Speech Acts

First published Tue Jul 3, 2007; substantive revision Thu Sep 24, 2020

We are attuned in everyday conversation not primarily to the sentences we utter to one another, but to the speech acts that those utterances are used to perform: requests, warnings, invitations, promises, apologies, predictions, and the like. Such acts are staples of communicative life, but only became a topic of sustained investigation, at least in the English-speaking world, in the middle of the twentieth century.[1] Since that time “speech act theory” has become influential not only within philosophy, but also in linguistics, psychology, legal theory, artificial intelligence, literary theory, and feminist thought among other scholarly disciplines.[2] Recognition of the significance of speech acts has illuminated the ability of language to do other things than describe reality. In the process the boundaries among the philosophy of language, the philosophy of action, aesthetics, the philosophy of mind, political philosophy, and ethics have become less sharp. In addition, an appreciation of speech acts has helped lay bare a normative structure implicit in linguistic practice, including even that part of this practice concerned with describing reality. Much recent research aims at an accurate characterization of this normative structure underlying linguistic practice.

1. Introduction

Bertrand Russell’s Theory of Descriptions was a paradigm for many philosophers in the twentieth century. One reason for this is that it suggested a way to respond to longstanding philosophical problems by showing them to be specious. Russell argued that such sentences as ‘The present King of Singapore is bald,’ and, ‘The round square is impossible,’ possess superficial grammatical forms that are misleading as to their underlying logical structure. In so doing he showed how such sentences can be meaningful without this fact obliging us to posit current Singaporean monarchs or round squares. Many philosophers in what came to be known as the Ordinary Language movement were inspired by this achievement to argue that classic philosophical problems (e.g., of free will, the relation of mind to body, truth, the nature of knowledge, and of right and wrong) likewise rested on a misunderstanding of the language in which these problem are couched. In How to Do Things with Words, J.L. Austin for instance writes,

…in recent years, many things which would once have been accepted without question as ‘statements’ by both philosophers and grammarians have been scrutinized with new care… It has come to be commonly held that many utterances which look like statements are either not intended at all, or only intended in part, to record or impart straightforward information about the facts…Along these lines it has by now been shown piecemeal, or at least made to look likely, that many traditional philosophical perplexities have arisen through a mistake-the mistake of taking as straightforward statements of fact utterances which are either (in interesting non-grammatical ways) nonsensical or else intended as something quite different. Whatever we may think of any particular one of these views and suggestions…it cannot be doubted that they are producing a revolution in philosophy. (Austin 1962, pp. 1–2)

The Ordinary Language movement, with its broad claim that the meaning of an expression should be equated with its use, and its desire to transcend traditional philosophical perplexities, did not achieve the revolution of which Austin speaks. Nonetheless one of its enduring legacies is the notion of a speech act.

One way of appreciating the distinctive features of speech acts is in contrast with other well-established phenomena within the philosophy of language and linguistics. Accordingly in this entry we will consider the relations among speech acts and: semantic content, grammatical mood, speaker-meaning, logically perfect languages, perlocutions, performatives, presuppositions, and implicature. This will enable us to situate speech acts within their ecological niche.

2. Content, Force, and How Saying Can Make It So

Whereas an act of speech is any act of uttering[3] meaningful words, ‘speech act’ is a term of art. As a first approximation, speech acts are those acts that can (though need not) be performed by saying that one is doing so. On this conception, resigning, promising, asserting and asking are all speech acts, while convincing, insulting and growing six inches are not. One can, for instance, resign by saying, “I resign…”, although one can also resign from a position without describing oneself as doing so. However, this conception is too inclusive, since it also counts whispering as a speech act even though one can whisper a string of nonsense words without meaning anything. Instead a more accurate characterization of speech acts builds on Grice’s notion of speaker meaning. This notion is discussed further in Section 5 below, but for now it is enough to note that in looking at my watch, I might be trying to tell the time; or I might be trying to indicate to you that it’s time for us to leave. The latter (but not the former) is a case of speaker meaning.

Accordingly, a speech act is a type of act that can be performed by speaker meaning that one is doing so. This conception still counts resigning, promising, asserting and asking as speech acts, while ruling out convincing, insulting and whispering. This definition leaves open the possibility of speech acts being performed wordlessly, as well as speech acts being performed without saying that you are doing so. Our characterization of speech acts captures this fact in emphasizing speaker meaning rather than the uttering of any words.

Speech acts are thus also to be distinguished from performatives. ‘Performative’ is another technical term, and as used here it refers in the first instance to a kind of sentence. A performative sentence is in the first person, present tense, indicative mood, active voice, that describes its speaker as performing a speech act. ‘I assert that George is the culprit,’ is a performative sentence by this test. As we have seen, one can perform a speech act without uttering a performative. Further, since it is merely a type of sentence, one can utter a performative without performing a speech act. For instance, while talking in my sleep I might say, “I hereby promise to climb the Eiffel Tower,” without thereby making any promise. We may also define a performative utterance as an utterance of a performative sentence that is also a speech act.[4]

More nomenclature: ‘Speech act’ and ‘illocution’ will here be used synonymously. The latter term is due to Austin, who used ‘illocutionary force’ to refer to a dimension of communicative acts. (It is nowadays common also to use ‘illocute’ as a verb meaning ‘to perform a speech act.’) Austin’s reason for using ‘force’ begins with the observation that, construed as a bit of observable behavior, the communicative significance of an act may be underdetermined by what has been said or observably done. I bow deeply before you. So far you may not know whether I am paying obeisance, responding to indigestion, or looking for a wayward contact lens. So too, an utterance of a meaningful sentence (which Austin calls a locutionary act) such as ‘You’ll be more punctual in the future,’ may leave you wondering whether I am making a prediction or issuing a command or even a threat. The colloquial question, “What is the force of those words?” is often used to elicit an answer. In asking such a question we acknowledge a grasp of those words’ meaning but seek to know how that meaning is to be taken–as a threat, as a prediction, or as a command.

Or so it seems. In an early challenge to Austin, Cohen (1964) argues that the notion of illocutionary force is otiose provided we already have in place the notion of a sentence’s meaning (Austin’s locutionary meaning). Cohen contends that for a performative sentence such as ‘I promise to read that novel,’ its meaning already guarantees that it is a promise. On the other hand, for a sentence that is not a performative, such as ‘I will read that novel,’ if it is understood as being used to make a promise, the promise is still implicit in the sentence’s meaning. In either case, Cohen concludes, meaning already guarantees force and so we do not require an extra-semantic notion to do so.

Cohen’s reasoning assumes that any utterance of ‘I promise to read that novel’ is a promise. But as we have seen with the case of the somniloquist, neither a sentence, nor even the utterance of a sentence, is sufficient on its own for the performance of a speech act, be it a promise or some other. In a similar spirit to that of Cohen, Searle (1968, p. 407) observes that a serious and literal utterance of ‘I promise to read that novel,’ made under what he terms “conditions of successful utterance”, also counts as a promise. Searle concludes from this that some locutionary acts are also illocutionary acts, and infers from this in turn that for some sentences, their locutionary meaning determines their illocutionary force. This last inference is, however, a non sequitur. As we have seen, the aforementioned sentence’s meaning does not determine the illocutionary force with which it is uttered. Rather, when that sentence is uttered in such a way as to constitute a promise, what determines that force is the meaning of the sentence together with such factors as the speaker’s being serious and other contextual conditions being met.

We may thus agree with Searle that some locutionary acts are also illocutionary acts, without losing sight of our earlier observation that locutionary meaning underdetermines illocutionary force. This fact about underdetermination is implied by Davidson’s Thesis of the Autonomy of Linguistic Meaning, according to which once a bit of language has acquired a conventional meaning, it can be used for any of a variety of extra-linguistic purposes (Davidson, 1979). Green 1997 argues for a qualification of Davidson’s Autonomy Thesis to recognize sentences having the feature that if they are used in a speech act all, then there is at least one other illocutionary force that their utterance must have. Even in light of this qualified version of the Autonomy Thesis, the most that can be said of, ‘I promise to climb the Eiffel Tower,’ is that it is designed to be used to make promises, just as common nouns are designed to be used to refer to things and predicates are designed to characterize things referred to. Below (Section 6.3) we shall consider the view that force is a component of meaning, albeit not of a sentence’s meaning.[5]

2.1 The Independence of Force and Content

Let us return, then, to an elucidation of our distinction between what a speaker says and the force of her utterance. A grammatical sentence composed of meaningful words is commonly thought to express a “content,” which is determined by what that sentence literally means together with features of the context of utterance. Suppose I say to someone in a crowded subway, “You’re standing on my foot.” I am most likely trying to convey the message that he should move. However, what I literally say is only that the addressee in question is standing on my foot. This is the content of my utterance. Many if not most utterances of grammatical sentences composed of meaningful words express more than those sentences’ contents. Pragmaticians, however, commonly distinguish content from other aspects of meaning conveyed by an utterance. On this way of thinking, two intertranslatable sentences of different languages will express the same content, and certain transformations of a sentence within a language are commonly thought to express the same content. Thus, ‘Mary saw John,’ and ‘John was seen by Mary,’ will express the same content even if a speaker’s use of one rather than another of these will carry a distinctive suggestion. For indicative sentences, such contents are typically called Propositions. (In what follows I will capitalize this term to signify that it is in part technical.) Propositions, then, are the contents of indicative sentences, are what such sentences express, and, further, are often thought to be the primary bearers of truth value.

Illocutionary force and semantic content are often taken to be distinct from one another, not just in the way that your left and right hand are distinct, but rather by virtue of falling into different categories. Stenius 1967 elucidates this distinction, noting that in chemical parlance a radical is a group of atoms normally incapable of independent existence, whereas a functional group is the grouping of those atoms in a compound that is responsible for certain of that compound’s properties. Analogously, a Proposition is itself communicatively inert. For instance, merely expressing the Proposition that it is snowing is not to make a move in a “language game”. Rather, such a move is only made by putting forth a Proposition with an illocutionary force such as assertion, conjecture, command, etc. The chemical analogy gains further support from the fact that just as a chemist might isolate radicals held in common among various compounds, the student of language may isolate a common element held among ‘Is the door shut?’, ‘Shut the door!’, and ‘The door is shut’. This common element is the Proposition that the door is shut, queried in the first sentence, commanded to be made true in the second, and asserted in the third. According to the chemical analogy, then:

Illocutionary force : Propositional content :: functional group : radical

In light of this analogy we may see, following Stenius, that just as the grouping of a set of atoms is not itself another atom or set of atoms, so too the forwarding of a Proposition with a particular illocutionary force is not itself a further component of Propositional content.

Encouraged by the chemical analogy, a central tenet in the study of speech acts is that content may remain fixed while force varies. The force of an utterance also underdetermines its content: Just from the fact that a speaker has made a promise, we cannot deduce what she has promised to do. For these reasons, students of speech acts contend that a given communicative act may be analyzed into two components: force and content. While semantics studies the contents of communicative acts, pragmatics studies their force.

The force/content distinction also finds parallels in our understanding of mentality. Speech acts are not only moves in a “language game.” They also often purport to express of states of mind with analogous structural properties. An assertion that it is snowing purports to express the speaker’s belief that it is snowing. A promise to read Middlemarch purports to express the speaker’s intention to read Middlemarch. We find evidence for these relationships in the fact that it is in some sense absurd to say, ‘It’s snowing, but I don’t believe that it is,’ and ‘I promise to read Middlemarch, but I have no intention of doing so.’[6] Further, just as we may distinguish between an asserting and what is asserted (the so-called “ing/ed ambiguity” for verbs such as ‘assert’), and a promising from what is promised, we may also distinguish between a state of believing and what is believed, and a state or act of intending and what is intended. Searle 1983 delineates structural analogies between speech acts and the mental states they express. Pendlebury 1986 succinctly explains the merits of this approach.

In spite of these structural analogies, we may still wonder why an elucidation of the notion of force is important for a theory of communication. That A is an important component of communication, and that A underdetermines B, do not justify the conclusion that B is an important component of communication. Content also underdetermines the decibel level at which we speak but this fact does not justify adding decibel level to our repertoire of core concepts for pragmatics or the philosophy of language. Why should force be thought any more worthy of admission to this set of core concepts than decibel level? One reason for an asymmetry in our treatment of force and decibel level is that the former, but not the latter, seems to be a component of speaker meaning: Force is a feature not of what is said but of how what is said is meant; decibel level, by contrast, is a feature at most of the way in which something is said. This point is developed in Section 5 below.

We have spoken thus far as if the contents of speech acts must be Propositions, and indeed Searle routinely analyzes speech acts as having the form F(p) (e.g., 1975, p. 344), where ‘F’ is the force component and ‘p’ the Propositional content component. However, in the last two decades linguistic semantics has developed formal representations of contents for the two other major grammatical moods besides the indicative, namely the interrogative and the imperative. On the strength of the analyses of Hamblin (1958), Bell (1975), Pendlebury (1986) and others, one strategy for the semantics of interrogatives is to construe them as expressing sets of propositions rather than a single proposition, where each element of the putative set is a complete answer to the question at issue. Thus the content expressed by ‘How many doors are shut?’ will be {<No doors are shut>, <One door is shut>, …} where the ellipsis will be filled by as many other Propositions as it is reasonable to interpret the questioner as asking after. Call such a set an Interrogative. A complete answer to an Interrogative is an element of the set by which it is defined; a partial answer is a subset of that set containing two or more members, as would naturally be expressed by the sentence ‘Between two and four doors are shut.’ On the present conceptualization, just as we may distinguish between expressing and asserting a Propositional content, we may also distinguish between expressing an Interrogative and asking a question. One merely expresses an Interrogative in such an utterance as, ‘John wonders how many doors are shut.’ In fact, a single utterance may express two Interrogatives while asking neither, as in ‘How many doors are shut will depend on how many customers are trying on clothes.’ Asking a question is no less substantial a conversational move than is making an assertion.

Similarly, work by Hamblin (1987), Belnap (1990), Portner (2004) and others suggests semantic analyses for sentences in the imperative mood: on one approach an imperative expresses a property, and when one speaker issues an imperative that her addressee accepts, that property is added to her “to do list”, itself a parameter of what we will later describe as conversational score (Section 7).

In light of the above liberalization of the notion of sentential content to accommodate the contents of non-indicative sentences, we may rephrase Stenius’s chemical analogy as follows:

Illocutionary force : sentential content :: functional group : radical

with the understanding that different types of sentential content will correspond to the different grammatical moods. This refined analogy would in turn require there to be different types of radical.[7]

2.2 Can Saying Make it So?

In some cases we can make something the case by saying that it is. Alas, I cannot lose ten pounds by saying that I am doing so, nor can I persuade you of a claim by saying that I am doing so. On the other hand I can promise to meet you tomorrow by uttering the words, “I promise to meet you tomorrow,” and if I have the authority to do so, I can even appoint you to an office by saying, “I hereby appoint you.” (I can also appoint you without making the force of my act explicit: I might just say, “You are now Treasurer of the Corporation.”) Only an appropriate authority, speaking at the appropriate time and place, can: christen a ship, pronounce a couple married, appoint someone to an administrative post, declare the proceedings open, or rescind an offer. Austin, in How To Do Things With Words, details the conditions that must be met for a given speech act to be performed felicitously.

Failures of felicity fall into two classes: misfires and abuses. The former are cases in which the putative speech act fails to be performed at all. If I utter, before the QEII, “I declare this ship the Noam Chomsky,” I have not succeeded in naming anything because I lack the authority to do so. My act thus misfires in that I’ve performed an act of speech but no speech act. Other attempts at speech acts might misfire because their addressee fails to respond with an appropriate uptake: I cannot bet you $100 on who will win the election unless you accept that bet. If you do not accept that bet, then I have tried to bet but have not succeeded in betting. As we will see in Section 9, a systematic unwillingness on the part of a speaker’s interlocutors to respond with the requisite uptake may compromise that speaker’s freedom of speech.

Some speech acts can be performed–that is, not misfire—while still being less than felicitous. I promise to meet you for lunch tomorrow, but haven’t the least intention of making good. Here I have promised all right, but the act is not felicitous because it is not sincere. My act is, more precisely, an abuse because although it is a speech act, it fails to live up to a standard appropriate for speech acts of its kind. Sincerity is a paradigm condition for the felicity of speech acts. Austin foresaw a program of research in which thousands of types of speech act would be studied in detail, with felicity conditions elucidated for each.[8]

As observed by Sbisà 2007, not only can I perform a speech act by speaker meaning that I am doing so, I can also subsequently rescind that act. I cannot, it would seem, change the past, and so nothing I can do on Wednesday can change the fact that I made a promise or assertion on Monday. However, on Wednesday I may be able to retract a claim I made on Monday. I can’t take back a punch or a burp; the most I can do is apologize for one of these infractions, and perhaps make amends. By contrast, not only can I apologize or make amends for a claim I now regret; I can also withdraw it. Likewise, you may allow me on Wednesday to retract the promise I made to you on Monday. In both these cases of assertion and promise, I am now no longer beholden to the commitments that the speech acts engender in spite of the fact that the past is fixed. Just as one can, under appropriate conditions, perform a speech act by speaker meaning that one is doing so, so too one can, under the right conditions, retract that very speech act.

2.3 Theories of Performativity

Austin famously denied that performatives are statements (1962, p. 6). This may be taken either as the denial that performative sentences, even those in the indicative grammatical mood, have truth value; or instead as the denial that utterances of performative sentences, even when such sentences have truth value, are assertions. One can consistently hold that an indicative sentence has truth value, and even that it may be uttered in such a way as to say something true, while denying that its utterance is an assertion. (Testing a microphone in a windowless room, I utter, “It’s raining,” and it happens to be raining outside. Here I have said something true but have made no assertion.)

Lemmon 1962 argues that performative utterances are true on the ground that they are instances of a wider class of sentences whose utterance guarantees their truth. If sound, this argument would show that performatives have truth value, but not that they are assertions. It also leaves unanswered the question why some verb phrases such as ‘I promise’ may be used performatively while others cannot be so used. Sinnott-Armstrong 1994 also argues that performatives can have truth value without addressing the question whether they are also used to make assertions. Reimer 1995 argues that while performatives have truth values, they are not also assertions. Adopting a similar strategy, Jary 2007 aims to explain how utterances of such sentences as “I order you to clean the kitchen,” can succeed in being orders. In so doing he draws on Green’s 2007 analysis of showing to argue that such utterances show (rather than merely describe) the force of the speaker’s utterance. Because ‘show’ is factive, if such an utterance shows its force, then it must have that force.

Most challenges to Austin, however, construe performatives as assertions and attempt to explain their properties in that light. Ginet 1979 argues that performative verbs (‘promise,’ ‘appoint’, etc.) name the kinds of acts that one can perform by asserting that one is doing so, and elaborates on why this is so. In this way he offers an account of how performatives work that depends on the assumption that performative utterances are assertions. Starting from that same assumption, Bach 1975 contends that ‘I order you to clean the kitchen’ is an assertion, and proceeds to explain on this basis how the speaker is indirectly also issuing an order. This explanation depends on the speaker’s being able to count on the addressee’s ability to discern the speaker’s communicative intention. In later work, such as Bach and Harnish 1978, and 1992, this view is refined with a notion of standardization, so that a sufficiently common practice of issuing assertions with performative effect enables speakers and hearers to bypass complex inferential reasoning and jump by default to a conclusion about the illocution being performed. Reimer 1995 challenges Bach and Harnish on the ground that hearers do not seem to impute assertoric force to the indicative sentences speakers utter with performative effect; her criticism would evidently carry over to Ginet’s proposal. Instead Reimer contends that performative utterances rest on systems of what she terms illocutionary conventions to achieve their performative effects.

Searle 1969, p. 62–4, had argued that a performative formula such as “I promise to…” is an “illocutionary force indicator” in the sense that it is a device whose role is to make explicit the force of the speaker’s utterance. Making something explicit, however, would seem to involve characterizing an independent event or state of affairs, and as a result Searle’s account presupposes that speakers can imbue their utterances with the force of demotions and excommunications; yet this is what was to be explained. Realizing this, Searle and Vanderveken (1985) characterize performatives as speech acts having the force of declarations. Uncontroversial examples of this speech act are declaring war or adjourning a meeting. Searle 1989 then acknowledges that this account pushes us back to the question how certain expressions come to have the power to make declarations. In that same work he offers an answer that depends on the view that in uttering a sentence with a performative prefix, a speaker manifests an intention to perform an act of a certain kind: in uttering the words, ‘I order you to close the door’, I manifest an intention to order you to close the door, etc. Searle also takes it that manifesting an intention to perform a speech act is sufficient for the performance of that act. On this basis, Searle goes on to attempt to derive the assertoric nature of performatives, holding that when uttered in such a way as to say something true, they are also assertions.

3. Aspects of Illocutionary Force

Austin distinguishes illocutionary acts into five categories: verdictives (in which a speaker gives a verdict, e.g. acquitting and diagnosing), exercitives (in which speakers exercise powers, rights or influence, e.g. excommunicating and resigning), commissives (in which speakers commit themselves to causes or courses of action, e.g. promising and betting), behabitives (concerning attitudes and social behavior, e.g. apologizing and toasting), and expositives (in which speakers clarify how their utterances fit into lines of reasoning, e.g., postulating and defining).

Searle (1975) criticizes Austin’s taxonomy on two central grounds. First, Austin’s methodology is unduly lexicographic, assuming that we can learn about the range and limits of illocutionary acts by studying illocutionary verbs in English or other natural languages. However, Searle observes, nothing rules out the possibility of there being illocutionary acts that are not named by a verb either in a particular language such as Swahili or Bengali, or indeed in any language at all; similarly, two non-synonymous illocutionary verbs may yet name one and the same illocutionary act.

Second, Searle argues that the principles of distinction among Austin’s categories are unclear. For instance, behavitives seem to be a heterogeneous group with little unifying principle. Similarly, ‘describe’ appears both as a verdictive and as an expositive whereas one would expect taxonomic categories to be mutually exclusive. More generally, Austin’s brief account of each category gives no direction as to why this way of delineating them does so along their most fundamental features. Searle offers a new categorization of speech acts based on relatively clear principles of distinction. To appreciate this it will help to explain some of the basic concepts he uses for this purpose.

3.1 Direction of Fit

Consider an example derived from Anscombe (1963): a woman sends her husband to the grocery store with a list of things to procure; unbeknownst to him he is also being trailed by a detective concerned to make a list of what the man buys. By the time the husband and detective are in the checkout line, their two lists contain exactly the same items. The contents of the two lists differ, however, along another dimension. For the contents of the husband’s list guide what he puts in his shopping cart. Insofar, his list exhibits world-to-word direction of fit: It is, so to speak, the job of the items in his cart to conform to what is on his list. By contrast, it is the job of the detective’s list to conform with the world, in particular to what is in the husband’s cart. As such, the detective’s list has word-to-world direction of fit: The onus is on those words to conform to how things are. Speech acts such as assertions and predictions have word-to-world direction of fit, while speech acts such as commands have world-to-word direction of fit.

Not all speech acts appear to have direction of fit. I can thank you by saying “Thank you,” and it is widely agreed that thanking is a speech act. However, thanking seems to have neither of the directions of fit we have discussed thus far. Similarly, asking who is at the door is a speech act, but it does not seem to have either of the directions of fit we have thus far mentioned. Some would respond by construing questions as a form of imperative (e.g., “Tell me who is at the door!”), and then ascribing the direction of fit characteristic of imperatives to questions. This leaves untouched, however, banal cases such as thanking or even, “Hooray for Arsenal!” Some authors, such as Searle and Vanderveken 1985, describe such cases as having “null” direction of fit. That characterization is evidently distinct from saying such speech acts have no direction of fit at all.[9]

Direction of fit is also not so fine-grained as to enable us to distinguish speech acts meriting different treatment. Consider asserting that the center of the Milky Way is inhabited by a black hole, as opposed to conjecturing that the center of the Milky Way is so inhabited. These two acts are subject to different norms: The former purports to be a manifestation of knowledge, while the latter does not. This is suggested by the fact that it is appropriate to reply to the assertion with, “How do you know?” (Williamson 1996), while that is not an appropriate response to the conjecture (Green 2017). Nevertheless, both the assertion and conjecture have word-to-world direction of fit. Might there be other notions enabling us to mark differences between speech acts with the same direction of fit?

3.2 Conditions of Satisfaction

One suggestion might come from the related notion of conditions of satisfaction. This notion generalizes that of truth. As we saw in 2.3, it is internal to the activity of assertion that it aims to capture how things are. When an assertion does so, not only is it true, it has hit its target; the aim of the assertion has been met. A similar point may be made of imperatives: it is internal to the activity of issuing an imperative that the world is enjoined to conform to it. The imperative is satisfied just in case it is fulfilled. Assertions and imperatives both have conditions of satisfaction—truth in the first place, and conformity in the second. In addition, it might be held that questions have answerhood as their conditions of satisfaction: A question hits its target just in case it finds an answer, often in a speech act, such as an assertion, that answers the question posed. Like the notion of direction of fit, however, the notion of conditions of satisfaction is too coarse-grained to enable us to make some valuable distinctions among speech acts. Just to use our earlier case again: an assertion and a conjecture that P have identical conditions of satisfaction, namely that P be the case. May we discern features distinguishing these two speech acts, in a way enabling us to make finer-grained distinctions among other speech acts as well? I shall return to this question in Sections 6–7.

3.3 Seven Components of Illocutionary Force

In an attempt to systematize and deepen Austin’s approach, Searle and Vanderveken 1985 distinguish between those illocutionary forces employed by speakers within a given linguistic community, and the set of all possible illocutionary forces. While a certain linguistic community may make no use of forces such as conjecturing or appointing, these two are among the set of all possible forces. (These authors appear to assume that while the set of possible forces may be infinite, it has a definite cardinality.) Searle and Vanderveken go on to define illocutionary force in terms of seven features, namely:

  1. Illocutionary point: This is the characteristic aim of each type of speech act. For instance, the characteristic aim of an assertion is to describe how things are, and perhaps also to bring about belief in an addressee; the characteristic aim of a promise is to commit oneself to a future course of action.
  2. Degree of strength of the illocutionary point: Two illocutions can have the same point but differ along the dimension of strength. For instance, requesting and insisting that the addressee do something both have the point of attempting to get the addressee to do that thing; however, the latter is stronger than the former.
  3. Mode of achievement: This is the special way, if any, in which the illocutionary point of a speech act must be achieved. Testifying and asserting both have the point of describing how things are; however, the former also involves invoking one’s authority as a witness while the latter does not. To testify is to assert in one’s capacity as a witness. Commanding and requesting both aim to get the addressee to do something; yet only someone issuing a command does so in her capacity as a person in a position of authority.
  4. Content conditions: Some illocutions can only be achieved with an appropriate propositional content. For instance, I can only promise what is in the future and under my control; or, at least, I cannot promise to do anything that it is obvious to myself and my promissee that I cannot do. So too, I can only apologize for what is in some sense under my control and already the case. (In light of our discussion above of semantics for non-indicative contents, this condition could be recast in terms of imperatival, interrogative, and propositional content conditions.)
  5. Preparatory conditions: These are all other conditions that must be met for the speech act not to misfire. Such conditions often concern the social status of interlocutors. For instance, a person cannot bequeath an object unless she already owns it or has power of attorney; a person cannot marry a couple unless she is legally invested with the authority to do so.
  6. Sincerity conditions: Many speech acts involve the expression of a psychological state. Assertion expresses belief; apology expresses regret, a promise expresses an intention, and so on. A speech act is sincere only if the speaker is in the psychological state that her speech act expresses.
  7. Degree of strength of the sincerity conditions: Two speech acts might be the same along other dimensions, but express psychological states that differ from one another in the dimension of strength. Requesting and imploring both express desires, and are identical along the other six dimensions above; however, the latter expresses a stronger desire than the former.

Searle and Vanderveken (1985) suggest, in light of these seven characteristics, that each illocutionary force may be defined as a septuple of values, each of which is a “setting” of a value within one of the seven characteristics. It follows, according to this suggestion, that two illocutionary forces F1 and F2 are identical just in case they correspond to the same septuple.

3.4 Direct and Indirect Force

I cannot slow the expansion of the universe or convince you of the truth of a claim by saying that I am doing so. However, these two cases differ in that the latter, but not the former, is a characteristic aim of a speech act. One characteristic aim of assertion is the production of belief in an addressee, whereas there is no speech act one of whose characteristic aims is the slowing of the universe’s expansion. A type of speech act can have a characteristic aim without each speech act of that type being issued with that aim: Speakers sometimes make assertions without aiming to produce belief in anyone, even themselves. Instead, the view that a speech act-type has a characteristic aim is akin to the view that a biological trait has a function. The characteristic role of wings is to aid in flight even though some flightless creatures are winged.

Austin called these characteristic aims of speech acts perlocutions (1962, p. 101). I can both urge and persuade you to shut the door, yet the former is an illocution while the latter is a perlocution. How can we tell the difference? We can do so by noting that under the right conditions, one can urge just by saying and speaker meaning, “I hereby urge you to shut the door,” while there are no circumstances in which I can persuade you just by saying, “I hereby persuade you to shut the door.” A characteristic aim of urging is, nevertheless, the production of a resolution to act (1962, p. 107). Cohen (1973) develops the idea of perlocutions as characteristic aims of speech acts.

Perlocutions are characteristic aims of one or more illocution, but are not themselves illocutions. Nevertheless, one speech act can be performed by means of the performance of another. For instance, my remark that you are standing on my foot is normally taken as, in addition, a demand that you move; my question whether you can pass the salt is normally taken as a request that you do so. These are examples of so-called indirect speech acts (Searle 1979). Phrases that are commonly used in service of indirect speech acts are, ‘Would you mind terribly if I…,’ ‘Might I suggest…,’ and ‘It seems to me that…’, or simply ‘please’, as in ‘Can you pass the salt, please?’ Observe that this last sentence, with its appended tag-question, cannot be interpreted as a request for information (about the addressee’s salt-passing abilities), but can only be understood as a request. Asher and Lascarides (2001) provide a formal model of indirect speech acts on which some are conventionalized while others require Gricean reasoning for their interpretation.

While indirect communication is ubiquitous, indirect speech acts are less common than might first appear. In asking whether you intend to quit smoking, I might be taken as well to be suggesting that you quit. However, while the embattled smoker might jump to this interpretation, we do well to consider what evidence would mandate it. After all, while I probably would not have asked whether you intended to quit smoking unless I hoped you would quit, I can evince such a hope without performing the speech act of suggesting. Evincing a psychological state, even if done intentionally, arguably does not constitute a speech act. Instead, intentionally evincing a psychological state may be understood as simply expressing that state (See Green 2020, ch. 2).

Whether, in addition to a given speech act, I am also performing an indirect speech act would seem to depend on my intentions. My question whether you can pass the salt is also a request that you do so only if I intend to be so understood. What is more, this intention must be feasibly discernible on the part of one’s audience. Even if, in remarking on the fine weather, I intend as well to request that you pass the salt, I will not have issued a request unless I have made that intention manifest in some way.

How might I do this? One way is by making an inference to the best explanation. Perhaps the best explanation of my asking whether you can pass the salt is that I mean to be requesting that you do so, and perhaps the best explanation of my remarking that you are standing on my foot, particularly if I use a stentorian tone of voice, is that I mean to be demanding that you desist. By contrast, it is doubtful that the best explanation of my asking whether you intend to quit smoking is that I intend to suggest that you do so. Another explanation at least as plausible is my hope, or expression of hope, that you do so. Bertolet 1994 develops a more skeptical position than that suggested here, arguing that any alleged case of an indirect speech act can be construed just as an indication, by means of contextual clues, of the speaker’s intentional state—hope, desire, etc., as the case may be. Postulation of a further speech act beyond what has been (relatively) explicitly performed is, he contends, explanatorily unmotivated. McGowan et al. (2009) reply by offering three conditions they take to be sufficient for a case of what they term linguistic communication. They would also argue that in, for instance, the smoking case, the speaker meets those three conditions, and thus counts as suggesting that the addressee quit smoking. Bertolet (2017) replies that these three conditions are not sufficient for an instance of speaker meaning, and given that (as we have seen) speaker meaning is a necessary condition for (non-conventional) speech acts, concludes that McGowan et al. have not established that the cases that concern them are indirect speech acts.

These considerations suggest that indirect speech acts, if they do occur at all, can be explained within the framework of conversational implicature–that process by which we mean more (and on some occasions less) than we say, but in a way not due exclusively to the conventional meanings of our words. Conversational implicature, too, depends both upon communicative intentions and the availability of inference to the best explanation (Grice, 1989). In fact, Searle’s 1979 influential account of indirect speech acts is couched in terms of conversational implicature (although he does not use this phrase). The study of speech acts is in this respect intertwined with the study of conversations; we return to this theme in Section 6.[10]

4. Mood, Force and Convention

Not only does content underdetermine force; content together with grammatical mood does so as well. ‘You’ll be more punctual in the future’ is in the indicative grammatical mood, but as we have seen, that fact does not determine its force. The same may be said of other grammatical moods. Although I overhear you utter the words, ‘shut the door’, I cannot infer yet that you are issuing a command. Perhaps instead you are simply describing your own intention, in the course of saying, “I intend to shut the door.” If so, you’ve used the imperative mood without issuing a command. So too with the interrogative mood: I overhear your words, ‘who is on the phone.’ Thus far I don’t know whether you’ve asked a question, since you may have so spoken in the course of stating, “John wonders who is on the phone.” Might either or both of initial capitalization or final punctuation settle the issue? Apparently not: What puzzles Meredith is the following question: Who is on the phone?

Mood together with content underdetermine force. On the other hand it is a plausible hypothesis that grammatical mood is one of the devices we use (together with contextual clues, intonation, and the like) to indicate the force with which we are expressing a content. Understood in this weak way, it is unexceptionable to construe the interrogative mood as used for asking questions, the imperatival mood as used for issuing commands, and so on. So understood, we might go on to ask how speakers indicate the force of their speech acts given that grammatical mood and content cannot be relied on alone to do so.

4.1 Force Conventionalism

One well known answer we may term force conventionalism. According to a strong version of this view, for every speech act that is performed, there is some convention that will have been invoked in order to make that speech act occur. This convention transcends those imbuing words with their literal meaning. Thus, force conventionalism implies that in order for use of ‘I promise to meet you tomorrow at noon,’ to constitute a promise, not only must the words used possess their standard conventional meanings, there must also exist a convention to the effect that the use, under the right conditions, of some such words as these constitutes a promise. Austin seems to have held this view. For instance in his characterization of “felicity conditions” for speech acts, Austin holds that for each speech act

There must exist an accepted conventional procedure having a certain conventional effect, that procedure to include the uttering of certain words by certain persons in certain circumstances… (1962, p. 14).

Austin’s student Searle follows him in this, writing

…utterance acts stand to propositional and illocutionary acts in the way in which, e.g., making an X on a ballot paper stands to voting. (1969, p. 24)

Searle goes on to clarify this commitment in averring,

…the semantic structure of a language may be regarded as a conventional realization of a series of sets of underlying constitutive rules, and …speech acts are acts characteristically performed by uttering sentences in accordance with these sets of constitutive rules. (1969, p. 37)

Searle espouses a weaker form of force conventionalism than does Austin in leaving open the possibility that some speech acts can be performed without constitutive rules; Searle considers the case of a dog requesting to be let outside (1969, p. 39). Nevertheless Searle does contend that speech acts are characteristically performed by invoking constitutive rules.

4.2 A Biosemantic Species of Force Conventionalism

Millikan (1998) espouses a parsimonious conception of conventions that she terms ‘natural conventions,’ and on the assumption that natural conventions are a type of convention, one would expect this strategy to make it easier to defend the view that speech acts are inherently conventional. For Millikan, a natural convention is constituted by patterns that are reproduced by virtue of the weight of precedent.[11] A pattern is reproduced just in case it has a form that derives from a previous entity having, in certain respects, the same form, and in such a way that had the previous form been different in those respects, the current form would be different in those respects as well (1998, p. 163). Photocopying is one form of reproduction meeting these criteria; the retinotopic mapping from patterns of stimulation on the retina to patterns of stimulation in the visual cortex is evidently another. Millikan would not treat retinotopic mapping as a type of convention, however, since it would not seem to be perpetuated by virtue of the weight of precedent. The point is difficult to discern, however, since in her discussion of the matter Millikan discusses the conditions under which a pattern is taken to be conventional, rather than for it to be conventional, writing

To be thought of as conventional, a reproduced pattern must be perceived as proliferated due, in important part, to weight of precedent, not to its intrinsically superior capacity to produce a desired result, or due, say, to ignorance of alternatives (ibid, p. 166).

Millikan thus seems to characterize what it is for a pattern to have weight of precedent in terms of that pattern’s being perceived to have such weight. This notion is not itself elucidated, and as a result the notion of weight of precedent is left obscure in her account. Nonetheless, she tells us that just as the conventions of chess dictate that when one’s king is in check, one does what one can to get him out of check; so too the conventions of language dictate that when A tells B that p, B responds by believing that p. Millikan describes the hearer’s response as a hidden, inner act that is not under B’s voluntary control. Millikan also describes this response as being learned in the way that we learn what she calls “natural sign patterns,” such as our learning that the sound of crashing waves is an indication of a nearby coastline.

On Millikan’s view, then, A’s assertion of p being followed by B’s belief that p is a process that is not intrinsically superior to others that might have been followed. This may be doubted, however. What, after, all would be viable alternative responses? Disbelieving p? Remaining neutral on the question of p? Scratching one’s left earlobe? Any of these responses would tend to undermine the use of language as a means for transmission of information. What is more, if belief formation is not under the voluntary control of addressees, it is obscure how this aspect of communication could be conventional, any more than the pattern of stimulation of our visual cortex is conventional when that pattern results from an isomorphic pattern on the retina.

4.3. An Intentionalist Alternative to Force Conventionalism

Force-conventionalism as espoused by Austin and later Searle has been challenged by Strawson, who writes,

I do not want to deny that there may be conventional postures or procedures for entreating: one can, for example, kneel down, raise one’s arms, and say, “I entreat you.” But I do want to deny that an act of entreaty can be performed only as conforming to such conventions….[T]o suppose that there is always and necessarily a convention conformed to would be like supposing that there could be no love affairs which did not proceed on lines laid down in the Roman de la Rose or that every dispute between men must follow the pattern specified in Touchstone’s speech about the countercheck quarrelsome and the lie direct. (1964, p. 444)

Strawson contends that rather than appealing to a series of extra-semantic conventions to account for the possibility of speech acts, we explain that possibility in terms of our ability to discern one another’s communicative intentions. What makes an utterance of a sentence in the indicative mood a prediction rather than a command, for instance, is that it manifests an intention to be so taken; likewise for promises rather than predictions. This position is compatible with holding that in special cases linguistic communities have instituted conventions for particular speech acts such as appointing and excommunicating. So too, as Skinner (1970) observes, understanding the utterances of an historical figure crucially depends on sensitivity to conventions of the society in which they are made.

Intending to make an assertion, promise, or request, however, is not enough to perform one of these acts. Those intentions must be efficacious. The same point applies to cases of trying to perform a speech act, even when what one is trying to do is clear to others. This fact emerges from reflecting on an oft-quoted passage from Searle:

Human communication has some extraordinary properties, not shared by most other kinds of human behavior. One of the most extraordinary is this: If I am trying to tell someone something, then (assuming certain conditions are satisfied) as soon as he recognizes that I am trying to tell him something and exactly what it is I am trying to tell him, I have succeeded in telling it to him. (1969, p. 47.)

As Green 2013 observes, the point may be doubted. Suppose I am trying to work up the courage to ask Sidney’s hand in marriage. Sidney recognizes this fact on the basis of background knowledge, my visible embarrassment, and my fumbling in my pocket for an engagement ring. Here we cannot infer that I have succeeded in asking Sidney anything. Nothing short of coming out and saying it will do. Similarly, it might be common knowledge that my moribund uncle is trying, as he breathes his last, to bequeath me his fortune; still, I won’t inherit a penny if he expires before saying what he was trying to.[12] Closer to Searle’s example, even if you were to find, on the basis of fMRI analysis of my neural activity, that I was trying to tell you that it’s going to rain tomorrow, I still have not asserted anything about tomorrow’s weather. (If I were completely paralyzed as a result of Locked-In Syndrome, then making such a neural effort might be the most I can hope to do; in that case, your fMRI information might be enough to justify you in taking me to have performed a speech act.)

The gist of these examples is not the requirement that words be uttered in every speech act—we have already observed that speech acts can be performed silently. Rather, their gist is that speech acts involve intentional undertaking of a publicly accessible commitment; further, that commitment is not undertaken simply by virtue of my intending to undertake it, even when it is common knowledge that this is what I am trying to do. Can we, however, give a more illuminating characterization of the relevant intentions than merely saying that, for instance, to assert P one must intentionally put forth P as an assertion? Strawson (1964) proposes that we can do so with aid of the notion of speaker meaning—to which we now turn.

5. Speaker-Meaning and Force

As we have seen, that A is an important component of communication, and that A underdetermines B, do not justify the conclusion that B is an important component of communication. One reason for an asymmetry in our treatment of force and decibel level is that the former, but not the latter, seems crucial to how I mean what I say. I intend to speak at a certain volume, and sometimes succeed, but in most cases it is no part of how I mean what I say that I happen to be speaking at that volume. On the other hand, the force of my utterance is an aspect of what I mean. It is not, as we have seen, any aspect of what I say—that notion being closely associated with content. However, whether I mean what I say as an assertion, a conjecture, a promise or something else will be crucial to how I mean what I do.

5.1 Grice’s Account of Speaker Meaning

In his influential 1957 article, Grice distinguished between two uses of ‘mean’. One use is exemplified by remarks such as ‘Those clouds mean rain,’ and ‘Those spots mean measles.’ The notion of meaning in play in such cases Grice dubs ‘natural meaning’. Grice suggests that we may distinguish this use of ‘mean’ from another use of the word more relevant to communication, exemplified in such utterances as

In saying “You make a better door than a window”, George meant that you should move,


In gesticulating that way, Salvatore means that there’s quicksand over there,

Grice used the term ‘non-natural meaning’ for this use of ‘mean’, and in more recent literature this jargon has been replaced with the term ‘speaker meaning’.[13] After distinguishing between natural and (what we shall hereafter call) speaker meaning, Grice attempts to characterize the latter. It is not enough that I do something that influences the beliefs of an observer: In putting on a coat I might lead an observer to conclude that I am going for a walk. Yet in such a case it is not plausible that I mean that I am going for a walk in the sense germane to speaker meaning. Might performing an action with an intention of influencing someone’s beliefs be sufficient for speaker meaning? No: I might secretly leave Smith’s handkerchief at the crime scene to make the police think that Smith is the culprit. However, whether or not I am successful in getting the authorities to think that Smith is the culprit, in this case it is not plausible that I mean that Smith is the culprit.

What is missing in the handkerchief example is the element of overtness. This suggests another criterion: Performing an action with the, or an, intention of influencing someone’s beliefs, while intending that this very intention be recognized. Grice contends that even here we do not have enough for speaker meaning. Herod presents Salome with St. John’s severed head on a charger, intending that she discern that St. John is dead and intending that this very intention of his be recognized. Grice observes that in so doing Herod is not telling Salome anything, but is instead deliberately and openly letting her know something. Grice concludes that Herod’s action is not a case of speaker meaning either. The problem is not that Herod is not using words; we have already considered communicators who mean things wordlessly. The problem seems to be that to infer what Herod intends her to, Salome does not have to take his word for anything. She can see the severed head for herself if she can bring herself to look. By contrast, in its central uses, telling requires a speaker to intend to convey information (or alleged information) in a way that relies crucially upon taking her at her word. Grice appears to assume that at least for the case in which what is meant is a proposition (rather than a question or an imperative), speaker meaning requires a telling in this central sense. What is more, this last example is a case of performing an action with an intention of influencing someone’s beliefs, even while intending that this very intention be recognized; yet it is not a case of telling. Grice infers that it is not a case of speaker meaning either.

Grice holds that for speaker meaning to occur, not only must one (a) intend to produce an effect on an audience, and (b) intend that this very intention be recognized by that audience, but also (c) intend this effect on the audience to be produced at least in part by their recognition of the speaker’s intention. The intention to produce a belief or other attitude by means (at least in part) of recognition of this very intention, has come to be called a reflexive communicative intention.

5.2 Objections to Grice’s Account

It may be doubted that speaker meaning requires reflexive communicative intentions. After all, a mathematics teacher who proves a theorem T for her class likely wants her pupils to believe T on the strength of her proof rather than their recognition of her intention that they come to believe T. (Vlach 1981) It may even be doubted that speaker meaning requires intentions to produce cognitive effects on addressees at all: Davis (1992) provides a range of cases such as speaking to pre-linguistic infants, uncooperative photocopy machines, and photos of deceased loved ones.[14],[15] Instead of intentions to produce psychological effects in an addressee, some authors have advocated a construal of speaker meaning as overtly manifesting an aspect of one’s commitments or state of mind (Green 2019). Compare my going to the closet to take out my overcoat (not a case of speaker meaning), with the following case: After heatedly arguing about the weather, I march to the closet while beadily meeting your stare, then storm out the front door while ostentatiously donning the coat. Here it is more plausible that I mean that it is raining outside, and the reason seems to be that I am making some attitude of mine overt: I am not only showing it, I am making clear my intention to do just that.

5.3 Force as an Aspect of Speaker Meaning

How does this detour through speaker meaning help to elucidate the notion of force? One way of asserting that P, it seems, is overtly to manifest my commitment to P, and indeed commitment of a particular kind: commitment to defend P in response to challenges of the form, “How do you know that?” I must also overtly manifest my liability to be either right or wrong on the issue of P depending on whether P is the case. By contrast, I conjecture P by overtly manifesting my commitment to P in this same “liability to error” way, but I am not committed to responding to challenges demanding full justification. I must, however, give some reason for believing P; this much cannot, however, be said of a guess.

We perform a speech act, then, when we overtly commit ourselves in a certain way to a content—where that way is an aspect of how we speaker-mean that content. One way to do that is to invoke a convention for undertaking commitment; another way is overtly to manifest one’s intention to be so committed. We may elucidate the relevant forms of commitment by spelling out the norms underlying them. We have already adumbrated such an approach in our discussion of the differences among asserting and conjecturing. Developing that discussion a bit further, compare

  • asserting
  • conjecturing
  • guessing

All three of these acts have word-to-world direction of fit, and all three have conditions of satisfaction mandating that they are satisfied just in case the world is as their content says it is. Further, one who asserts, conjectures, or guesses that P is right or wrong on the issue of P depending on whether P is in fact so. However, as we move down the list we find a decreasing order of stringency in commitment. One who asserts P lays herself open to the challenge, “How do you know that?”, and she is obliged to retract P if she is unable to respond to that challenge adequately. By contrast, this challenge is inappropriate for either a conjecture or a guess. On the other hand, we may justifiably demand of the conjecturer that she give some reason for her conjecture; yet not even this much may be said of one who makes a guess. (The “educated guess” is intermediate between these two cases.)

This illocutionary dimension of speaker meaning characterizes not what is meant, but rather how it is meant. Just as we may consider your remark, directed toward me, “You’re tired,” and my remark, “I’m tired,” as having said the same thing but in different ways; so too we may consider my assertion of P, followed by a retraction and then followed by a conjecture of P, as two consecutive cases in which I speaker-mean that P but do so in different ways. This idea will be developed further in Section 8 under the rubric of “mode” of illocutionary commitment.[16]

Speaker meaning, then, encompasses not just content but also force, and we may elucidate this in light of the normative structure characteristic of each speech act: When you overtly display a commitment characteristic of that speech act, you have performed that speech act. Is this a necessary condition as well? That depends on whether I can perform a speech act without intending to do so—a topic for Section 9 below. For now, however, compare the view at which we have arrived with Searle’s view that one performs a speech act when others become aware of one’s intention to perform that act. What is missing from Searle’s characterization is the notion of overtness: The agent in question must not only make her intention to undertake a certain commitment manifest; she must also intend that that very intention be manifest. There is more to overtness than wearing one’s heart (or mind) on one’s sleeve.

6. Force, Norms, and Conversation

In elucidating this normative dimension of force, we have sought to characterize speech acts in terms of their conversational roles. That is not to say that speech acts can only be performed in the setting of a conversation: I can approach you, point out that your vehicle is blocking mine, and storm off. Here I have made an assertion but have not engaged in a conversation. Perhaps I can ask myself a question in the privacy of my study and leave it at that–not continuing into a conversation with myself. However, a speech act’s “ecological niche” may nevertheless be the conversation. In that spirit, while we may be able to remove a speech act type from its environment and scrutinize it in isolated captivity, doing so may blind us to some of its distinctive features.

6.1 Speech Acts and Conversations

This ecological analogy sheds light on a dispute over the question whether speech acts can profitably be studied in isolation from the conversations in which they occur. An empiricist framework, exemplified in John Stuart Mill’s A System of Logic, suggests attempting to discern the meaning of a word, for instance a proper name, in isolation. By contrast, Gottlob Frege (1884) enjoins us to understand a word’s meaning in terms of the contribution it makes to an entire sentence. Such a method is indispensable for a proper treatment of such expressions as quantifiers, and represents a major advance over empiricist approaches. Yet students of speech acts have espoused going even further, insisting that the unit of significance is not the proposition but the speech act. Vanderveken writes,

Illocutionary acts are important for the purpose of philosophical semantics because they are the primary units of meaning in the use and comprehension of natural language. (Vanderveken, 1990, p. 1.)

Why not go even further, since speech acts characteristically occur in conversations? Is the unit of significance really the debate, the colloquy, the interrogation?

Students of conversation analysis have contended precisely this, remarking that many speech acts fall naturally into pairs.[17] For instance, questions pair naturally with assertions when the latter purport to be answers to those questions. Likewise, offers pair naturally with acceptances or rejections, and it is easy to multiply examples. Searle, who favors studying speech acts in isolation, has replied to these considerations (Searle 1992). There he issues a challenge to students of conversation to provide an account of conversations parallel to that of speech acts, arguing as well that the prospects for such an account are dim. One of his reasons is that unlike speech acts conversations do not as such have a point or purpose. Green 1999 rejoins that many conversations may indeed be construed in teleological terms. For instance, many conversations may be construed as aimed at answering a question, even when that question concerns something as banal as the afternoon’s weather or the location of the nearest subway station. Asher and Lascardes (2003) develop a systematic treatment of speech acts in their conversational setting that also responds to Searle’s challenge. Additionally, Roberts (2004, 2012) develops a model of conversational kinematics according to which conversations are invariably aimed at answering what she terms a question under discussion (QUD). This view is best appreciated within the framework of the “scorekeeping model” of conversation, to which we now turn.

6.2 Speech Acts and Scorekeeping

Much literature concerned with speech acts is curiously disconnected from research in the semantics of natural language emphasizing pragmatic factors. For instance, Stalnaker (1972, 1973, 1974), Lewis (1979, 1980), Thomason (1990) and others have developed models of the kinematics of conversations aimed at understanding the role of quantification, presupposition (both semantic and pragmatic), anaphora, deixis, and vagueness in discourse. Such models typically construe conversations as involving an ever-developing set of Propositions that can be presupposed by interlocutors. This set of Propositions is the conversational common ground, defined as that set of Propositions that all interlocutors take to be true, while also taking it that all other interlocutors take them to be true. If a Proposition p is in a conversation’s common ground, then a speaker may felicitously presuppose p’s truth. Suppose then that the Proposition that Singapore has a unique King is in a conversation’s common ground at given point; then a speaker may felicitously utter a sentence such as ‘The present King of Singapore is wise,’ or ‘Singapore’s king is sleeping’. Other parameters characterizing a conversation at a given point include the domain of discourse, a set of salient perceptible objects, standards of precision, time, world or situation, speaker, and addressee. The set of all values for these items at a given conversational moment is often referred to as “conversational score”.

“Scorekeeping” approaches to language use typically construe a contribution to a conversation as a Proposition: If that “assertion” is accepted, then the score is updated by having the Proposition entered into common ground. In this spirit, MacFarlane (2011) considers an account of the speech act of assertion in terms an utterance’s capacity to update conversational score. Such an approach will, however, face a difficulty in explaining how two speech acts with the same content, such as an assertion that the Milky Way contains a black hole, and a conjecture that it does, will make different conversational contributions. An enrichment of the scorekeeping model would include sensitivity to differences such as these.

Another development in the scorekeeping model refines the teleological picture adumbrated above to incorporate Questions, construed (along the lines of Section 2.1) as sets of Propositions. When an interlocutor proffers an assertion that is not met with objections by others in the conversation, the Propositional content of that illocution will enter into common ground. When an interlocutor poses a question that is accepted by others, we may represent the change as an addition to Common Ground of the set of propositions that is the Interrogative content of that illocution. The presence of that Interrogative obliges interlocutors to work to rule all but one Proposition that is a complete answer to the Interrogative. Because Interrogatives stand in inferential relations to one another (Q1 entails Q2 just in case any answer to Q1 is an answer to Q2), one strategy for answering a question is to divide it into tractable questions that it entails: ‘How many covered bridges are there in Japan?’ can be answered by answering that question for each of that country’s 47 prefectures. Roberts (2004, 2012) develops the Question Under Discussion model of conversational dynamics according to which common ground contains a partially ordered set of Interrogatives in addition to a set of Propositions. This teleological approach to conversation bids fair to enrich our understanding of the relations of speech acts to other central topics within pragmatics such as presupposition and implicature.[18]

7. Force-Indicators and the Logically Perfect Language

Frege’s Begriffsschrift (1879) constitutes history’s first thoroughgoing attempt to formulate a rigorous formal system in which to carry out deductive reasoning. However, Frege did not see his Begriffsschrift as merely a tool for assessing the validity of arguments. Rather, he appears to have seen it as an organon for the acquisition of knowledge from unquestionable first principles; in addition he wanted to use it in order to help make clear the epistemic foundations on which our knowledge rests. To this end his formal system contains not only symbols indicating the content of propositions (including logical constants), but also symbols indicating the force with which they are put forth. In particular, Frege insists that when using his formal system to acquire new knowledge from propositions already known, we use an assertion sign to indicate our acknowledgment of the truth of the proposition used as axioms or inferred therefrom. Frege thus employs what would now be called a force indicator: an expression whose use indicates the force with which an associated proposition is being put forth (Green 2002).

Reichenbach expands upon Frege’s idea in his 1947. In addition to using an assertion sign, Reichenbach also uses indicators of interrogative and imperatival force. Hare similarly introduces force indicators to lay bare the way in which ethical and cognate utterances are made (Hare 1970). Davidson (1979), however, challenges the value of this entire enterprise of introducing force-indicating devices into languages, formal or otherwise. Davidson’s reason is that since natural language already contains many devices for indicating the force of one’s speech act, the only interest a force indicator could have would be if it could guarantee the force of one’s speech act. But nothing could do this: Any device purporting to be, say, an infallible indicator of assertoric force is liable to being used by a joker or actor to heighten the realism of their performance. Referring to the putative force-indicating device as a ‘strengthened mood,’ he writes,

It is apparent that merely speaking the sentence in the strengthened mood cannot be counted on to result in an assertion: every joker, storyteller, and actor will immediately take advantage of the strengthened mood to simulate assertion. There is no point, then, in the strengthened mood; the available indicative does as well as language can do in the service of assertion (Davidson 1979, p. 311).

Hare 1989 replies that there could be a society with a convention that utterance of a certain expression constituted performance of a certain illocutionary act, even those utterances that occur on stage or as used by jokers or storytellers. Green 1997 questions the relevance of this observation to asserting, which as we have seen, which as we have seen, seem to require intentions for their performance. Just as no convention could make it the case that I believe that P, so too no convention could make it the case that I intend to put forth a certain sentence as an assertion.

On the other hand, Green 1997 and Green 2000 also observe that even if there can be no force indicator in the sense Davidson criticizes, nothing prevents natural language from containing devices that indicate force conditional upon one’s performing a speech act: such a force indicator would not show whether one is performing a speech act, but, given that one is doing so, it would show which speech act one is performing. For instance, parenthetical expressions such as, ‘as is the case’ can occur in the antecedent of conditionals, as in: ‘If, as is the case, the globe is warming, then Antarctica will melt.’ Use of the parenthetical cannot guarantee that the sentence or any part of it is being asserted, but if the entire sentence is being asserted, then, Green claims, use of the parenthetical guarantees that the speaker is also committed to the content of the antecedent. If this claim is correct, natural language already contains force indicators in this qualified sense. Whether it is worth introducing such force indicators into a logical notation remains an open question.

Subsequent to Austin’s introduction of the notion of a performative, it has also been suggested that what we might call performative sentential frames behave like force indicators: ‘I claim that it is sunny,’ seems to be a prolix way of saying that it is sunny, where the ‘I claim’ seems only to indicate how what follows is to be taken. On the approach of Urmson (1952), for instance, such a sentence should be understood on the model of ‘It is sunny, I claim.’ Support for such an analysis may be found in the fact that a potential reply to that utterance is ‘No it isn’t; it’s pouring outside!’, while ‘No you don’t’ is not. Again, if the speaker does not believe it is sunny outside, she cannot dodge, she cannot dodge the accusation of lying by remarking that what she had asserted was that she claimed that it is sunny, and not anything about the weather.

Nonetheless, drawing on Cohen 1964, Lycan 2018 objects to the view that such performative frames make no contribution to sentence or utterance meaning. If Marissa felicitously utters, ‘I claim that it is sunny,’ while Abdul felicitously utters, ‘I conjecture that it is sunny,’ the view implies that their utterances mean the same. The two speakers have clearly said different things, however. On the other hand, if we hold that the performative frame does contribute to the content of what Marissa and Abdul said, then, Lycan points out, it will be difficult to explain how their utterances commit either of them to any position about the weather. It evidently won’t do to posit inference rules such as ‘I state that p,‘ ergo, ‘p’. We will consider a solution to what Lycan terms “Cohen’s Problem” after developing a notion of illocutionary inference in the next section.

8. Do Speech Acts Have a Logic?

Students of speech acts contend, as we have seen, that the unit of communicative significance is the Illocution rather than the Proposition. This attitude prompts the question whether logic itself might be enriched by incorporating inferential relations among speech acts rather than just inferential relations among Propositions. Just as two event-types E1 and E2 (such as running quickly and running) could be logically related to one another in that it is not possible for one to occur without the other; so too speech act types S1 and S2 could be inferentially related to one another if it is not possible to perform one without performing the other. A warning that the bull is about to charge is also an assertion that the bull is about to charge but the converse is not true. This is in spite of the fact that these two speech acts have the same propositional content: That the bull is about to charge. If, therefore, warning implies asserting but not vice versa, then that inferential relation is not to be caught within the net of inferential relations among propositions.

In their Foundations of Illocutionary Logic (1985), Searle and Vanderveken attempt a general treatment of logical relations among speech acts. They describe their central question in terms of commitment:

A theory of illocutionary logic of the sort we are describing is essentially a theory of illocutionary commitment as determined by illocutionary force. The single most important question it must answer is this: Given that a speaker in a certain context of utterance performs a successful illocutionary act of a certain form, what other illocutions does the performance of that act commit him to? (1985, p. 6)

To explicate their notion of illocutionary commitment, these authors invoke their definition of illocutionary force in terms of the seven values mentioned in Section 2.3 above. On the basis of this definition, they define two notions pertinent to entailment relations among speech acts, namely strong illocutionary commitment and weak illocutionary commitment. According to the former definition, an illocutionary act S1 commits a speaker to another illocutionary act S2 iff it is not possible to perform S1 without performing S2. Whether that relation holds between a pair of illocutionary acts depends on the particular septuples with which they are identified. Thus suppose that S1 is identical with <IP1, Str1, Mode1, Cont1, Prep 1, Sinc1, Stresinc1> (corresponding to illocutionary point, strength, mode of achievement, propositional content, preparatory condition, sincerity condition, and strength of sincerity condition, respectively); and suppose that S2 is identical with <IP1, Str2, Mode1, Cont1, Prep1, Sinc1, Stresinc1>. Suppose further that Str1 and Str2 differ only in that 1 is stronger than 2. Then it will not be possible to perform S1 without performing S2; whence the former strongly illocutionarily implies the latter. (This definition of strong illocutionary commitment generalizes in a straightforward way to the case in which a set of speech acts S1, …, Sn−1 implies a speech act Sn.)

Searle and Vanderveken also define a notion of weak illocutionary commitment such that S1 weakly illocutionarily implies S2 iff every performance of S1 commits an agent to meeting the conditions laid down in the septuple identical to S2 (1985, p. 24). Searle and Vanderveken infer that this implies that if P logically entails Q, and an agent asserts P, then she is committed to believing that Q. These authors stress, however, that this does not mean that the agent who asserts P is committed to cultivating the belief Q when P implies Q. In lieu of that explication, however, it is unclear just what notion of commitment is at issue. It is unclear, for instance, what it could mean to be committed to believing Q (rather than just being committed to Q) if this is not to be explicated as being committed to cultivating the belief that Q.

Other approaches attempt to circumvent such problems by reductively defining the notion of commitment in terms of obligations to action and liability to error and/or vindication. Performance of a speech act or set of speech acts can commit an agent to a distinct content, and do so relative to some force. If P and Q jointly imply R, then my asserting both P and Q commits me to R. That is not to say that I have also asserted R: if assertion were closed under deductive consequence I would assert infinitely many things just by virtue of asserting one. By contrast, if I conjecture P and Q, then I am once again committed to R but not in the way that I would have been had I asserted P and Q. For instance, in the assertion case, once my further commitment to R is made clear, it is within the rights of my addressee to ask how I know that R holds; this would not have been an acceptable reply to my merely conjecturing P and Q. Developing this theme, let S be an arbitrary speaker, <ΔlAl, …, ΔnAn, ΔB> a sequence of force/content pairs; then:

lAl, …, ΔnAn, ΔB> is illocutionarily valid iff if speaker S is committed to each Ai under mode Δi, then S is committed to B under mode Δ.[19]

Because it concerns what force/content pairs commit an agent to what others, illocutionary validity is an essentially deontic notion: It will be cashed out in terms either of obligation to use a content in a certain way conversationally, or liability to error or vindication depending upon how the world is.

Our discussion of the possibility of an illocutionary logic answers one question posed at the end of Section 6.3, namely whether it is possible to perform a speech act without intending to do so. This seems likely given Searle and Vanderveken’s definition of strong illocutionary commitment: We need only imagine an agent performing some large number of speech acts, S1, …, Sn−1, which, unbeknownst to her, jointly guarantee that she fulfills the seven conditions defining another speech act Sn. Even in such a case she performs Sn only by virtue of intentionally performing some other set of speech acts S1, …, Sn−1; it is difficult to see how one can perform Sn while having no intention of performing a speech act at all.

We are also in a position to make headway on Cohen’s Problem as formulated by Lycan. As argued in Green 2000, in an assertion of ‘I (hereby) assert that p’, a speaker commits herself to p even though her words do not logically entail that Proposition; nor do they presuppose, or either conversationally or conventionally imply it. They do, however, illocutionarily entail it: anyone committed to ‘I assert that p’ assertorically is thereby committed to p assertorically. By contrast, one committed to ‘I assert that p’ as a supposition for the sake of argument is not thereby committed to p. Accordingly, such a phrase as ‘I assert that’ is semantically opaque (making a non-trivial contribution to the truth conditions of the sentences in which it occurs) but pragmatically transparent in the sense that a speaker who undertakes assertoric commitment to a sentence in which it has widest scope is also assertorically committed to its complement. Analogous remarks apply to ‘I conjecture that’ and the like.

9. Speech Acts and Social Issues

In a paradigmatic illocutionary event, a speaker has a choice of which if any speech act to perform and her addressee will do her charitable best to discern that speaker’s intentions and, where necessary, which conventions she may be invoking. Pratt (1986) observes that this paradigm is not true to the facts of many areas of communicative life, writing

An account of linguistic interaction based on the idea of exchange glosses over the very basic facts that, to put it crudely, some people get to do more talking than others, some are supposed to do more listening, and not everybody’s words are worth the same. (1986, p. 68)

Although Pratt intends this remark as a critique of speech act theory, it also suggests a way in which this theory might shed light on subtle forms of oppression. We saw in Section 2.2 that a putative bet can misfire if it is not accepted. In such a case the speaker attempts to bet but fails in that effort due to a lack of audience uptake. So too, a person may not be in the correct social position to, say, excommunicate or appoint, and her attempts to perform such illocutions will misfire. More momentously, a pattern of abuses of speech act institutions might deprive a person of an ability to perform speech acts: the inveterate promise-breaker will, in time, lead others in his community to be unwilling to accept any promises he tries to make. He can perform countless locutionary acts but will be unable to perform the illocutionary act of promising, at least in this community.

A pattern of culpable behavior could make a speaker unable to perform one speech act type. Could a pattern of culpable behavior–intentional or inadvertent—on the part of others in a speaker’s community achieve the same effect? This could happen if enough such speakers decide never to accept one person’s bets, warnings, or promises. Beyond such hypothetical cases, it has been argued that patterns of social inequality can prevent members of certain groups from performing the speech acts they would choose to. Building on and refining McKinnon’s (1993) claim that pornography silences women, Langton (1993), and Hornsby and Langton (1998) argue that the industry and consumption of pornography deprive women of the ability to perform the speech act of refusing sexual advances. Refusing is a speech act, but if large enough numbers of men deny uptake (with such thoughts as, “By ‘no’ she really means ‘yes’,” etc.) then, these authors argue, women’s attempts to refuse sexual advances will be characteristically inert with respect to the speech act of refusal. Women will still be able to attempt to refuse sexual advances, and can still try to prevent them by physical means, but a crucial illocutionary form of protection will be closed to them. So too, apartheid, Jim Crow, and even patterns of discrimination of which the perpetrators are not consciously aware, can deprive racial, religious, and ethnic minority groups of the ability to perform speech-act types requiring uptake. These phenomena are generally referred to as illocutionary silencing.

Bird (2002) denies that the speech act of refusal requires uptake. Such an illocution is, he contends, like inviting and surrendering, which can occur whether or not their intended audiences grasp or accept the proffered illocutions. Similarly denying that the “silencing” argument should be cast in terms of speech acts, Maitra 2009 argues that the institution of pornography prevents speaker-meant instances of refusal from being understood. One can speaker-mean that she refuses, for instance, but patterns of cognitive and affective response will systematically prevent that refusal from being grasped. Broadening the scope of investigations of the interaction of injustice and illocutionary phenomena, McGowan 2009 argues that some speech acts can not only cause but also constitute instances of oppression. Anderson, Haslanger and Langton (2012) provide overviews of research on racial, gender and related forms of oppression as they relate to speech acts.

Although not inherently culpable, the practice of dogwhistling has also recently gained the interest of theorists of speech acts. As suggested by the metaphor, an agent dogwhistles just in case one or more dimensions of a speech act she performs is readily intelligible only to a proper subset of her addressees. Saul 2018 notes that in contemporary American politics, stating one’s opposition to the Supreme Court case of Dred Scott seems to be a way of signaling one’s anti-abortion sympathies. For those not in the know, however, a speaker’s opposition to the Dred Scott appears to be an uncontroversial act of rejecting racism. The phenomenon of dogwhistling provides an apparent challenge to conceptions of speaker meaning in terms of overtness, since the dogwhistler would seem to speaker mean a content that is cryptic to all but her insider audience: is her utterance both overt and covert? Instead of adopting such a view, one who construes speech acts in terms of overtness could refine the notion of manifestness occuring in her account. What is manifest to one addressee may not be manifest to another, and a speaker may exploit this fact. Accordingly, someone who avows, “I’m against Dred Scott,” may speaker-mean that she is both against Dred Scott and pro-life to one part of her audience, but only that she is against Dred Scott to another part.


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  • Williamson, T., 1996. ‘Knowing and asserting,’ The Philosophical Review, 105: 489–523.

Further Reading

  • Dummett, M., 1996. Origins of Analytic Philosophy, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Furberg, M., 1971. Saying and Meaning: A Main Theme in J. L. Austin’s Philosophy, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Grewendorf, G. and G. Meggle (eds.), 2002. Speech Acts, Mind and Social Reality, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Holdcroft, D., 1978. Words and Deeds: Problems in the Theory of Speech Acts, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Lepore, E. and van Gulick, R. (eds.), 1991. John Searle and his Critics, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Tsohatzidis, S. (ed.), 2007. John Searle’s Philosophy of Language: Force, Meaning and Mind, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Warnock, G. (ed.), 1973. Essays on J. L. Austin, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1989. J. L. Austin, New York: Routledge.

Other Internet Resources

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