First published Thu Feb 1, 2018

Śrīharṣa was an Indian philosopher and poet, who lived in northern India in the 12th century CE.[1] Śrīharṣa didn’t affiliate himself explicitly to any philosophical text tradition active in classical India. Some have argued that he was an advocate of Advaita Vedānta (Phillips 1995; Ram-Prasad 2002). Vedānta (literally, the end of the Vedas) is a family of competing philosophical interpretations of the texts called Upaniṣads that appear at the end of the Vedas.[2] Many texts of Vedānta are commentaries on the canonical summary of the Upaniṣads given by Bādarāyaņa’s Aphorisms on the Brahman (Brahmasūtra). Advaita Vedānta (i.e., non-dualistic Vedānta) is an interpretation of the Upaniṣads and Bādarāyaņa’s Aphorisms, according to which it is only the self or consciousness or Brahman that is ultimately real. The Indian philosopher Śaṃkara (7th century CE) defended this form of non-dualism in his commentary on Bādarāyaṇa’s Aphorisms. Śrīharṣa’s only surviving philosophical work[3] The Sweets of Refutation (Khaṇḍanakhaṇḍanakhādya) may be read as a defense of this kind of non-dualism, even though he doesn’t share all the standard commitments of Śaṃkara and his followers. This reading of Śrīharṣa, however, remains controversial (Granoff 1978).[4]

The broader appeal of Śrīharṣa’s work is independent of whether he was a defender of Advaita Vedānta. Throughout The Sweets of Refutation, Śrīharṣa’s aim is to demonstrate the instability of rational inquiry within philosophy. For any argument that a philosopher may offer for her view, there is always an equally persuasive counterargument that undermines its conclusion. Since the deliverances of reason are always vulnerable to rational defeat in this way, they cannot constitute good evidence for any philosophical view. To illustrate this idea, Śrīharṣa targets a philosophical method—what we may call the method of definition—pursued by Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers in informal logic, epistemology and metaphysics.[5] The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers use this method of definition to describe a number of ontological categories which are supposed to capture the structure of reality, and a number of epistemological and logical categories which are supposed to capture various components of rational inquiry. What the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher wishes to affirm in the end is a dualistic ontology: the commonsense view on which reality consists of a plurality of things distinct from the self or consciousness, e.g., material things, their qualities, relations amongst them, and so on. Śrīharṣa wants to show that any attempt at defining the epistemological, logical, and ontological categories that the dualist needs for the success of her project must fail: the very standards of rational inquiry that the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers adopt undermine their theoretical enterprise from within.

Śrīharṣa’s incisive arguments against Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika informal logic, epistemology and metaphysics were influential amongst the defenders of both Advaita Vedānta and Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophy.[6] However, they should also be of considerable interest to the contemporary reader. In the second half of the twentieth century, Anglophone philosophers have grappled with various difficulties that arise for definitions of epistemological notions like knowledge and metaphysical notions like causation. While attacking the method of definition pursued by the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers, Śrīharṣa anticipates many of these difficulties. His reaction to these difficulties is pessimistic: he takes these difficulties to demonstrate the futility of offering definitions for commonsense epistemological and ontological categories. Śrīharṣa’s arguments for this conclusion remain as relevant to our current philosophical concerns as they were to those of his contemporaries: if his arguments are successful, they will show that philosophical inquiry doesn’t really take us very far when it comes to illuminating fundamental epistemological and metaphysical concepts.

Since it is impossible to address all the philosophically interesting themes that emerge from Śrīharṣa’s work, most of our discussion in this article shall focus on a small number of topics that illustrate Śrīharṣa’s general approach to philosophical problems.

1. Method

This section describes the philosophical method that Śrīharṣa employs in The Sweets of Refutation, and explains what he sought to achieve by it.

1.1 The Method of Definition

Throughout The Sweets of Refutation, Śrīharṣa’s target is a theory of rational inquiry laid down in the Nyāya system. As defined by the commentator of the Aphorisms on Inquiry (Nyāyasūtra), Vātsyāyana (5th century CE), the term ‘nyāya’ stands just for critical or rational inquiry. He tells us,

Nyāya is the examination of an object using methods of knowing, consisting in reasoning based on perceptual and scriptural evidence. It is inquiry, where inquiry is just the examination of that which has been presented by perception or scripture. (Thakur 1967: 3)

The opening sentence of the Aphorisms on Inquiry is a list of sixteen items that constitute the subject-matter of the Nyāya system.

The highest good is achieved through the knowledge of the nature of:

  1. methods of knowing and knowable entities;
  2. uncertainty, purpose, public examples, settled opinion, extrapolative demonstration, suppositional reasoning, final conclusion;
  3. truth-directed debate, victory-directed debate, destructive debate, defective reasoning, tricks, checks, defeat situations (Nyāyasūtra 1.1.1, Thakur 1967: 2).

In his commentary, Vātsyāyana explains this text as follows. Every area of learning is concerned with a proprietary highest good, and makes available the kind of knowledge that is conducive to achieving that good; for instance, the science of the self (adhyātmavidyā) is concerned with the goal of liberation, and helps us achieve liberation by leading us to the knowledge of the true nature of the self (Thakur 1967: 5). But in order to gain the knowledge that any area of learning has to offer, one must inquire. A properly conducted episode of inquiry begins with an initial state of uncertainty regarding the nature of an object presumably in the domain of knowable entities, involves the application of various methods of knowing (such as perception, inference, testimony, etc.), and terminates in a final conclusion, which constitutes knowledge of the relevant object's nature. The items listed under (i) and (ii) are components of any such inquiry. When inquiry is conducted by several parties aloud in speech, it becomes a debate. The items listed under (iii) describe different styles of debate, and various strategies that one may employ in response to one's opponent within the arena of debate.

Vātsyāyana helpfully delineates the philosophical method that the Nyāya system, as laid out in the Aphorisms on Inquiry, uses in treating its subject matter. It proceeds in three steps (Thakur 1967: 181). The first step consists in enumeration (uddeśa), which involves mentioning the various items to be treated in the theory, e.g., in the lists (i), (ii), and (iii) given above. The second step consists in definition (lakṣaṇa) which involves laying down a defining property, i.e., a property that distinguishes the nature of the definiendum (tattvavyavacchedaka-dharma) (Ibid.).[7] The third consists in examination (parīkṣā), i.e., checking whether or not a certain definition is adequate. The philosopher’s project, on this view, is therefore to define a kind K by articulating necessary and sufficient conditions for being an instance of K, where K may be a method of knowing, a kind of knowable entity, a component of rational inquiry, a style of debate, or a dialectical strategy. This project was developed by the commentators and sub-commentators of the Aphorisms on Inquiry, and was ultimately absorbed into a larger syncretic tradition that combined the epistemological commitments of Nyāya with the ontological scheme of Vaiśeṣika philosophy and therefore came to be known as Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika.

There are two distinct purposes that Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers ascribe to definitions.

  1. Specifying the Definiendum. According to Vācaspati Miśra (9th century CE), a definition

    specifies the definiendum [i.e., the object to be defined] by distinguishing it from things of similar and dissimilar kinds (samānāsamānajātīyebhyo vyavacchidya lakṣyaṃ vyavasthāpayati). (Thakur 1967: 186)

    Suppose—following the early Vaiśeṣika philosophers—we define earth as the kind of substance that has the property of having smell. On the basis of this definition, we can make the following inference:

    The kind of substance under discussion is distinct from anything that isn’t earth; for it has smell. And anything that isn’t earth lacks smell, e.g., water.

    Thus, we are able to distinguish earth from non-earth in this manner.

  2. Establishing the Use of the Definiendum Term. In his Row of Light-Beams (Kiraṇāvalī), the later Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher Udayana (10th century CE) describes a different purpose that a definition may serve:

    alternatively, the purpose of a definition (or a defining property) is to establish the use [of the definiendum term, i.e., the expression that picks out the definiendum] (vyavahārasiddhir vā lakṣaṇa-prayojanam). (Sarvabhouma 1911 [1989: 194])

    To establish the use of the definiendum term is to specify the range of entities to which it is ordinarily applied. At least on one interpretation of Udayana, a definition does this by specifying the reason for which the relevant expression is applied (pravṛtti-nimitta), i.e., the application-conditions of that expression (Bhattacharyya 1990: 98–99; Granoff 1978: n. 74). Here, the application-conditions of an expression just consist in a property possessed by all and only referents of that expression. Take the definition of earth as that which possesses earthhood: this specifies the application-conditions of the expression ‘earth’ since people commonly apply the expression to things that possess earthhood. Using the definition, therefore, one can make an inference of the following sort,

    The kind of substance under discussion is commonly called ‘earth’; for it possesses earthhood. Whatever isn’t commonly called ‘earth’ doesn’t possess earthhood, e.g., wind.

    This inference, in turn, specifies the extension of the term ‘earth’ as it is commonly used.

Both these uses of definitions are important for understanding Śrīharṣa’s dialectical strategy in The Sweets of Refutation.

1.2 Refutation-Arguments

Throughout The Sweets of Refutation Śrīharṣa’s aim is to argue against Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers by means of what he calls refutation-arguments (khaṇḍana-yukti). Refutation-arguments against definitions are supposed to reveal that the relevant definitions are inadequate. In cases where no adequate definition is available for an entity, the relevant entity to be defined cannot be specified, i.e., distinguished from those things that are distinct from it.[8] This follows from the thesis, endorsed by Vācaspati Miśra, that the purpose of a definition is to specify the definiendum by distinguishing it from things that are distinct from it. So, if Śrīharṣa’s refutation-arguments are successful in showing that there exists no adequate definition for any of the ontological, logical, and epistemological categories that the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher seeks to define, then she will have failed to specify those categories that are essential to her theoretical enterprise.

Śrīharṣa describes two ways in which his refutation-arguments could be useful. First of all, they are supposed to favor the kind of non-dualism—defended by supporters of Advaita Vedānta—which says that the self or consciousness is the only thing that is ultimately exists. According to Śrīharṣa, the refutation-arguments show that we cannot establish the ultimate reality of the variegated world as it appears in perceptual experience, the world which appears to be constituted by a plurality of things and whose existence we assume for our everyday practical purposes (KKh 63). This is because we cannot adequately define the various ontological and epistemological categories—such as difference, causation, relation, knowledge, perception, etc.—using which we make sense of that world and our epistemic relationship with it. It is in this sense that the variegated world as it appears to us in perception is indeterminable (anirvicanīya).[9] And in the absence of such definitions, the distinctions amongst these constituents of reality and our methods of knowing them cannot be treated as ultimately real. This in turn will clear room for non-dualism.

Second, even though the main purpose of refutation-arguments is to show that the plurality of things in the world shouldn’t be treated as ultimately real, Śrīharṣa claims that they may also prove useful for the opponents of non-dualism. For instance, if one is a Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher who admits the reality of methods of knowing, etc., then one may use at least some of the refutation-arguments to rule out alternative views held by other philosophers, including the views of their predecessors within the same school as well as their opponents. Moreover, even in the kind of debate where one is engaged in the pursuit of truth and doesn’t merely seek to defeat one’s opponent, one would have to respond to refutation-arguments before one could arrive at one’s own view. Thus, refutation-arguments have universal application (KKh 123–125).

While offering his arguments, Śrīharṣa explicitly appeals to three criteria of adequacy for definitions which he takes to be common ground between himself and his opponents.

  1. The first is a criterion of extensional adequacy: an adequate definition of a kind K should state the conditions that are necessary and sufficient for being an instance of K. First of all, the definition shouldn’t fail to apply all instances of K. Second, it shouldn’t be underextended, i.e., there shouldn’t be cases of K where the definition doesn’t apply. Third, it shouldn’t be overextended, i.e., there shouldn’t be things that are not of kind K where the definition applies.
  2. The second criterion of adequacy for definitions—also widely endorsed by Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers- is the criterion of non-circularity: an adequate definition must not be circular, i.e., a definition of a kind K must not mention any kind K* such that in order to know what K* is, an agent would (directly or indirectly) need a prior understanding of what K is.
  3. The third criterion of adequacy that Śrīharṣa invokes is slightly more controversial. It is the criterion of uniformity (anugama): an adequate definition of a kind K should identify a single property that uniformly characterizes all instances of K. This criterion entails that an adequate definition of a kind K should be non-disjunctive, i.e., it should not list a number of different properties A, B, C,…, satisfying one of which is sufficient for being an instance of K, but satisfying any one of which may not be necessary for being an instance of K.

The latter two criteria of adequacy seem to appeal to the two different conceptions of definitions mentioned above.

The criterion of non-circularity seems to follow straightforwardly from the conception of definition on which a definition is supposed to lay down a distinguishing property of a kind K, which in turn can help us distinguish instances of K from all other objects. This seems to entail that the definition of K can’t appeal directly or indirectly back to K itself; for then it would be unhelpful when it comes to distinguishing instances of K from other entities. But if the purpose of a definition is to capture the application-conditions of the definiendum term, then the criterion of non-circularity doesn’t make much sense; for the concept on the basis of which the definiendum term is used might be unanalyzable independently of itself, so no non-circular definition might be available for it.

By contrast, the criterion of uniformity seems to be connected with the second conception of definition on which the purpose of a definition is to establish the use of the definiendum term. If the expression is applied to a number of distinct entities, we might expect that these entities share some unifying property in virtue of which the same expression is applied to them. A definition—insofar as it is intended to capture the application-conditions of the definiendum term—would be inadequate if it didn’t capture this unifying property.[10] But if the purpose of a definition is only to lay down a distinguishing property for the definiendum, then the criterion of uniformity doesn’t make much sense; for the only distinguishing property for the definiendum may well be a motley disjunction of different properties.

2. Epistemology

This section examines Śrīharṣa’s treatment of definitions of knowledge (pramā).

2.1 The Challenge of Epistemic Luck

The very first definition of knowledge that Śrīharṣa attacks is offered by Udayana in his Garland of Definitions (Lakṣaṇamālā) (Jhā 1963: 3).

  • knowledge i Knowledge is non-mnemonic awareness of the truth (tattvānubhūti).

After offering a long series of objections against the definitions of truth (tattva) and non-mnemonic awareness (anubhūti), Śrīharṣa proceeds to give a general argument against this definition: it overextends to the case of accidentally true (kākatālīya-samvāda) awareness (KKh 207–208). He then proceeds to give some examples of such accidentally true awareness that we can flesh out as follows.

Shells. Holding five shells in his closed fist, a bookie asks the gambler, “How many shells do I have in my hand?” The gambler hasn’t seen the contents of the bookie’s hand, but, for some reason, he has a hunch that there are five shells in the bookie’s hand. On that basis, he judges that there are five shells in the bookie’s hand. So, he replies, “Five.” Does that mean that he knows this claim? Surely not: the gambler has hit the truth merely accidentally (KKh 208).

Mist. You look at a far-away hill, and see what looks like smoke emerging from it. So, you judge that there is smoke on the hill. Since you know that fire always accompanies smoke, you infer, “There’s fire on the hill.” In fact, what you saw was just mist, but there is in fact fire on the hill. Your awareness therefore is true, but is it knowledge? Once again, you have only accidentally hit the truth, and therefore you lack knowledge (KKh 211).

Horns. An animal comes into your view, but you are unable to tell what it is. A little later, as you get closer, you see horns on the animal’s head. Falsely, you believe that only cows have horns. So, you infer, “That animal is a cow.” Your awareness is true, but only accidentally so. That is why you lack knowledge (KKh 213).

These are cases of epistemic luck: in each case, the protagonist hits the truth, but only luckily so. That is why he or she lacks knowledge. Śrīharṣa’s discussion of these counterexamples to the “true awareness” account of knowledge is significant for two reasons.

First of all, Mist and Horns clearly conform to the structure of standard Gettier cases; similar examples are also discussed by classical Indian philosophers such as Dharmottara, Kumārila, and Srīdhara (Matilal 1986: ch. 4; Ganeri 2007: ch. 5; Stoltz 2007). Even though Śrīharṣa doesn’t intend these examples to be counterexample to any “justified true belief” account of knowledge, he does seem to think that in order to rule out cases of this kind from the scope of knowledge, we need to impose an anti-luck condition on knowledge. And this is precisely the lesson that philosophers have drawn from the cases of epistemic luck described by Gettier (1963). What this suggests is that the kind of intuitions that Gettier and others were trying to elicit with such cases are not intuitions shared by a narrow group of Anglophone philosophers. This, in turn, casts doubt on arguments—offered by early researchers in experimental philosophy (Weinberg et al 2001; Weinberg 2007)—which sought to debunk Gettier intuitions by showing that they might just have been artifacts of a certain culture. The history of Indian philosophy in Sanskrit shows that even in classical India, Gettier phenomena were recognized as a potential problem for theories of knowledge that didn’t include any anti-luck condition. This, one might argue, should bolster our confidence in treating such intuitions as evidence in philosophical inquiry.

Second, and perhaps more importantly, Śrīharṣa uses these cases to argue that there may not after all be any satisfactory definition of knowledge. Even though Śrīharṣa’s criticisms are directed against proposals of knowledge defended by his predecessors and contemporaries, his arguments remain relevant to today’s discussions of knowledge. On the one hand, he anticipates some of the problems that arise for recent attempts at solving the Gettier problem, e.g., ­conditions like sensitivity and safety and theories like the relevant alternatives theory. On the other hand, he also claims that the problem posed by cases of epistemic luck cannot be avoided simply by treating knowledge—as Williamson (2000) does—as analytically primitive. The following three sections survey some of these arguments.

2.2 Knowledge as Awareness Produced by the Right Method

Immediately after considering Shells, Śrīharṣa entertains the following modification of the “true awareness” account of knowledge.

  • knowledge ii An awareness-episode has the status of knowledge if and only if it is a true, non-recollective awareness-episode that is produced by a method which never produces false awareness-episodes (avyabhicārikaraṇajanya).[11]

Śrīharṣa goes on to gloss this proposal as saying that knowledge consists in non-recollective awareness of the truth produced by a set of causal conditions (kāraṇa-sāmagrī)—which includes the method (karaṇa) as well as background causal conditions—that never produce false awareness (see footnote 11). Presumably, the defender of this proposal would want to say that in cases of accidentally true awareness, the causal conditions that produce the awareness-episode could easily have given rise to false awareness. For instance, in Shells, the causal conditions that give rise to the relevant episode of awareness could also have produced the awareness that the bookie had five shells in his hand when he in fact had four. In this respect, knowledge ii resembles anti-luck conditions like safety and sensitivity, both of which appeal to methods that don’t produce false beliefs in nearby possibilities.[12]

Śrīharṣa sees a danger of extensional inadequacy here: the new clause in the definition of knowledge is unable to rule out accidentally true awareness from the scope of knowledge. Śrīharṣa’s argument relies on the following principle.

  • the sufficiency principle If an awareness-episode is true and non-recollective, then the causal conditions that give rise to the relevant awareness-episode are together causally sufficient to give rise to a true awareness-episode, i.e., they couldn’t give rise to a false awareness-episode.[13]

The principle in fact falls out of Śrīharṣa’s Nyāya-Vaiśesika opponent’s view. For most Nyāya-Vaiśesika philosophers, the status of an awareness-episode as knowledge and therefore its status as true and non-recollective is causally explained solely by certain epistemic virtues (guṇa) that reside in the causal conditions that give rise to it.[14] If this is the case, then the truth of a non-recollective awareness-episode should be explained solely in terms of those epistemic virtues. Hence, if an awareness-episode is true and non-recollective, then the causal conditions that give rise to the relevant awareness-episode—in virtue of the epistemic virtues that reside in them—should suffice to give rise to a true awareness-episode in every case, i.e., they couldn’t give rise to a false awareness-episode.

Now, if the sufficiency principle is correct, then the same set of causal conditions that gives rise to an accidentally true awareness-episode couldn’t possibly give rise to a false awareness-episode. Otherwise, we would be committed to something absurd, namely that even false awareness-episodes are true. The only other option is to grant that the set of causal conditions that gives rise to a true awareness-episode can only give rise to true awareness-episodes. In that case, the proposed definition of knowledge would be incapable of ruling out instances of accidentally true awareness.

However, one might suspect that the sufficiency principle is not true after all. For instance, in cases like Shells, it does seem as if the causal conditions that give rise the agent’s awareness could also produce false awareness. Moreover, nothing Śrīharṣa says in fact decisively supports this principle.[15] But it is worth pointing out that Śrīharṣa needs nothing as strong as the sufficiency principle to make the point that he wants to make. The general objection seems to be this. Suppose we explain the status of any awareness-episode as knowledge by appealing to the good-making features of the relevant causal mechanism—the putative epistemic virtues of the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher—that gives rise to it. We may say that these epistemic virtues are the ones that guarantee that the awareness-episode won’t be false. But an accidentally true awareness-episode is one which is produced by a causal mechanism that lacks all of these knowledge-conducive epistemic virtues, and that is why it isn’t guaranteed to be true. This explains why such awareness-episodes seem true as a matter of luck. But the problem is this. No matter what these truth-guaranteeing epistemic virtues are, it will always be possible to find episodes of awareness which are produced by causal mechanisms that possess all these virtues, but nevertheless only accidentally true. In this sense, even if the new definition of knowledge is fleshed out in terms of knowledge-conducive epistemic virtues, it won’t be able to rule out cases of knowledge-destroying epistemic luck. So, the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher’s appeal to causal conditions that would never give rise to false awareness-episodes seems mistaken.

Here is another kind of method-based solution that Śrīharṣa takes up a little later in the text (KKh 238).

  • knowledge iii Knowledge is the non-mnemonic awareness of the truth produced by a non-defective method (aduṣṭakaraṇajanya).

The rationale for the proposal, once again, is clear. In cases like Shells, there is something defective about the manner in which the agent arrives at his or her final awareness: in the first case, it is a blind guess, and in the latter two, it is a perceptual error.

Śrīharṣa notes that this definition won’t be informative unless his opponent specifies what defectiveness consists in. Suppose a defender of knowledge iii says,

It is a distinctive property which is conducive to the production of contrary awareness-episodes and which is possessed by the causal conditions that give rise to such awareness-episodes (viparītajñānaprayojakas taddhetugato viśeṣaḥ). (KKh 238)

But what are contrary awareness-episodes? The opponent cannot say that contrary awareness-episodes are just false awareness-episodes, because that would make this proposal equivalent to knowledge ii; for, now, knowledge iii will just entail that knowledge is non-mnemonic awareness of the truth produced by a method that doesn’t possess a property that is conducive to the production of false awareness-episodes. If the qualifier “contrary” is supposed to rule out knowledge, then the opponent won’t be able to define knowledge in knowledge-independent terms. Therefore, her definition of knowledge will be circular.

Once again, the charge of circularity generalizes quite nicely to other proposals that appeal to the notion of method or causal process. The general argument is that if we want to rule out accidentally true awareness from the scope of knowledge by appealing to the non-defectiveness of methods, then we need a non-circular account of epistemic defects that can be stated in knowledge-independent terms. Śrīharṣa is skeptical that such a non-circular account is available.

2.3 Knowledge as Discrimination

Śrīharṣa considers another proposal—defended by Udayana and Bhāsarvajña (10th century CE)—according to which knowledge is “proper circumscription” (samyak-paricchitti) (Upādhyāya & Śāstri 1957: 475; Svāmī Yogīndrānanda 1968: 11). In explaining this definition, Śrīharṣa says that “proper circumscription” can’t just mean true or correct awareness; for then this proposal will inherit all the problems that the “true awareness” account of knowledge faces. So, he reconstructs this proposal on the basis of some remarks that Udayana makes elsewhere while discussing knowledge of one’s knowledge.[16]

According to the reconstructed proposal, knowledge is proper circumscription of an object in the sense that it involves an awareness of an object along with (or on the basis of) its distinctive mark (viśeṣasahita-dharmi-paricchitti). The best version of this proposal—which Śrīharṣa arrives at after considering a series of initial refinements—seems to be this.

  • knowledge iv Knowledge is proper circumscription of an object, i.e., an agent knows that an object o is F if and only if she is aware of o as having a property X which it in fact has, such that X distinguishes o from all non-Fs.[17]

On this picture, knowledge involves discrimination: in order to know that an object o is F, one must be able to discriminate o from things that are not F. Knowledge gives the agent this ability insofar as it involves an awareness-episode that puts the agent in touch with a genuine feature of the object o in virtue of which she can distinguish o from non-Fs. We can see how this definition rules out cases like Shells, Mist, and Horns. In Shells, since the agent’s awareness-episode arises from a blind guess, he or she isn’t aware of any distinctive mark X in virtue of which she could tell whether the number of shells in the gambler’s hand is five rather than, say, three or four. Similarly, in Mist, the agent mistakes mist for smoke. Even though smoke is a distinctive mark of fire, the smoke that she ascribes to the mountain isn’t a property that the mountain actually has. Finally, in Horns, the agent infers that the animal before her is a cow on the basis of the fact that it has horns. But horns aren’t a distinctive mark of cows.

Śrīharṣa argues that this definition of knowledge fails to satisfy the criterion of uniformity; for the relevant distinctive mark—the awareness of which is necessary for knowledge—will vary from one case to another. For example, when it comes to an awareness of a clod of earth as earth, the distinctive property X would have to be a property distinctive of earth, e.g., earthhood or having smell, etc. But when it comes to recognizing a cow as a cow, the distinctive property X would have to be something else: a property that is distinctive of cows, e.g., cowhood or having a dewlap, etc. In general, Śrīharṣa claims that there is no way of uniformly characterizing this distinctive property X that an agent needs to be aware of in order to have knowledge.[18]

More importantly, Śrīharṣa suggests that even if there are uniform characterizations of the notion of a distinctive mark, such characterizations will inevitably be uninformative. To show this, he considers a minimal pair of cases which we may flesh out as follows.

  • Castor and Pollux. Uma and Una are talking to two distinct speakers: Una is talking to a reliable speaker Castor, while Uma is talking to an unreliable speaker Pollux. Both Castor and Pollux correctly inform them that there are five fruits hanging from the tree on the river-bank. However, on the basis of the relevant bits of testimony, only Una knows that there are five fruits hanging from the tree on river-bank, but Uma doesn’t (KKh 230).

The challenge is this. Both Uma and Una get the same information from the relevant speakers. But in order to explain the difference in epistemic status between their awareness-episodes, the defender of knowledge iv needs to show that Una is aware of a distinctive mark X in virtue of which she can tell that there are five fruits hanging from the tree on the river-bank, but Uma isn’t aware of any such distinctive mark. But we could just stipulate that in Castor and Pollux, there is no property X such that Una is aware of X on the basis of Castor’s testimony, but Uma is not aware of X on the basis of Pollux’s testimony. This shows that we cannot clearly identify the distinctive mark X in every case of knowledge.

For Śrīharṣa, without any adequate uniform and informative characterization of the distinctive mark X, the definition of knowledge as proper circumscription of the object ought to be rejected (for other objections that he offers, see Ganeri 2016). This charge seems to be getting at something general about a class of different approaches towards defining knowledge. Several contemporary theories of knowledge involve a conception of knowledge as involving a discriminatory capacity of some kind. Take, for instance, the relevant alternatives theory which says that in order to know a proposition P, an agent must be able to rule out relevant possibilities where P is false (Stine 1976; Goldman 1976; Dretske 1981; Lewis 1996). However, as it turns out, which possibilities count as relevant will vary from one scenario to another, and perhaps also from one context of knowledge-attribution to another. In particular cases, we might indeed be able to tell whether a certain alternative counts as relevant or not. But it is unclear that we could systematize these intuitions enough to produce a single unified criterion of relevance; or, even if we did manage to do so, it is unclear whether such a criterion would be informative enough to generate predictions about every possible scenario. Thus, once again, Śrīharṣa’s worry generalizes.

2.4 Knowledge as Primitive

These problems are not the only problems that Śrīharṣa raises for various definitions of knowledge, but they are useful insofar as they give us a clear understanding of what he takes to be an adequate definition of knowledge. He seems to think that a definition of knowledge should give us a unified decision procedure which will allow us to correctly predict whether any particular awareness-episode is an instance of knowledge without appealing back to the notion of knowledge itself. Moreover, insofar as he appeals to our intuitions about cases, he also seems to assume that this decision procedure should respect (to some extent) our ordinary concept of knowledge. But one might respond to Śrīharṣa by pointing out that this approach only makes sense if we assume that the concept of knowledge is analyzable in terms of more basic concepts that do not refer back to knowledge. What if we deny this assumption and claim, with writers like Williamson (2000), that the ordinary concept of knowledge is unanalyzable in that manner?

Śrīharṣa entertains a proposal that connects up nicely with this question (KKh 245). He imagines an opponent who says that

  • knowledge v An awareness-episode constitutes knowledge if and only if it is an instance of the natural kind property (jāti) knowledgehood.

Śrīharṣa is skeptical of the idea that knowledgehood is a natural kind property. But even if we set that topic aside, it is not difficult to see that this proposal essentially seeks to avoid Śrīharṣa’s objections against the definability of knowledge, by treating the concept of knowledge as unanalyzable in knowledge-independent terms.

Śrīharṣa imagines the defender of this proposal to be someone who thinks that our ordinary self-ascriptions of knowledge reliably track the presence of knowledgehood in various awareness-episodes. But this can only be the case if there is some kind of causal connection between knowledgehood and our self-ascriptions of knowledge, i.e., if knowledgehood causally regulates our self-ascriptions of knowledge. But surely, Śrīharṣa argues, knowledgehood can only give rise to self-ascriptions of knowledge insofar as we are aware that knowledgehood is instantiated in various awareness-episodes. When we sincerely say that some awareness-episode constitutes knowledge, we have to be antecedently aware of knowledgehood as instantiated in that awareness-episode.

Then, the question will be: How do we determine whether an awareness-episode is an instance of knowledgehood? Even when the awareness-episode is our own, we cannot ascertain whether it is knowledge by introspection alone; for, even though we may be aware of an awareness-episode by introspection, we could still doubt or be mistaken as to whether it is knowledge. So, it seems that we can only determine whether an awareness-episode constitutes knowledge by means of inference on the basis of some kind of symptom. Are there many such symptoms or one? If there is just one symptom distinct from knowledgehood, we should just treat that as the defining property of knowledge; so, defining knowledge in terms of knowledgehood makes no sense. But if there are many such symptoms, we need to say which ones they are; for Śrīharṣa has already argued that the widely accepted definitions of knowledge are inadequate and therefore cannot be reliable symptoms of knowledge.

The upshot is this. Anyone who defines knowledge in terms of knowledgehood and therefore abandons the project of defining knowledge in knowledge-independent terms cannot offer any satisfactory story about how we in fact ascribe knowledgehood to various awareness-episodes. In the absence of such a story, there is no reason to think that there is a genuine property of knowledgehood that we are tracking through our practices of knowledge-attribution. Thus, the project of defining knowledge in terms of knowledgehood fails.

3. Metaphysics

A significant part of The Sweets of Refutation is devoted to the question of whether various items in the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika ontology can be satisfactorily defined. In the Aphorisms on the Vaiśeṣika System (Vaiśeṣika-sūtra), Kaṇāda (2nd century CE) offered an ontological scheme that included six positive categories (bhāva-padārtha-s), namely, substance (dravya), quality (guṇa), action (karma), universal (sāmānya), ultimate differentiator (viśeṣa), and the relation of inherence (samavāya). In Of the Seven Categories (Saptapadārthī), the later Vaiśeṣika philosopher Śivādityamiśra (12th century CE) added the negative category of absence (abhāva) to the list. This scheme of seven ontological categories was adopted by Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers like Udayana who combined this ontological scheme with the epistemological commitments of Nyāya. In the fourth chapter of The Sweets of Refutation, Śrīharṣa sets himself the task of dismantling this ontological scheme: he begins by attacking the notion of a positive category, and then attacks the definitions of substance, universal, ultimate differentiator, relation, and absence.

Along the way, he focuses attention on two key items in the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika ontology: causation and distinctness. Without these two items, the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher cannot defend the claim that there is a plurality of things in the world that are distinct from consciousness or the self. Once causation is out of the picture, the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher cannot explain how our conscious awareness-episodes can be brought about by mind-independent objects. Analogously, without distinctness, the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher cannot claim that we have any reason to believe that there is a plurality of objects in the world. This section shall outline Śrīharṣa’s discussion of causation and distinctness.

3.1 Causation

On the standard picture that almost all classical Indian philosophers work with, the relata of the causal relation are not just events, but are rather things (which may include events). When a lumberjack chops down a tree with his axe, the relata of the relevant causal relation are not the event of the tree’s falling (i.e., the effect) and the event of the lumberjack hitting the tree with his axe. Rather, the causal relation holds between the event of the tree’s falling (i.e., the effect) and a set of distinct entities, e.g., the axe, the lumberjack who wields the axe, the contact between the tree and the axe, etc. Call these causally relevant factors the causal conditions (kāraṇa) for the falling of the tree.

In the fourth chapter of The Sweets of Refutation, Śrīharṣa argues that the notion of a causal condition cannot be defined. This section takes a closer look at Śrīharṣa’s arguments against one definition of causal conditions offered originally by Udayana in his Flower Offerings of Reason (Nyāyakusumāñjali) under verses 1.13 and 1.19.

  • causation=invariable conjunction A causal condition relevant to the production of an effect e is an entity that invariably (niyatatvena) precedes e.

As Śrīharṣa notes (KKh 710), this definition can be fleshed out in at least two ways, depending on how we understand the expression ‘invariably.’ Here is the first interpretation.

  • causation=invariable conjunction i A causal condition relevant to the production of an effect e is an entity c which is unconditionally (anaupādhikatvena) present before e is produced.

An effect e is unconditionally preceded by a condition c if and only if there is no third condition c* such that c is present only when c* is also present, but, sometimes e is produced without c* being present before it. In other words, a condition e is unconditionally preceded by a condition c if and only if whenever e is produced, c is present before it.[19]

Śrīharṣa argues that this proposal falls prey to what we may call the problem of spurious correlations. Take a scenario where an entity c and an effect e share a common cause, e.g., the first unclear symptoms of a disease and the later more pronounced symptoms of it. Here, there is a common cause for both sets of symptoms: the disease itself (or perhaps, the conditions that produce the disease). The first set of symptoms accompanies the second set unconditionally. There is no third condition c* such that the first set of symptoms are produced only if c* is present, but c* is sometimes absent from cases where the second set of symptoms is present. This makes the connection between the two sets of symptoms unconditional, but that doesn’t make the first set of symptoms causally relevant to the second.

The other interpretation of causation=invariable conjunction cashes out the expression ‘invariably’ using modal vocabulary.

  • causation=invariable conjunction ii A causal condition relevant to the production of an effect e is an entity c which is necessarily (avaśyambhāvitvena) present before e is produced.[20]

According to Śrīharṣa, this definition doesn’t work because it suffers from the problem of irrelevance (even though the problem also seems to arise for the previous proposal). It would predict that even intuitively causally irrelevant factors which are necessarily present before the production of an effect are causally relevant to the production of that effect. For instance, it predicts that just as the threads that constitute a cloth are causally relevant to the production of the cloth, so also is the color of those threads causally relevant to the production of the cloth, when it intuitively isn’t.

In order to care of problems of this kind, one might modify this proposal in the following manner (KKh 705).

  • causation=invariable conjunction ii* A causal condition relevant to the production of an effect e is an entity c which is necessarily and non-superfluously (ananyathāsiddhatvena) present before e is produced.

A proposal of this kind was possibly first defended by Śaśadhara (fl. 1125 CE), and became popular amongst later Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers.[21] Non-superfluity (ananyathāsiddhi) is defined as the property of not being established otherwise, i.e., independently of the effect (kāryād anyaprakāreṇa na siddhiḥ). causation=invariable conjunction ii* is supposed to take care of the problem of irrelevance. The general thought is that factors that are intuitively causally irrelevant to an effect are established not on the basis of the effect, but on the basis of something else. For example, the color of the threads is established on the basis of the threads themselves, and therefore established independently of the effect.

But this move won’t work (KKh 705–706). There are two salient ways of interpreting the definition of non-superfluity, depending on how we understand the notion of “establishing” (siddhi). According to the first, a non-superfluous condition is one which isn’t brought about independently of the effect (kāryād anyaprakāreṇa na niṣpattiḥ). But clearly a causal condition isn’t brought about by the effect; rather, it is the causal factor that contributes to the production of the effect! According to the second interpretation, a non-superfluous condition is one which isn’t cognized independently of the effect (kāryād anyaprakāreṇa na jñaptiḥ). But if this is correct, then our definition of causal relevance should predict that we always become aware of causal conditions on the basis of their effects. That’s just not true. Sometimes, we infer the existence of rain-bearing clouds on the basis of rain, but at other times, we know it simply by looking up at the sky. Setting aside these interpretations, one might claim that a condition that is non-superfluous with respect to an effect is one which isn’t brought about or known in any way other than as a causal condition relevant to that effect. But then the definition would be circular; for, now, in trying to define the notion of a causal condition, we are appealing back to that very notion.

As in the case of knowledge, Śrīharṣa is eventually led to consider the question of whether we should treat the property of causal relevance (kāraṇatva) as primitive. Could we define a causal condition as just that which possesses the property of causal relevance? Śrīharṣa says that this would only be a reasonable strategy if there were some independent reason for thinking that there is such a property. But neither perception nor inference gives us any reason to believe this. Here, Śrīharṣa addresses an argument—offered by Udayana in The Flower Offering of Reason (Nyāyakusumāñjali) 1.5—for the claim that the existence of causal conditions can be established by a form of inference. Udayana’s main premise is that any putative effect is an occasional (kādācitka) entity, i.e., an entity that only arises at certain times and not at others. In order to explain this occasionality, we need to posit a causal condition that brings the putative effect into existence. If that were not the case, then the production of the putative effect—its coming into existence (bhavana)—wouldn’t depend on anything; then, it would be produced all the time (Upādhyāya & Śāstri 1957: 51).

Śrīharṣa offers two responses to this simple, yet powerful, argument. The first response takes issue with the notion of explanation that Udayana invokes in his argument (KKh 715–716). Śrīharṣa subscribes to the following principle.

  • principle of explanation If a property X explains a property Y, then X and Y must be properties of the same entity.

The intuitive motivation for this principle seems to be that we cannot explain the property Y possessed by an entity e by appealing to a property X possessed by a completely distinct entity. For instance, in order to explain Devadatta’s obesity, we shouldn’t appeal to the gluttony of some person other than Devadatta, but rather to Devadatta’s own overconsumption of food. But Udayana is essentially trying to explain the occasionality of a putative effect by appealing to the property of causal relevance that something else possesses. This violates the principle of explanation.

Now, one might attempt to resolve this problem by pointing out that just as putative effects are occasional entities, i.e., they appear now and then, so also are all their causal conditions occasional entities. So, causal relevance and occasionality can indeed be properties of the same entity. Thus, there is no violation of the principle of explanation. Śrīharṣa shows that this leads to an infinite regress of explanations. To explain the occasionality of a putative effect, we appeal to another occasional entity, namely its causal condition. But then in order to explain the occasionality of this causal condition, we would have appeal to yet another causal condition, thus launching us on an explanatory regress.

However, the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher might bite the bullet on this challenge. She might say that not all cases of explanatory regress are bad, so there is no harm in positing a beginningless chain of causes and effects. In response, Śrīharṣa is happy to grant that not all explanatory regresses are vicious. But if an explanatory regress involving occasionality and causal relevance is to get off the ground, we would have to cite at least one case where the occasionality of a putative effect e is in fact explained by the causal relevance of a distinct entity c. The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher is yet to show that; in fact, she is appealing to the infinite explanatory regress in order to establish that claim.

Moreover, even if one denies the principle of explanation, there is second, much shorter, response to Udayana’s argument. In Udayana’s argument, the occasionality of the putative effect is the explanandum, while the causal relevance of the causal condition is the explanans. Śrīharṣa asks whether there is a relation between these two properties. If there is no relation, the explanandum could indeed obtain without the explanans. In that case, the explanation wouldn’t really work. If there is a relation, Śrīharṣa could offer another regress argument that applies to relations in general. The thought is this. Suppose there are two entities a and b such that whenever b occurs, a also occurs. So, there must be a relation R between a and b that explains this pattern of co-occurrence. The question is this: How is R related to a and b? If we say that there is no further relation R* by which a or b is related to R, then, again, we would be unable to explain the correlation between a and b. If we acknowledge that there is such a relation, we could ask again how a or b is related to R*. Thus, an infinite regress will be unavoidable.

3.2 Distinctness

Śrīharṣa’s discussion of distinctness—the property in virtue of which an object is recognized as distinct from another—is deeply connected with his commitment to a form of non-dualism. In the first chapter of The Sweets of Refutation, Śrīharṣa raises the question of how one knows that the self alone is ultimately real. The answer is simple: the Upaniṣads—insofar as they literally proclaim that there is no plurality of objects in the world—provide evidence for this claim. But this answer runs into trouble pretty quickly: the Upaniṣads cannot be trusted with regard to their literal content, since that content is contradicted by the deliverances of perception. The world, as we see it, is populated by a plurality of objects (KKh 74). It is this objection that motivates Śrīharṣa to argue against the ultimate reality of distinctness of objects.[22]

Śrīharṣa offers several arguments against distinctness, the first and the most important of which appears in the first chapter of the Sweets of Refutation (for a more elaborate treatment discussion, see Phillips 1995: 103–110). Śrīharṣa claims that distinctness of one object from another must either be (a) the very nature of the object (svarūpa), (b) mutual absence (anyonyābhāva), (c) difference in properties (vaidharmya), and (d) something else, like separateness (pṛthaktva). Proposals (a), (b) and (c) are accepted by Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers such as Udayana (Śāstrī 1940: 255), and (d) is accepted by Bhāsarvajña (Yogīndrānanda 1968: 160) and Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsakas (Kunhan Raja & Sastri 1933: 242). Śrīharṣa’s contention is this: Irrespective of how we define distinctness, no awareness—perceptual or otherwise—can present one object as distinct from another, without also presenting them as non-distinct (KKh 96–110). This, in turn, shows that even perceptual awareness of distinctness cannot contradict the Upanisadic testimony about non-distinctness of all objects.

Consider, for instance, proposal (a): namely, the distinctness of an entity x from an entity y is just the nature of x. Now, note that the distinctness of an entity x from an entity y is a relational property of x, i.e., x has that property only in virtue of being related in some way to y. But this relational property is constituted by y. So, if this relational property is the very nature of x, then y constitutes the very nature of x. By similar reasoning, if y is distinct from x, and this distinctness is a relational property of y, then x constitutes the very nature of y. For any two entities x and y, if x constitutes the very nature of y and y constitutes the very nature of x, then they are identical. Thus, Śrīharṣa arrives at his desired conclusion: a perceptual awareness of the difference of a cloth from a pot, would also reveal that the pot and the cloth are in fact identical.

Now, take proposal (b): namely, that distinctness consists in mutual exclusion. In treating distinctness as mutual exclusion, Śrīharṣa’s opponent essentially has said that to ascribe to an entity x the distinctness from y is to ascribe to x an absence of the property of being identical to y. But this raises a problem for his Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika opponent: by the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher’s own doctrine, the counter-positive (pratiyogin) of an absence—the entity that an absence is an absence of—must be ultimately real. For instance, according to the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher, it makes no sense to say that there is an absence of turtle-fur on the ground (since turtles don’t really have fur), but it does make sense to say that a turtle doesn’t have fur (since fur in fact does exist). So, if a cloth is to be characterized by the absence of the property of being identical to a pot, the cloth’s identity with the pot must be ultimately real. Once again, Śrīharṣa gets what he wanted: a perceptual awareness of the distinctness of a cloth from a pot would also reveal the identity between the pot and the cloth.

A similar result can be obtained for proposal (c) by means of a regress argument. According to proposal (c), distinctness consists in a difference in properties. If the distinctness of the pot from the cloth is a matter of their having different sets of properties, then we must ask what it is in virtue of which the relevant properties are recognized as distinct. If it’s because the properties have different sets of higher-order properties, then we will be launched on a regress; for we can raise the same question with respect to these properties. In order to stop the regress, if we say that some of the distinguishing higher-order properties needn’t themselves have distinguishing higher-order properties, then we would end up with the result that the entities lower down in the hierarchy cannot be really be recognized as distinct. So, the pot and the cloth will be presented in awareness as non-distinct or identical.

The same line of reasoning will also apply to proposal (d), which claims that distinctness is a matter of possessing a property like separateness. If the pot is distinct from the cloth in virtue of possessing the property of cloth-separateness, and the cloth is distinct from the pot in virtue of possessing the property of pot-separateness, then we may ask what is it in virtue of which pot-separateness and cloth-separateness are distinct properties. This will launch us on a regress. In order to block it, we would have to accept that the relevant separateness-properties are not really distinct; so, the cloth and the pot will turn out to be identical. That’s exactly what Śrīharṣa wants.

4. Philosophy of Mind

Śrīharṣa is eager to point out that he is not skeptical of all commonsense ontological categories (KKh 62–63). Consciousness, for him, is ultimately real; only the world, insofar as it appears distinct from consciousness, isn’t. What reason do we have for treating consciousness as ultimately real? Śrīharṣa answers this question by defending a positive proposal about self-knowledge and intentionality. This section discusses that proposal.

4.1 Self-Knowledge

Śrīharṣa’s view, in a nutshell, is this. All conscious mental occurrences are self-intimating: when someone is undergoing a conscious mental occurrence, that very mental occurrence constitutes a veridical awareness of itself. Therefore, an agent needs nothing other than a conscious mental occurrence in order to know consciousness is ultimately real. In this respect, Śrīharṣa endorses a form of reflexivism, a view commonly associated with the Yogācāra school of Indian Buddhism, on which conscious mental states are reflexively aware of themselves (Ganeri 1995, 2012; Williams 1998; Yao 2005; Arnold 2005; Garfield 2006; MacKenzie 2007, 2008; Thompson 2011; Kellner 2011; Coseru 2012: Ch. 8).

Śrīharṣa opens his defense of reflexivism with the following argument (KKh 41–42). Whenever a person undergoes a conscious mental occurrence, she neither doubts whether she is undergoing that mental occurrence, nor does she mistake that mental occurrence for a different one, nor does she become sure of its absence. So, the agent must have a veridical awareness that the relevant mental occurrence exists. Now, suppose conscious mental occurrences don’t constitute an awareness of themselves. Hence, an agent can only become awareness of such conscious mental occurrences by some other means, e.g., on the basis of some episode of higher-order awareness. If this were the case, then it would be possible for the first-order conscious mental occurrence to be present without there being any higher-order awareness of it. But then the agent could doubt or be mistaken about whether she is undergoing the relevant conscious mental occurrence. In order to block this conclusion, therefore, we must accept the conclusion that conscious mental occurrences constitute a veridical awareness of their own existence. An agent needs nothing further in order to know that such occurrences are ultimately real.

However, this argument doesn’t seem great. The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher, who thinks that our awareness of our conscious mental occurrences always involves an episode of introspective higher-order awareness, could offer a different explanation of why we cannot doubt or be wrong about whether we are undergoing certain conscious mental occurrences. She could say that whenever an agent is in a conscious mental state, there is a veridical higher-order awareness-episode in virtue of which the agent is aware that she is undergoing the relevant mental occurrence.

Śrīharṣa responds to this objection with a regress argument. Suppose an agent is undergoing a conscious mental occurrence. Ordinarily, when we are aware of a conscious mental occurrence, we are also aware that we are aware of it, we are aware that we are aware that we are aware of it, and so on. Since the “higher-order awareness” (henceforth, HOA) theorist explains such awareness of one’s own mental occurrences by appealing to episodes of higher-order awareness, she faces a choice: either she should posit an infinite hierarchy of such episodes of higher-order awareness, or she shouldn’t. If she takes the second route, she would have to say that for any conscious mental occurrence, an agent is aware of that conscious mental occurrence, and aware that she is aware of that mental occurrence, and aware that she is aware that she is aware of that mental occurrence,…, and so on, until she reaches some higher-order awareness-episode which isn't the object of any further higher-order awareness-episode. But if that is the case, the agent can indeed doubt whether that final higher-order awareness-episode exists. On that basis, she can doubt the existence of the higher-order awareness-episode that the final higher-order awareness-episode has as its object, and so on. In this way, the agent can indeed come to doubt whether she is undergoing to the relevant conscious mental occurrence. Therefore, the HOA theorist must posit an infinite hierarchy of higher-order awareness episodes. But then there will be a regress. So, the HOA awareness theorist cannot really explain why conscious mental occurrences are immune to doubt (KKh 43).

This regress argument isn’t airtight either: the HOA theorist might just reject the premise that conscious mental occurrences are not subject to doubt or error. She might just be comfortable with the claim that sometimes, even though we are undergoing a certain conscious mental occurrence, we are not aware that we are undergoing that conscious mental occurrence. Śrīharṣa thinks that this move will be difficult to pull off.

In response, Śrīharṣa offers an argument that starts out from the following principle:

  • awareness-existence principle If an agent is not aware of her own awareness-episode e, then she cannot rationally ascertain that the object that e is about exists.[23]

The awareness-existence principle is a principle about rationality: it says that a rational (prāmāṇika) agent—i.e., someone who doesn’t overstep the bounds of her evidence (pramāṇa)—cannot be sure that the object of her awareness exists if she is not aware of her own awareness. This is because in order to ascertain the existence of the object of her awareness, the rational agent will have to cite evidence for the existence of that object. But in the absence of any awareness of her awareness, she won’t be able to appeal to her own awareness as evidence for the existence of the object. As a result, she won’t be able to ascertain that the relevant object exists.

Śrīharṣa’s final argument is this (KKh 45–46). It is uncontroversial that even in rational agents, conscious awareness-episodes can be action-guiding: a rational agent’s conscious awareness of an object is capable of making her engage in physical and linguistic behavior under the presupposition that the relevant object exists. For instance, a rational agent’s perceptual experience as of there being a chair before her could motivate her to perform certain chair-related linguistic and physical acts, e.g., saying, “That’s a chair!”, or trying to grab the chair and sit on it. However, if the agent weren’t aware of her experience as of there being a chair before her, then, by the awareness-existence principle, she couldn’t ascertain that there is a chair before her. And if she couldn’t ascertain the existence of the chair, the relevant patterns of physical and linguistic behavior wouldn’t arise. The upshot is that if object-directed conscious awareness-episodes, e.g., perceptual experiences, are to be action-guiding in the case of rational agents, rational agents must be aware of such mental occurrences whenever they take place.

But now, if this awareness of awareness is an episode of higher-order awareness (as the HOA theorist intends it to be), then there will be a regress (KKh 45–46). Unless the HOA theorist posits an infinite hierarchy of awareness-episodes, by the awareness-existence principle, no rational agent will be able to ascertain the existence of her initial awareness-episode, and therefore also won’t be able to ascertain the existence of its object. Since that’s bad, the HOA theorist has to accept the conclusion that at least all object-directed conscious awareness-episodes of rational agents involve awareness of themselves. But if the HOA theorist is comfortable with this conclusion, it might just be better for her to accept the more general thesis that all awareness-episodes (or even conscious mental occurrences) involve awareness of themselves.

4.2 Intentionality

Śrīharṣa’s reflexivism poses a challenge: How can a conscious mental occurrence constitute awareness of itself? According to a simple notion of intentionality, the object of an awareness-episode is always distinct from the awareness-episode. But if this view is correct, then conscious mental occurrences cannot be self-intimating. For if conscious mental occurrences were self-intimating, then awareness-episodes wouldn’t be distinct from their own objects.

Śrīharṣa replies to this worry with a regress argument that is similar to F. H. Bradley’s argument against external relations (Bradley 1893: ch. II):

The relation between an object and its awareness cannot be distinct from the nature of its relata. If it were distinct, then, on pain of regress, one would have to accept that the relation between the first relation and its relata is in the end identical to its own loci [i.e., its relata]. If this is right, one would have to accept that the awareness of this second relation arises without any awareness of a distinction between the relata and the relevant relation; for a relation that is identical to its own loci oversteps the limitations of other relations. Analogously, the relation between an object and its awareness obtains even in the absence of any distinction between its relata, and the awareness of that relation also arises without any awareness of the relevant distinction. Where is the inconsistency? (KKh 56–57)

Here is the idea. Suppose an object a is R1-related to an object b which is distinct from a. Let us suppose that R1 is distinct from both a and b. If R1 is distinct from a and b, then R1 itself would somehow have to be related to a and b. But then we would have to posit another relation, R2, thus launching ourselves on an infinite regress. The only way to escape this regress would be to say that there is some relation Ri which is not distinct from its relata. But there is no reason to think that this relation isn’t R1 itself. So, for any relation R, we may conclude that it isn’t distinct from its relata. So, the aboutness relation (viṣaya-viṣayi-bhāva) that connects an object with its awareness also cannot be distinct from its relata. If the object is identical to the aboutness relation that connects it to its awareness, and the aboutness relation is identical to the awareness, then the object must also be identical to its awareness.

However, the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher has a stock response to the regress argument Śrīharṣa uses to motivate his view: it is to posit a self-linking relation (svarūpa-sambandha). The underlying thought is that sometimes, when one entity a is related to another entity b, this state of affairs isn’t decomposable into three elements which are distinct from each other, i.e., a, b, and a relation R that is distinct from both a and b. Rather, the relation R may just be non-distinct from either a or b. Yet, since it connects a or b to something else, it still remains a relation; it is thus a self-linking relation. This will block the regress argument that Śrīharṣa wishes to run. In The Discrimination of the Truth about the Self (Ātmatattvaviveka), Udayana endorses a view of this kind (Śāstri 1940: 224).

  • aboutness The property of being about an object is the particular nature of an awareness-episode, namely, just its being-of-that-ness (prakāśasya sataḥ tadīyatāmātrarūpaḥ svabhāvaviśeṣaḥ).

The underlying thought is that the aboutness relation is a self-linking relation: it is the particular nature that an awareness-episode e possesses, namely, its nature of being an awareness of the relevant object o.

Śrīharṣa’s main objection against this definition of aboutness involves a threat of idealism (vijñānavāda) (KKh 650ff). He points out that the property of being-of-that-ness that Udayana speaks of is decomposable into two elements: the part picked out by the expression ‘that’, namely the object of awareness o, and the part picked out by “being of”, which corresponds to the relation R by which the awareness-episode is related to the object. If both these elements are part of the nature of the awareness-episode—the definition claims—then the object o wouldn’t be external to the awareness-episode e. The Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika view, therefore, would collapse into idealism!

Perhaps, the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher could claim that it is not the object o that is the part of the awareness-episode’s nature, but only the relation R. This doesn’t satisfy Śrīharṣa. He points out that since R could be a relation with multiple instances and therefore could hold between a different awareness-episode e* and a different object o*, the fact that R is part of the nature of e wouldn’t explain why it constitutes an awareness of o. Perhaps, we could say that R also possesses a certain being-of-that-ness in virtue of which it is merely a relation between o and the awareness-episode e. This proposal, as Śrīharṣa seems to suggest, tries to explain the being-of-that-ness that the awareness-episode possesses, by positing another kind of being-that-ness in the relation R that connects the awareness-episode e with its object o. Quite predictably, therefore, Śrīharṣa asks whether this second variety of being-of-that-ness is part of the nature of the relation R, or external to it.

If this being-of-that-ness is part of the nature of R, a line of reasoning similar to the one that led to the worry about idealism could be run again. If the being-of-that-ness is part of the nature of the relation, then, since ‘that’ refers to the object here, the object too should be part of R’s nature. And since R is part of the nature of the awareness-episode e, the object o too should be part of the nature of e. Thus, the threat of idealism will arise again! (Moreover, if we say that o is not part of the nature of the relation R, but only some further relation R* is, then the same move could be made again, thus launching us on an infinite regress).

But suppose this being-of-that-ness that R has is external to R. What is that property? It cannot be anything distinct from (the nature of) the object of awareness o; if it were, then another regress argument could be run. So, let’s suppose this being-of-that-ness which R has is identical to o. The question, again, is this: How is this being-of-that-ness related to R? If it is not related by a self-linking relation, an infinite regress will be unavoidable. If it is related by a self-linking relation, then the object o will be part of the nature of R, which in turn is part of the nature of the awareness-episode e. Thus, the problem of idealism will arise again.

More generally, Śrīharṣa’s view is that there are no cases where the aboutness relation connects distinct objects. For him, ordinary aboutness relations that seem to connect distinct objects, e.g., the pot and its awareness, are ultimately unreal. What really exists is the self-intimating consciousness. So, there is nothing wrong with treating the relata of the aboutness relation as identical in every case.

5. The Futility of Inquiry

Śrīharṣa offers his refutation-arguments with the aim of undermining the dualistic ontology accepted by Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosophers. However, these arguments also serve another aim, which he gestures at, and which seems to drive many of the arguments in The Sweets of Refutation. It is to show that rational inquiry into the nature of reality—i.e., inquiry that proceeds through the exchange of arguments directed towards settling some question—is in fact futile.

5.1 The Paradox of Inquiry

Let us grant that Śrīharṣa’s refutation-arguments are in fact successful in undermining the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika project of defending a dualistic ontology on which the world is populated by things that are distinct from the self or consciousness. Can Śrīharṣa himself defend the kind of non-dualism that he endorses? Somewhat surprisingly, Śrīharṣa argues that inquiry into the question of non-duality—the question of whether only the self or consciousness is ultimately real—is futile. His argument is a version of Meno’s paradox (Carpenter & Ganeri 2010).[24] He imagines an opponent who asks, “What is the method of knowing non-duality, i.e., the non-distinctness of everything from the self?” The response is this: when asked by someone who rejects the doctrine of non-duality, this question doesn’t make sense (KKh 69–73). The argument takes the form of a dilemma: either the opponent is aware of what non-duality is, or she is not.

Focus on the second horn. If the opponent is not aware of non-duality, it will be impossible for her to perform the very speech act of asking the question that she in fact has asked. This is because, Śrīharṣa claims, the following principle holds:

Any speech act must be produced by an awareness-episode such that if the speech act is about an object o, the awareness-episode is also about that object o. (KKh 70)

But if the opponent isn’t aware of non-duality, she couldn’t perform a speech act on the basis of an awareness of non-duality. So, she couldn’t ask the relevant question at all.

Now, focus on the first horn. The question is this: If the opponent is aware of non-duality, does her awareness-episode constitute knowledge or not? If it does constitute knowledge, then the method by which that knowledge arises is the means of knowing non-duality. So, asking the question is futile. Now, an opponent might argue,

Yes, we have established in general that there is some way of knowing non-duality. But, given that there is a lot of disagreement, we haven’t quite pinned down precisely which means of knowing would allow us to know non-duality. So, the task of the inquirer is to settle that question.

Śrīharṣa’s reply is that this is a useless exercise. If we have already demonstrated in general that non-duality can be known, then that by itself entails that there is a particular method of knowing non-duality. In order to know what it is, we can either pick the best one amongst the already well-known methods of knowing, or posit a new one.

But now suppose the opponent says that her awareness of non-duality in fact doesn’t constitute knowledge. But surely, says Śrīharṣa, if non-duality isn’t an object of knowledge, then how could there be a method of knowing non-duality? Of course, the opponent could clarify her position by saying that she is just committed to treating her own awareness of non-duality as a case of non-knowledge, not her interlocutor’s. Since her interlocutor—i.e., Śrīharṣa—is committed to thinking that non-duality can be known, she can indeed legitimately ask what means of knowing gives rise to the knowledge of non-duality.

Śrīharṣa’s reply is subtle: even though he is committed to the doctrine of non-duality, Śrīharṣa denies that the burden is upon him to show that the method by which one becomes aware of non-duality is in fact a means of knowing. This is because, sometimes, an agent can become aware of the truth even by means of a procedure that doesn’t yield knowledge, and therefore, doesn’t count as a means of knowing. For instance, in Mist, the agent correctly infers the presence of fire on a mountain after mistaking mist for smoke. For some defenders of Advaita Vedānta, such as Maṇḍana Miśra (8th century CE), there is at least a structural similarity between cases of this kind and the case where an agent becomes aware of the non-distinctness of the world from the self on the basis of experience of hearing Upanisadic sentences that proclaim that non-duality (Kuppuswami Sastri 1984: 41; Thrasher 1993: ch. V; Ganeri 2007: ch. 5). As in Mist, in this case too, the agent moves from error to truth; for the experience of hearing Upaniṣadic sentences is laden with the differences amongst the hearer, the hearing, and that which is heard. Śrīharṣa seems to suggest here that the defender of non-dualism—committed as she may be to the claim that there is nothing in the world that is distinct from the self—needn’t have to cite a method of knowing that will produce the knowledge of that truth.

5.2 Scripture and the Limits of Reason

In the last assessment, Śrīharṣa is happy to concede that the Upaniṣads—which literally proclaim that everything is non-distinct from the Brahman or the self—are the means of knowing non-duality. However, Śrīharṣa thinks that one cannot call Upanisadic testimony into question by appealing to perceptual evidence. The ordinary perceptual awareness of plurality, as we have already seen in Section 3.2, is incapable of defeating the awareness of non-duality that is generated by Upanisadic testimony. Neither can inference of any kind defeat that awareness of non-duality. For Śrīharṣa, this just shows that one cannot inquire further into the truth or the falsity of the doctrine of non-duality on the basis of evidence that is independent of Upanisadic testimony. As he puts it,

that awareness of non-duality [produced by the Upanisadic sentences] cannot be refuted by the wise even by means of a hundred arguments (tarka). (KKh 118)

His advice to the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher therefore is to withdraw from the project of inquiry and rather to adopt an attitude of faith (śraddhā) towards the content of the Upanisadic sentences.

You, who are fond of reveling in ignorance, ought to have faith in the doctrine of non-duality, presented to you by these arguments which, by your own lights, have the features of good reasoning. Consequently, your faith in the content of the Upaniṣads will induce in you a desire to know the self. Slowly, as your consciousness is freed from ordinary mental states, you yourself shall become acquainted with the ultimate truth, to which reflexive self-knowledge bears witness, and which is sweeter than honey. (KKh 120)

This passage is suggestive: it reveals that for Śrīharṣa, rational inquiry—unconstrained by faith in scripture—cannot be a guide to the truth. The professed goal of the Nyāya system was to lay down a system of rational inquiry which, irrespective of the domain of inquiry, would allow one to progress towards to the truth in that domain. But Śrīharṣa thinks this is impossible. On the one hand, his refutation-arguments are supposed to illustrate that such systems of rational inquiry are self-undermining: their own rules can be used to undermine the fundamental ontological and epistemological categories that these systems rely on. On the one hand, Śrīharṣa wants to show that we cannot even engage in inquiry in good faith, and that arguments presented in the course of such inquiry—framed independently of scriptural testimony—cannot have any defeating force against scriptural testimony. The best way of making progress towards the truth is to have faith in scripture, and let reason occupy a secondary place.

This attitude towards reason is something that Śrīharṣa shares with some other classical Indian thinkers (Murty 1959: pt. II ch. IV; Halbfass 1983: ch. II). In Of Sentences and Words (Vākyapadīya), Bhartṛhari claims that reason, without the guidance of scripture, is unreliable:

As in the case of the blind man who, guided solely by the touch of his hand, rushes down an uneven path, it is not rare for a person who relies primarily on reason to fall. (Subramania Aiyer 1976: 1.42)

But why is reason unreliable? The only clear argument that Bhartṛhari offers is an argument from instability: even if one presents a skillfully prepared argument in favor of a view, the conclusion of the argument can always be undercut or rebutted; for it is possible that someone else who is more skilled at argumentation might explain the matter differently (Ibid., 1.34). Śaṃkara alludes to Bhartṛhari’s argument while commenting on Aphorisms on Brahman 2.1.11:

Regarding matters that can be known from scripture, claims are not to be established by reasoning. This is because reasoning—when uninformed by scripture and based only on human imagination—lacks stability; for such imagination is unconstrained. Moreover, even when experts prepare arguments by employing imagination with care, such arguments may appear unsound to others who have greater expertise. Given that arguments imagined up by someone may later appear unsound to another, arguments cannot acquire any stability due to human disagreement. (Shastri 1980: 366–367)

Owing to this instability, reason alone cannot decisively establish anything; only reason informed by scripture (śrutyanugṛhīta-tarka) can (1980: 361).

On at least one way of reading The Sweets of Refutation, Śrīharṣa’s project is just to illustrate the instability of reason: for any argument the Nyāya-Vaiśeṣika philosopher may offer for their favorite ontological and epistemological categories, there is a refutation-argument that defeats it. The deliverances of reason—thus never immune to rational defeat—can only constitute inconclusive evidence. The important difference between Saṃkara and Śrīharṣa, however, lies in this. For Saṃkara, even on matters that are established by scripture, there is some room for inquiry, and reason informed by scripture can indeed help the inquirer understand the nature of ultimate reality. By contrast, Śrīharṣa takes his refutation-arguments to show that rational inquiry—whether or not informed by scripture—establishes nothing; faith alone can take us to the truth. Rational inquiry, for Śrīharṣa, is futile.


Primary Literature

Critical Editions of the Text

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