Notes to Śrīharṣa

1. In his poem, The Exploits of Nala, the King of Niṣadha (Naiṣadhīyacarita), Śrīharṣa informs the reader that he was honored by the king of Kānyakubja (Kanauj in modern-day Uttar Pradesh). Throughout the first millennium CE, the kings of Kanauj were patrons of Sanskrit literature, having supported renowned poets like Bāṇabhaṭṭa and Bhavabhūti. It remains unclear exactly which king of Kanauj honored Śrīharṣa: both pre-modern commentators and contemporary literary historians have failed to ascertain this. However, they do agree that the patron of Śrīharṣa must have been a king from the Gāhaḍavāla dynasty which ruled parts of modern-day Uttar Pradesh and Bihar in the 11th and 12th centuries: either Govindacandra (1114–1155 CE), or his son Vijayacandra (1155–1170 CE), or his grandson Jayacandra (1170–1193 CE). For discussion, see Jani (1996) and Patel (2014).

2. For introductory discussion of Vedānta, see Taber (2011).

3. At various places within his works, Śrīharṣa mentions a couple of philosophical works other than The Sweets of Refutation. In The Exploits of Nala, he mentions a text, The Examination of Permanence (Sthairyavicāraṇa), which attacks the Buddhist theory of momentariness. In The Sweets of Refutation, he cites another work, The Intention of God (Īśvarābhisandhi), several times. This work seems to have dealt with questions of whether our conscious mental states are self-intimating, whether the Upaniṣadic sentences can be a source of knowledge when their content is contradicted by perception, etc. Unfortunately, none of these texts are extant; The Sweets of Refutation and The Exploits of Nala are the only surviving, published works of Śrīharṣa. See, e.g., Granoff (1978) and Jani (1996).

4. Granoff (1978) argues that there are two respects in which Śrīharṣa’s views depart from the standard doctrine of Advaita Vedānta. First, she claims that unlike other defenders of Advaita Vedānta who treat the perceptible world as provisionally real but not ultimately so, Śrīharṣa doesn’t accept the provisional reality of the perceptible world. Second, she claims that unlike other defenders of Advaita Vedānta, Śrīharṣa in fact thinks that the object of awareness is non-distinct from awareness itself. I think the second claim is correct, but the first is not. There is at least one passage within the text where Śrīharṣa points out that a Brahmavādin (one who thinks that only the Brahman or the self is ultimately real) need not repudiate the reality of the plurality of things in the perceptible world altogether (see, e.g., KKh 112: “na vayaṃ bhedasya sarvathaiva asattvam abhyupagacchāmaḥ| kin nāma pāramārthikam asattvam| avidyāvidyamānatvaṃ tu tadīyam iṣyata eva…”). For dissent from Granoff’s view, see Phillips (1997) and Ram-Prasad (2002).

5. For introductory discussion of Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophy, see Chatterjee (2011). The term ‘method of definition’ is due to Ganeri (2016).

6. Amongst the defenders of Advaita Vedānta, both Citsukha and Ānandapūrṇa wrote largely sympathetic commentaries on The Sweets of Refutation. In Citsukha’s other work, especially in The Lamp to the Truth (Tattvapradīpikā), some arguments that appear in Sweets of Refutation are developed in greater detail. After Gaṅgeśa Upādhyāya’s reconstruction of Nyāya, a number of Nyāya philosophers wrote commentaries on The Sweets of Refutation primarily with the aim of refuting its arguments: in Mithilā, this included Vardhamāna, Śaṃkara Miśra, Vācaspati Miśra II, Pragalbha, Gokulanātha Upādhyāya, and in Bengal, ‘New Reason’ philosophers like Raghudeva and Raghunātha Sārvabhauma Bhaṭṭācārya. See Ganeri (2011: 132–133).

7. Here, the Sanskrit expression ‘lakṣaṇa’ is ambiguous between a sentence (lakṣaṇa-vākya) that states the defining property of an object and the defining property (lakṣaṇa-dharma) itself. While Vātsyāyana means the latter when he uses the word, later commentators such as Vācaspati mean the former. When I use the English word ‘definition’, I will uniformly mean the sentence which states the defining property.

8. The principle, in Śrīharṣa’s own words, stands as follows: “Whether the definiendum can be specified depends on the definiendum (lakṣaṇādhīna tāval lakṣyavyavasthitiḥ)” (KKh 126). Similar principles are discussed by other writers, e.g., Citsukha. In Tattvapradīpikā II.18, Citsukha says:

Whether a knowable entity can be established depends on the means of knowing, while whether the means of knowing can be established depends on the definition (or the defining property) (mānādhīnā meyasiddhiḥ mānasiddhistu lakṣaṇāt). (Śāstrī 1915: 217)

9. Śrīharṣa’s use of the expression ‘anirvicanīya’ differs significantly from that of his Advaita precedessors. Typically, other defenders of Advaita Vedānta, such as Padmapāda (8th or 9th century CE), Maṇḍana Miśra (8th century CE) and Vācaspati Miśra, claim that the variegated world, as it appears in perception, is indeterminable or anirvacanīya, insofar as it is neither ultimately real like the self or the Brahman, nor it is ultimately unreal, e.g., tortoise-fur (since it forms the basis of our linguistic and physical behavior). By contrast, when Śrīharṣa says that the variegated world is indeterminable, what he means is that we cannot define the constituents of that world. For a history of the concept of anirvicanīya as it appears in Maṇḍana Miśra, see Thrasher (1993: ch. 1).

10. On the face of it, the criterion of uniformity seems too demanding. If the kind K is merely part of our folk classification of things, it is unclear why a disjunctive definition of K would necessarily be defective. To borrow an example from Kingsbury and McKeown-Green (2009), take the concept of jazz, which presumably has evolved in response of changing social and cultural phenomena, e.g., the interests of journalists in the late 1950s or the musical taste of musicians in the 1930s. Under such circumstances, one may indeed expect that the best definition of jazz would just be a disjunction of different conditions each of which may be sufficient condition for being a work of jazz, but none of which may be a necessary condition for its being a work of jazz. However, in defense of Śrīharṣa, it is worth pointing out that when the best definition available for a kind K is a disjunction of a bunch of theoretically interesting sufficient conditions, the definition won’t bring to light any theoretically interesting similarity amongst the different instances of K. As a result, the definition won’t provide much information about why K-hood—in itself—is a theoretically interesting property at all. Thus, as long as Śrīharṣa’s opponent is committed to the idea that the epistemological and ontological kinds that she defines are theoretically interesting, the criterion of uniformity might still have some force against her.

In fact, while discussing definitions of knowledge, the later Nyāya philosopher Gaṅgeśa Upādhyāya explicitly argues that absence of uniformity is not really a defect of definitions. See, e.g., Tarkavāgīśa (1974a: 417) and Phillips (1993: 48–49). However, in the Chapter on Inference in The Philosophers’ Stone (Tattvacintāmaṇi), Gaṅgeśa himself attempts to offer a definition of pervasion (vyāpti) that satisfies uniformity; see Tarkavāgīśa (1974b: 243). Also, see Guha (1979) for some discussion of uniformity (anugama) in Nyāya after Gaṅgeśa.

11. According to many editions of the text (e.g., KKh 210), the proposal reads:

What if we insert the qualifier ‘produced by a method that never gives rise to false awareness’ (avyabhicārikaraṇajanyatve satīti viseṣaṇīyam iti cet)?

On an alternative reading (given by Jha 1904–1914: 387) which fits better with the subsequent arguments, the text is

What if we insert the qualifier ‘produced by an epistemic instrument that never gives rise to false awareness’? (avyabhicārikāraṇajanyatve satīti viseṣaṇīyam iti cet).

12. The sensitivity condition on knowledge was proposed by Nozick (1981), while the safety condition on knowledge proposed by Sosa (1999). Even though Sosa didn’t explicitly speak about methods, a fully fleshed out version of safety would have to do so; for discussion, see Pritchard (2005) and Lasonen-Aarnio (2010).

13. Śrīharṣa never explicitly states this principle. However, at Kkh 210, he says that

You cannot establish that accidentally true awareness is produced by a set of causal conditions shared by episodes of false awareness; for then even false awareness-episodes—insofar as they are produced by the same causal conditions—would be true (na ca kākatālīyasamvādam api jñānaṃ vyabhicārisādhāraṇasāmagrījanyam āsthātum īśiṣe; vyabhicāriṇo’pi kāraṇāviśeṣād yathārthatvaprasaṅgāt).

14. See, for example, Udayana’s own commentary on Nyāyakusumāñjali 2.1.

15. The only argument that Śrīharṣa gives for this principle in Khaṇḍanakhaṇḍakhādya (Kkh 210) is this:

The truth of this awareness-episode is not uncaused; for, if that were the case, since the truth of an awareness-episode would be causally undetermined, there would be cases of overgeneration [i.e., even false awareness-episodes could become true or cases of knowledge could turn out to be false] (na hy ahetukam evāsya yathārthatvam; niyāmakābhāvena atiprasaṅgāpātāt).

Also, see Ānandapūrṇa’s commentary on this sentence.

16. Udayana and his predecessors reject the KK principle, i.e., the principle that if one knows that p, then one knows that one knows that p. For Vācaspati Miśra and Udayana, knowledge of one’s knowledge is acquired by inference. However, there are different kinds of inference that might give rise to such higher-order knowledge, depending on what kind of epistemic situation one finds oneself in. In one kind of epistemic situation, the awareness-episode that an agent is assessing might be unfamiliar; in order to know whether she knows in such a scenario, the agent will need some independent evidence in favor of the reliability of the relevant awareness-episode. In cases of such unfamiliar awareness (anabhyāsa-daśāpanna-jñāna), therefore, the agent can infer that her awareness-episode is an instance of knowledge on the basis of the fact that it produces successful action (samarthapravṛttijanakatva). In the other kind of epistemic situation, the awareness-episode that the agent is assessing might be familiar, i.e., a kind of awareness-episode that she has undergone before. In the case of such familiar awareness (abhyāsa-daśāpanna-jñāna), the agent won’t need any new evidence to conclude that her awareness-episode is an instance of knowledge. She can infer that her awareness-episode is an instance of knowledge by appealing to what Vācaspati and Udayana call “sameness of sort” (tajjātīyatva) (Thakur 1967: 29; 95–97). The idea is somewhat plausible. Suppose I enter my office, and see that my computer is on my desk. I have had plenty of similar experiences before, and on those cases, I acquired knowledge. Since this awareness is of the same kind, I can with good reason infer, and thereby know, that I know that my computer is on my desk. In this case, “sameness of sort” is the guide to knowing that one knows.

Udayana points out that “sameness of sort” may pick different properties of an awareness-episode in different cases, but in each case, the property is sufficient to make the relevant awareness-episode knowledge. For instance, in the case of perceptual awareness, it is a perceptual awareness of an object with its distinctive mark (viśeṣa), i.e., some property that decisively indicates the presence of that object (lakṣaṇa-sahacarita-lakṣyaviṣayajñānatvam eva jñānagataṃ tajjātīyatvam iti). If an agent sees a person along with his characteristic features such as limbs, etc., at a distance, she can know it to be a person rather than say a tree-trunk. So, if one knows that one is perceptually aware of a person along with her distinctive mark of having limbs, etc., one can know that one knows that it’s a person. A similar story could also be told in the case of inference. The “sameness of sort” on the basis of which one could know an inferential awareness to be knowledge could consist in its being an inferential awareness of an unobserved object on basis of its distinctive mark. If I see a distinctive mark of fire, e.g., smoke, and infer the presence of fire on that basis, I will know that fire is present. Hence, if I know that I have seen a distinctive mark of fire and inferred the presence of fire on that basis, I will know that my inference yields knowledge. Finally, in the case of testimonial knowledge, the “sameness of sort” on the basis of which one could know that one knows consists in the relevant awareness-episode’s being a produced by the utterance of reliable speaker. However, Śrīharṣa constructs his proposal only on the basis of Udayana’s remarks about the “sameness of sort” that grounds ascriptions of knowledge to perceptual awareness-episodes.

17. This definition occurs at Kkh 30, where Śrīharṣa allows his opponent to clarify his definition and say that knowledge involves awareness of an object as having a distinctive mark, which it in fact has (viśeṣeṇa sahitasya padārthasyopalambhaḥ). This rules out cases of error from the scope of knowledge. For discussion of the earlier proposals, see Granoff (1978: 32–34).

18. This argument needn’t be convincing. In fact, as Śrīharṣa himself acknowledges, there are proposals that attempt to characterize the distinctive mark X in a more unified manner. One of these proposals (which Śrīharṣa extrapolates from Udayana’s discussion in The Discrimination of the Truth about the Self (Ātmatattvaviveka) (Śāstri 1940: 317)) provides the following characterization of the distinctive mark X: (i) when an agent isn’t aware of X, she can fall prey to doubt or error as to whether o is F, (ii) when an agent becomes aware of X, her doubt or erroneous awareness as to whether o is F is rebutted (for the new awareness reveals a property of the object that the agent missed earlier), and (iii) without accepting the existence of X, one cannot distinguish truth about o’s being F from a falsehood about the same subject-matter (KKh 228). However, according to Śrīharṣa, it is unclear how this proposal avoids the charge of non-uniformity raised earlier. Consider a case of perceptual illusion where an agent mistakes a piece of silver for a piece of tin. In such a scenario, if the agent later notices that the piece of silver possesses the property of silverhood, her new awareness may indeed rebut her previous erroneous awareness. In this scenario, therefore, silverhood is the distinctive mark, the awareness of which is necessary for knowing that the relevant object is a piece of silver. However, silverhood cannot play this role in a case where one mistakes a sea-shell for a piece of silver: a renewed awareness of silverhood in such a scenario will only end up confirming one’s previous error. This, once again, shows that the distinctive mark—the awareness of which is necessary for knowledge—will vary from one scenario to another (KKh 231). As Śrīharṣa points out, this problem cannot be blocked simply by requiring that the rebutting awareness be a piece of knowledge. On the one hand, the charge of non-uniformity would still stand. On the other hand, the definition would now be circular.

19. This definition of causal condition seems to resemble Hume’s (1748) regularity-based definition of cause: on this picture, a causal condition is just an entity that regularly precedes the effect (Ram-Prasad 2002: Section IV.1). However, it is also significantly different from Hume’s definition: the target of Hume’s definition is the notion of a cause, not the notion of a causal condition. That is why Hume analyzes the notion in terms of invariable succession, and not in terms of invariable precession: on Hume’s view, a cause is an event such that events similarly to it are regularly followed by events similar to the effect.

20. It is tempting to argue that this is a counterfactual definition of the notion of a causal condition similar in spirit to Lewis’ (1973) analysis of causal dependence. On one way of interpreting this definition, the definition says that a causal condition for an effect e is an entity without the presence of which the effect wouldn’t be produced. However, the definition could—somewhat anachronistically but perhaps more naturally—be interpreted as saying that a causal condition for an effect e is an entity c such that in every nearby possibility where e is produced, c precedes it. Śrīharṣa’s counterexample works for both these readings: the color of the threads is an entity without which the cloth couldn’t be produced, and in every nearby possibility where the cloth is produced, the color of the threads precedes it.

21. For discussion of Śaśadhara’s proposal, see Matilal (1975: 45–46; 1976: 12). For an instance of how this proposal was fleshed out later, see verse 16 of Kārikāvalī, a standard textbook of later Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophy, where the author Viśvanātha defines a causal condition that which is non-superfluous and invariably precedes the effect (anyathāsiddhiśūnya niyatapūrvavartitā). In his commentary Nyāyasiddhāntamuktāvalī on verse 19 of his Kārikāvalī, he goes on to describe five different kinds of non-superfluity.

22. In fact, Śrīharṣa offers two responses to this objection. The first response (which occurs at KKh 75ff) is this. Even if the deliverances of perception did conflict with the content of Upanisadic testimony, a perceptual awareness-episode would only rebut a part of that content: the part which talks about the non-distinctness from the self of the objects that are presented in the relevant perceptual awareness-episode. But we would still have a default entitlement to think that Upanisadic testimony produces knowledge with respect to the remainder of its content. If we grant this, then it will be very hard to ward off the doctrine of non-duality. For instance, even though a perceptual awareness-episode may present a cloth as distinct from a pot, it may not present itself as distinct from the perceived objects, namely the pot and the cloth. So, it is possible for Upanisadic testimony to establish the identity between the perceptual awarenesss-episode that there is a difference between the pot and the cloth, and the objects—the pot and the cloth—that are presented in perception. This in turn would clear room for the doctrine of non-duality. This is precisely the conclusion that Śrīharṣa wants: a perceptual awareness-episode cannot really rebut scriptural testimony. The argument seems a bit quick; especially, the premise that even though the content of perceptual awareness may contradict a part of the content of Upanisadic testimony, one could still be entitled to treat Upanisadic testimony as reliable with respect to rest of its content. One might think that the fact that Upanisadic sentences give us false information in one domain gives us some reason to thinking that it may be unreliable in other domains. But Śrīharṣa never addresses this worry.

23. This principle is inspired by a thesis that the Indian Buddhist philosopher Dharmakīrti (6th or 7th century CE) endorses in The Ascertainment of Epistemology (Pramāṇaviniścaya):

For someone who isn’t directly aware of her own awareness, a direct awareness of the object isn’t established either (apratyakṣopalambhasya nārthadṛṣtiḥ prasiddhyati). (KKh 45; Pramāṇaviniścaya 1.54cd)

The argument that follows, quite unsurprisingly, resembles a regress argument that Dharmakīrti offers in that text (Kellner 2011).

24. Before Śrīharṣa, other classical Indian philosophers—such as Kumārila, Śaṃkara, and Jayanta—have discussed versions of Meno’s paradox (Carpenter & Ganeri 2010). Consider, for instance, Śaṃkara’s variant of the puzzle (Shastri 1980: 79–83). Bādarāyaṇa’s Aphorisms on the Brahman begins with the sentence, “Now, therefore, [begins] an inquiry into the Brahman”. In his commentary, Śaṃkara poses the following dilemma: either it is well-known (prasiddha) what the Brahman is, or it is not so (aprasiddha). If it is well known what the Brahman is, then genuine inquiry will be impossible; for there will be no open question to settle. If it is not so well known what the Brahman is, even then genuine inquiry will be impossible; for the inquirer, then, won’t quite know what it is that she is inquiring after. Śaṃkara resolves the puzzle by pointing out that the nature of the Brahman is partly known: the etymology of the word “Brahman” tells us that it is pure and eternal, the Upaniṣads tell us that it is identical to the self, and everyone knows of the existence of his or her self. This information—even though it specifies the object of inquiry—is insufficient to settle the question of what Brahman is; for there is still a lot of disagreement about the nature of the self, and in effect, about the nature of the Brahman. The task for the inquirer is to adjudicate amongst the different views about the self, so as to discover the true nature of Brahman. This, effectively, resolves the puzzle.

Copyright © 2018 by
Nilanjan Das <>

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