although the work of Charles Darwin (see the entry on Darwinism) is usually the starting point for contemporary understandings of evolution, interestingly, he does not use the term in the first edition of On the Origin of Species, referring instead to “descent with modification”. In the early-mid 20th century, the “modern synthesis” gave birth to population genetics, which provided a mathematization of Darwinian evolutionary theory in light of Mendelian genetics (see also the entry on evolutionary genetics). This yielded a prevalent—probably the most prevalent—understanding of evolution as “any change in the frequency of alleles within a population from one generation to the next”. Note, however, that this definition refers to evolution only in a microevolutionary context and thus doesn’t reference the emergence of new species (and their new characteristics), although it is intended to underlie those macroevolutionary changes.

In a popular textbook, Douglas Futuyma gives a more expansive definition:

[biological evolution] is change in the properties of groups of organisms over the course of generations…it embraces everything from slight changes in the proportions of different forms of a gene within a population to the alterations that led from the earliest organism to dinosaurs, bees, oaks, and humans. (2005: 2)

Note also that Futuyma’s definition, unlike the population genetics’ definition, does not limit itself to changes in alleles; John Endler’s definition is similar in this respect:

Evolution may be defined as any net directional change or any cumulative change in the characteristics of organisms or populations over many generations—in other words, descent with modification… It explicitly includes the origin as well as the spread of alleles, variants, trait values, or character states. (Endler 1986: 5)

Yet even this definition is not expansive enough; molecular evolution focuses on the molecular changes within macromolecules such as DNA and RNA.

In a very different vein, Leigh van Valen characterized evolution as “the control of development by ecology” (1973, 488); this anticipates those who emphasize the importance of development in evolution, including proponents of “evo-devo” (see the entry on developmental biology). Today, some have called for an “extended evolutionary synthesis” in light of developmental biology and other recent findings in evolutionary biology.

Although this entry focuses on biological evolution, philosophers and biologists have also sought to extend evolutionary ideas to the cultural realm. Figuring out how and whether to extend the definition of evolution to this realm is part of the study of cultural evolution.

In spite of this diversity of definitions, there has been very little philosophical analysis of the term “evolution” itself. This dearth forms a stark contrast to the voluminous literature in the philosophy of evolution; indeed, for a long time the philosophy of biology was focused almost entirely on evolution. Thankfully, that is no longer the case, with philosophers turning their attentions to issues in genetics, molecular biology, ecology, developmental biology, and more. It may be, as Theodosius Dobzhansky famously said, that “Nothing in biology makes sense except in the light of evolution” (1973: 125), but much of biology is not evolutionary biology. Still, though, philosophy of evolution remains a growing and vibrant area within the philosophy of biology.

2. Modes of Evolution

It is essential to understand that biologists recognize many ways that evolution can occur, evolution by natural selection being just one of them, although it is often held to be the most prevalent one. Evolution can also occur through genetic drift, mutation, or migration. It can also occur through sexual selection, which some consider to be a form of natural selection and others consider to be distinct from natural selection (the latter having been Darwin’s 1859, 1874 view). Evolutionary theory, then, can be taken to be the study (including, but not limited to, mathematical models) of these and other modes of evolution.

To see why it makes sense to think of multiple modes of evolution, consider again one of the definitions of evolution presented above, where evolution is understood as “any change in the frequency of alleles within a population from one generation to the next”. With natural selection, the frequency of alleles that confer greater fitness would tend to increase over those which confer lesser fitness. Sexual selection would be the same, but with fitness understood strictly in terms of mating ability. With genetic drift, a form of evolution that involves chance (see the entry on genetic drift for explanation), there could be an increase in the frequency of alleles that confer greater fitness, an increase in the frequency of alleles that confer lesser fitness, or an increase in the frequency of alleles whose manifestation (if any) was neutral. If organisms migrate from one population to another, it is likely that there will be a change in the frequency of alleles in both populations. And if there is a mutation from one allele to another, then the frequency of alleles in the population will likewise change, albeit by a small amount. Distinguishing these different modes of evolution allows biologists to track the various factors that are relevant to evolutionary changes in a population.

The careful reader may have noted that the previous paragraph invoked probabilistic language: what tends to happen, what could happen, what is likely to happen. Indeed, mathematical evolutionary models today (see the entry on population genetics) are typically statistical models. This fact about evolutionary models has given rise to a debate in the philosophy of evolution over whether natural selection and genetic drift should be be understood as causes of evolution, as most biologists conceive them, or as mere statistical summaries of lower-level causes: births, deaths, etc. (The natural selection and genetic drift entries give more information about this debate). It is for this reason that this entry uses the more neutral phrase “modes of evolution” so as not to beg any questions under dispute between the causalist and the statisticalist.

Although there is widespread agreement that there are multiple modes of evolution, much contemporary work in biology and philosophy of biology has been focused on natural selection. Whether this focus is a good thing or not is in part what the debate over adaptationism is about. That is, do we have reason to think that natural selection is the most prevalent or most important mode of evolution? Should scientific methodologies be geared toward testing natural selection hypotheses or toward a variety of possible evolutionary modes? The focus on natural selection has also led to a large literature on the concept of fitness, given that population genetics’ definitions and other definitions of natural selection typically invoke fitness; a natural selection explanation of why X was more successful than Y might invoke X’s higher fitness. What fitness means, what entities it applies to (genes, organisms, groups, individuals, types), what sort of probabilities it invokes, if any, and how it should be calculated, are all under philosophical dispute. There is also a large literature on conceptually and empirically distinguishing natural selection from genetic drift. Migration, mutation (as a mode of evolution), and sexual selection have received less attention from philosophers of biology.

3. Other Topics in the Philosophy of Evolution

Some of the work in the philosophy of evolution deals with controversial issues. There is, of course, the debate over creationism. The vast majority of philosophers agree that creationism has significantly less evidence in its favor as compared to the abundant evidence in favor of evolution. They also agree that creationism ought not to be taught in a public school science classroom, but they sometimes disagree over the reasons why. For example, is it because it fails some criteria of science? If so, which criteria? Or is it because of the lack of evidence? Or is it because of its religious basis? Debates over sociobiology and evolutionary psychology—areas that seek to explain human behavior and psychology as evolved characteristics—have likewise stirred up controversy over their scientific status. Proponents have also been accused of employing an excessive and uncritical adaptationism and resting on sexist or other problematic biases (on the latter, see the entry on feminist philosophy of biology).

Another nexus of topics in the philosophy of evolution involves heredity and heritability. Although it was not explicitly emphasized in the definitions of evolution given above, evolution is usually taken to be about heritable changes over time, i.e., characteristics that are able to be passed from one generation to the next. But there has been some discussion over which entities can properly be said to be heritable. Genes are uncontroversial, but are seen as too limited by some, who would consider phenomena such as learning and cultural transmission, epigenetic inheritance, and ecological inheritance to be heritable as well. The term “heritability” can likewise cause confusion, as it is a technical term within evolutionary theory, and understanding the term and its implications is not trivial. Classically, heredity has been thought of in terms of the genotype/phenotype distinction, with genotypes being seen as heritable and phenotypes being seen as not heritable. But to accept that distinction seems to accept a distinction between innate and acquired characteristics, and that distinction has been challenged, or at least shown to be more complicated than it would seem at first glance. Heredity also raises questions about biological information—do genotypes pass along information, and if so, in what sense?

Relatedly, for heredity to be a part of evolution, there must be replication of entities, or at least reproduction (with the former being a special case of the latter that involves copying). In order to allow for a more general theory of evolution, many authors will speak of replicators (or reproducers) and vehicles (or interactors) rather than the more limited and specific terms “genes” and “organisms”. With these terms in hand, one can more easily begin to discuss (as many have) questions over units and levels of selection: does selection occur at the level of the gene, the organism, the group, the species, or all of the above? These units of selection (replicators/reproducers or vehicles/interactors) are often taken to be biological individuals (see the entry on the biological notion of individual) as a necessary condition for being units of selection at all.

Interestingly, another major area in which biological individuality has played a large role is in debates over the nature of species. That is, many philosophers of biology maintain that species are properly construed as individuals. Species, often referred to as “units of evolution”—groups of organisms that evolve in a unified way—are nonetheless rarely seen as units of selection. In Elisabeth Lloyd’s terminology (see the entry on units and levels of selection), this is presumably because species are rarely seen as replicators/reproducers or vehicles/interactors but are commonly seen as beneficiaries of evolution by natural selection. In addition to sorting out whether species are individuals and what sort of units of evolution (if any) they might be, there are many-decades’ worth of papers trying to characterize the species concept, whether in terms of interbreeding, phylogeny, morphology, ecology, or some other set of characteristics. Here, as in many other areas of the philosophy of biology, there have also been arguments for a pluralistic approach.

Yet another area of discussion is evolutionary game theory—an application of the mathematical theory of games to biological and other evolutionary contexts. It has provided a source of putative explanations for human and other behaviors; evolutionary psychology, mentioned above, is one area that frequently makes use of a game theory approach. Among the more challenging behaviors that evolutionary game theory has sought to explain is altruism. With altruism, we again encounter questions about the level at which selection is operating (organisms or groups) because of questions about which entities selection is benefiting or harming.


  • Darwin, Charles R., 1859, The Origin of Species by Means of Natural Selection, or the Preservation of Favoured Races in the Struggle for Life, first edition, London: John Murray. [Darwin 1859 available online]
  • –––, 1874, The Descent of Man, and Selection in Relation to Sex, second edition, London: John Murray. [Darwin 1874 available online]
  • Dobzhansky, Theodosius, 1973, “Nothing in Biology Makes Sense Except in the Light of Evolution”, American Biology Teacher, 35(3): 125–129. doi:10.2307/4444260
  • Futuyma, Douglas J., 2005, Evolution, Sunderland, MA: Sinauer Associates.
  • Endler, John, 1986, Natural Selection in the Wild, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Van Valen, Leigh, 1973, “Book Review: Festschrift for George Gaylord Simpson” Science, 180(4085): 488. doi:10.1126/science.180.4085.486


Thanks to Melinda Bonnie Fagan and Jim Tabery for helpful comments.

Copyright © 2017 by
Roberta L. Millstein <rlmillstein@ucdavis.edu>

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