Notes to Speech Acts

1. In his The A Priori Foundations of the Civil Law (1913), the Austrian jurist Adolf Reinach developed what he termed a theory of “social acts” prefiguring many of the themes of later Anglo-American work on speech acts. For an appraisal see Mulligan 1987. See also K. Schuhmann and B. Smith 1991 for a discussion of some elements of speech act theory in the thought of Thomas Reid. Smith 1990 offers a more general historical survey.

2. See Gorman 1999, however, for a detailed account of how literary theory has appropriated a distorted view of speech acts.

3. In what follows I shall use ‘utterance’ to refer to any production by an agent of meaningful words. Uses of Nicaraguan Sign Language, Morse Code, and my repetition of words I overhear from another language but do not understand all count as utterances on this permissive criterion.

4. The term ‘performative’ has been appropriated in fields outside Philosophy. For instance, social scientists sometimes describe utterances as performative on the ground that they “enact the events they describe“ (Callon 2006). ‘Leading economic indicators are positive,’ when spoken by the U.S. Federal Reserve can help to ensure that such indicators are positive. Notwithstanding the interest of the phenomenon, this usage would also treat ‘This sentence is true’ as performative, and likewise for ‘I am whispering,’ when said in whisper. To avoid confusion we will not adopt this inclusive usage. See Callon (2006) and Miller (2007) for further discussions of performativity conforming to this usage.

5. In that same article, Searle notes Austin’s definition of ‘rhetic act’ as an utterance of words with a definite sense and reference. He then points out that Austin’s examples of indirect reports of rhetic acts generally contain illocutionary verbs, such as we find in ‘He told me to get out,’ and ‘He asked whether it was in Oxford or Cambridge.’ Searle concludes that all rhetic acts are therefore illocutionary acts. Unfortunately, this conclusion depends on an over-generalization from the cases Austin considers. Another perfectly adequate report of a rhetic act is simply, ‘She said that she would be more punctual in the future.’ In this case, we have no idea whether the speaker is being described as predicting or promising or just practicing lines from a play. Searle’s conclusion (1968, p. 413) that all rhetic acts are also illocutionary acts is thus unwarranted by his argument on its behalf.

6. The absurdity that these sentences exhibit is often disclosed under the rubric of Moore’s Paradox, for further discussion see Green and Williams 2007.

7. König and Seimund (2007) provide an extensive cross-linguistic study of the interaction of illocutionary force with grammatical mood.

8. See the essays collected in Warnock 1973 for speculation about Austin’s research plans that were tragically cut short by his early death.

9. The characterization is thus analogous to the way in which some non-classical logical theories describe some proposition as being neither True nor False, but as having a third truth value, N: Evidently that is not to say that such propositions are bereft of truth value. It is difficult to discern from such accounts how one sheds light on a speech act in characterizing it as having a null direction of fit, as opposed to having no direction of fit at all. See Humberstone 1992 for a fuller discussion of the notion of direction of fit.

10. In his groundbreaking discussion of implicature, Grice (1989) appears to treat conversational implicata as cases of speaker meaning. This might encourage the view that what is implicated must also be a speech act. It may well be that some implicata area also illocutions. However, many are not. If A asks B, “Where is C,” and B replies, “Downtown somewhere,” B may well be indicating that she is not in a position to be any more specific about C’s whereabouts. However, it is doubtful that she is asserting that she is in no such position. After all, if B did know precisely where in Downtown C is, she would be misleading in responding to A as she did, but she would not be a liar. By contrast, one who asserts something she does not believe to be true has lied. Accordingly, understanding indirect speech acts in terms of implicature does not guarantee that they will turn out to be illocutions after all.

11. Millikan writes, “Natural conventionality is composed of two, quite simple, related characteristics. First, natural conventions consist of patterns that are “reproduced” in a sense to be defined. Second, the fact that these patterns proliferate is due partly to the weight of precedent rather than due, for example, to their intrinsically superior capacity to perform certain functions. That is all.” (1998, p. 162)

12. I take it that the “certain condition” Searle refers to in the passage quoted can be specified without his claim becoming trivial.

13. This terminology is misleading because according to philosophers’ usage, an act can be one of speaker meaning with no sounds uttered or even any inscriptions made. For instance two hunters with no common language might communicate with pantomime, so that when one acts out the path of attack he means, in the sense of speaker meaning, that the other is to approach the mammoth from behind. In spite of the misleading nature of the jargon of speaker meaning I shall retain it rather than introduce new nomenclature.

14. It may be that adults who seem to address pre-linguistic infants are only making as if to speaker-mean things to them, and are instead addressing themselves. It would appear that only in some cases are those adults harboring reflexive-communicative intentions toward themselves. We observe here also that Armstrong 1971 offers an account of speaker meaning in terms of objectives rather than intentions, his reason being that the latter notion is narrower than the former. One who intends a certain result must believe that the thing aimed at is within her power, while one who has that result as an objective need not do so. Presently we shall show an affinity between Armstrong’s position and that offered below. However, just replacing ‘intention’ with ‘objective’ in Grice’s account will not deal with the cases we have considered. It is not part of my objective to produce an effect in my newborn daughter in uttering the last line of Spinoza’s Ethics. Similarly it need be no part of the objective of the framed suspect in maintaining her innocence to produce effects on her interrogators. Instead she may say what she does in order to make public, for anyone who may be concerned with the matter, her avowal of innocence. Her objective is simply to establish a pattern of consistently maintained innocence.

15. Following a suggestion of Schiffer (1972, p. 15), Strawson (1970, p. 7), and Bennett (1976, p. 271), Avramides 1989 proposes in response to these kinds of case that the speaker is addressing himself, intending in particular to produce a certain cognitive effect in himself. While it may be that in the newborn daughter case the speaker is addressing himself, it neither follows, nor does it seem true, that in those cases the speaker is intending to produce any cognitive effect in himself. We sometimes address ourselves in order to produce a cognitive effect: ‘I can do it!’ as I sprint up the steep road, or ‘945–6743, 945–6743’ as I try to internalize a phone number I just got out of the phone book. However, I already believe that all things valuable are difficult as they are rare. In fact it is a belief I have held firmly since encountering it in Spinoza two decades ago, and I actively believe it as I reflect upon the number of diapers I will have changed by the time I am forty. As a result it is quite unclear what cognitive effect I might be trying to produce in myself in saying what I do. His own eyes have already done that for him. Likewise it is far from clear what belief the framed suspect might be trying to produce or strengthen or activate in herself as she maintains her innocence. The suspect knows perfectly well that she has never set foot in the part of town in which the crime was committed, and that she has no idea how to use the garotte with which the victim was killed. (Avramides’ discussion here is confusing because she first responds to a case, due to Harman, of a person maintaining a proposition in full knowledge that no one will believe him, with the words, ’I think that in Harman’s case the speaker is not really speaking to an audience at all’ (p. 64). But then two pages later Avramides writes, ‘The misleading thing about Harman’s case is that there appears to be an audience present. The speaker, however, does not really address his utterance to those present …. If this is true, why not say that in such cases the speaker intends his audience to be himself …’ (p. 66). I shall take Avramides to hold the view that in these cases the speaker does have an audience, namely himself.)

16. Hajdin 1991 argues that attending to illocutionary force and semantic content is insufficient to account for the meaning of even paradigm speech acts such as promising. His reason is that one can know that a promise that agents A and B will not, say hold hands, has been made, without knowing who is responsible for ensuring that that promise is carried out. (It might be A, B or a third party.) However, even if it is true that specifying a “force/content pair” is insufficient to answer this question, it does not follow, and is not true, that such facts about responsibility are aspects either of what is meant or how it is meant.

17. See the essays collected in Parrett and J. Verschueren 1992.

18. Artificial Intelligence research has employed the tools of speech act theory to help automated systems determine the plans of human agents. Prominent examples are the chapters in Cohen, Morgan and Pollack 1990, and Shoham 1993.

19. Adapted from Green 2000. An argument is illocutionarily sound just in case it is both illocutionarily valid and all its premises are such that their conditions of satisfaction are met. A fuller account of illocutionary validity would employ further distinctions. For example, two assertoric commitments may be alike save for differing in strength; these differences are usually described as differences in subjective probability, which could be represented as differences in the strength of commitment. Again, we could distinguish among the different possible objects of commitment, since there is nothing to rule out being committed to a question or to an imperative. These distinctions within the dimension of mode, strength and object of commitment are taken into account in Green 2000. See also Harrah (1980, 1994) for a discussion of assertoric, erotetic, and projective commitment. Observe also that the truth-preservation notion of validity may be seen as a special case of the commitment-preservation notion as follows: Treat each of the sentences in the argument counting as valid in the former sense as being put forth in assertoric mode, and treat each such sentence as declarative. Illocutionary validity is thus not a rival to the truth-preservation notion, but is instead a generalization thereof.

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