Principle of Sufficient Reason

First published Tue Sep 14, 2010; substantive revision Wed Sep 7, 2016

The Principle of Sufficient Reason is a powerful and controversial philosophical principle stipulating that everything must have a reason, cause, or ground. This simple demand for thoroughgoing intelligibility yields some of the boldest and most challenging theses in the history of philosophy. In this entry we begin with explaining the Principle, and then turn to the history of the debates around it. We conclude with an examination of the emerging contemporary discussion of the Principle.

1. Introduction

Suppose you enter a farmers’ market, pick out a few cucumbers and ask the merchant for the price. “Five dollars a pound”. A bit expensive, you may think, but you pay. Before you leave the stand two other people approach the seller with the very same question (“How much are the cucumbers?”). “A dollar a pound”, she says to the one; “Ten dollars a pound”, she tells the other. At least two of you are likely to attack the merchant with a simple question: Why the price discrepancy? Of course, you may simply leave the place if you have a simple explanation for the discrepancy (for example, that both you and the person who was asked to pay ten dollars a pound belong to commonly discriminated minorities). You may also conclude that the seller is just out of her mind (or that she is just conducting a psychological experiment). In all of these cases you will be entertaining an explanation or reason for a fact that appears odd. But what kinds of facts demand an explanation? Do all facts—including the most ordinary ones—demand an explanation? If you accept an unrestricted form the Principle of Sufficient Reason (= PSR), you will require an explanation for any fact, or in other words, you will reject the possibility of any brute, or unexplainable, facts.

A simple formulation of the principle is as follows:

  • (1) For every fact F, there must be a sufficient reason why F is the case.

The term “fact” in the above formulation is not intended to express any commitment to an ontology of facts. Still, if one wishes to avoid such connotations, the principle can be formulated more schematically:

  • (2) For every x, there is a y such that y is the sufficient reason for \(x\) (formally: \(\forall x\exists y \mathrm{R}yx\) [where “\( \mathrm{R}xy\)” denotes the binary relation of providing a sufficient reason]).

The PSR is, in fact, a family of principles which are generated by various restrictions of (2), and by ascriptions of different degrees of modal strength to (2). To begin with, variants of the PSR may differ according to how they restrict the kinds of things that require a reason (the explananda). Thus, one might restrict the PSR to only actual entities, or include possibilia as well. Alternatively, one might formulate the PSR as requiring a sufficient reason for every (true) proposition or as pertaining to entities and their properties. A variant of the PSR restricted to entities might require an explanation for the existence and non-existence of entities, or it might be further restricted by requiring a reason only for the existence (or only for the non-existence) of entities. A version of the PSR that is restricted to propositions might range over both contingent and necessary propositions, or it might be further restricted to only one of these sub-domains.

Similarly, different versions of the PSR issue from various ways of restricting the kinds of things that count as providing a reason (the explanantia). It is likely (though not necessary) that one’s decision about the kinds of explananda that fall under the range of the PSR, will determine the kinds of things counted as explanantia.

Variants of the PSR may be generated not only by placing restrictions on the relata at stake (both the explananda and the explanantia), but also on the notion of the relation at stake. Frequently, the relation of providing a reason is conceived as irreflexive, antisymmetric and transitive, though, each of these characteristics may be, and indeed have been, challenged. The relation of providing a reason can be conceived as an ontological relation (as in contemporary discussions of ground), or as a purely epistemological relation.

A modally strong version of the PSR will take the Principle as necessary and obtaining in all possible worlds, while a weak modal version will present the Principle as merely contingently true. Another distinction can be drawn between a factive, as opposed to merely regulative, version of the Principle. A regulative version of the PSR would consider it as a condition for intelligibility (on a par with the Law of Non-Contradiction), and thus as guiding our studying of nature. The regulative and the factive versions differ in terms of allowing for the falsification of the principle. The factive version could be easily refuted by a single counter-example. A proponent of the regulative variant of the PSR would argue that an empirical falsification of the PSR makes as little sense as an empirical falsification of the Law of Non-Contradiction. Encountering a fact which seems to have no explanation, the proponent of the regulative variant, would respond by insisting that we must keep searching for an explanation.

A proponent of the unrestricted version of the PSR could could argue that one’s choice of a specific variant of the PSR cannot be arbitrary, on pain of inconsistency (i.e., one must provide a reason why to prefer one variant over others). Relying on this last point, she may further contend that in the absence of compelling reasons to the contrary, the unrestricted version of the Principle should be considered as default.

One of the most interesting questions regarding the PSR is why accept it at all. Insofar as the PSR stipulates that all things must be explainable, it seems that the PSR itself demands an explanation. Several modern philosophers attempted to provide a proof for the PSR, though so far these attempts have been mostly unsuccessful. Another important question related to the PSR is the possibility of self-explanatory facts and self-caused entities; particularly, one might wonder how these are distinguished from unexplainable, brute facts and uncaused entities. One might also wonder whether the PSR allows for any primitive concepts that cannot be further explained.

A third crucial problem for proponents of the PSR is how to address the Agrippan Trilemma between the apparently exhaustive three horns of: (i) acceptance of brute facts, (ii) acceptance of an infinite regress of explanation (or grounding), or (iii) acceptance of self-explanatory facts. Prima facie, each horn in the trilemma undermines the position of the proponent of the PSR.

Finally, the proponent of the PSR faces intriguing problems in addressing perfectly symmetrical states. We have seen that some variants of the PSR require an explanation for the existence of things (thus, assuming nonexistence as a “default” state requiring no explanation), while other variants require an explanation for both the existence and nonexistence of a things. Let us look quickly at the latter (“default”-free) variant. Specifically, we might wonder how a proponent of the “default”-free variant of the PSR would respond to a situation in which we have neither a reason for the existence of x, nor have a reason for the non-existence of x? A defender of the PSR might indeed respond by denying the possibility of such a scenario, though it is not clear on what grounds precisely she could maintain this denial. A similar dilemma might be raised with regard to issues of identity: given the absence of a reason for the identity of x and y, as well as for their non-identity, should we assume either identity or non-identity as a default position?[1]

With these general considerations in place, let us examine the historical role that the Principle has played. The term “Principle of Sufficient Reason [principe de raison suffisante/principium reddendae rationis]” was coined by Leibniz, though Spinoza is thought by many scholars to to preceded Leibniz in appreciating the importance of the Principle and placing it at the center of his philosophical system.[2] The Principle seems at first sight to have a strong intuitive appeal—we always ask for explanations—yet it is taken by many to be too bold and expensive due to the radical implications it seems to yield. Among the alleged consequences of the Principle are: the Identity of Indiscernibles, necessitarianism, the relativity of space and time, the existence of a self-necessitated Being (i.e., God), and the Principle of Plenitude.

Though there are several important precursors who, as we will see, seem to advocate variants of the PSR before the modern period, we will begin our discussion with two main expositors of the Principle: Spinoza and Leibniz.

2. Spinoza

Spinoza’s earliest statement of the PSR appears in his first published work, the 1663 geometrical exposition of Descartes’ Principles of Philosophy. The eleventh axiom of Part I of the book states:

Nothing exists of which it cannot be asked, what is the cause (or reason) [causa (sive ratio)], why it exists.

In a brief explanatory note to this axiom, Spinoza adds:

Since existing is something positive, we cannot say that it has nothing as its cause (by Axiom 7). Therefore, we must assign some positive cause, or reason, why [a thing] exists—either an external one, i.e., one outside the thing itself, or an internal one, one comprehended in the nature and definition of the existing thing itself. (Geb. I/158/4–9)[3]

Axiom 7, to which Spinoza appeals in the explanation, is a variant of the “ex nihilo, nihil fit” (“from nothing, nothing comes”) principle, and stipulates that an existing thing and its perfections (or qualities) cannot have nothing or a non-existing thing as their cause. Interestingly, however, in another work from this early period of his philosophical writing, the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, Spinoza allows for one unique item to be without a cause. In §70 of this treatise, Spinoza argues:

[T]hat Thought is also called true which involves objectively the essence of some principle that does not have a cause, and is known through itself and in itself. (II/26/33–4. Our emphasis)

It is not completely clear what “the principle [principium]” at stake is, but given its qualification as “known through itself and in itself”, it may refer to God and indicate Spinoza’s understanding of Descartes’ rather nuanced view—in his Second Set of Replies—according to which God does not need a cause in order to exist, but there is a reason why God does not need a cause (AT VII: 164–65; cf. Carraud 2002: Ch. 2).[4]

Spinoza does not mention the PSR in his 1670 Theological Political Treatise (TTP), though the spirit of the Principle can be easily discerned throughout the book. For example, in the conclusion of the Fifteenth Chapter of the TTP Spinoza makes the following extraordinary announcement:

[W]hat altar of refuge can a man find for himself when he commits treason against the majesty of reason. (III/188)

There is much to be said about this image of reason, which ascribes to reason the same exhaustiveness, dominance, and omnipresence that traditional theologies ascribe to God. This passage leaves no room for anything that is beyond, or against, reason.

The closest that Spinoza comes in the TTP to endorsing the PSR is in his discussion of miracles. Let us have a close look at the following passage:

But since miracles have occurred according to the power of understanding of the common people, who were, in fact, completely ignorant of the principles of natural things, it is certain that the ancients took for a miracle what they could not explain in the way the common people are accustomed to explain natural things, viz. by falling back on memory to recall some other similar thing they are accustomed to imagine without wonder. For the common people think they understand a thing well enough when they do not wonder at it. (III/84/5–11. Our emphasis)

What precisely went wrong in the vulgus’ attempt (and failure) to explain miracles? Obviously they erred, according to Spinoza, because they were “completely ignorant of the principles of natural things”; but why did they stay ignorant in spite of their genuine attempt to trace the causes of miracles? Why did they not look for the natural explanations of miracles? The vulgus were definitely not wrong in trying to find a causal explanation for miracles; Spinoza openly argues that we ought to try to explain things through their proximate causes. What went wrong in the method of the “common people” was that they did not go far enough in their attempt to explain the nature of things. Instead of stubbornly seeking the complete causal chain for each fact, they felt content once an extraordinary fact was shown to be the result of a familiar phenomenon—that does not entice wonder—while paying no attention to the need to explain the familiar. In a way, they were rudimentary common-sense philosophers who asked for an explanation for what appears to be against common sense, and were completely reassured once the unfamiliar turned out to be a result of the common. For Spinoza, our familiarity with a phenomenon does not render it intelligible, and the familiar, just like the extraordinary, demands a clear causal explanation. Indeed, it is precisely at this point that the thoroughness of one’s commitment to the Principle of Sufficient Reason is tested. Few people would deny the need to explain unusual phenomena (e.g., flying hippos), but fewer would demand an explanation for what is common and ordinary (e.g., time), and it is precisely here where the task of the philosopher begins, first in making us de-familiarize ourselves with, and question the nature of, the ordinary, and then in attempting to explain it.

In Spinoza’s major work, the Ethics, the PSR is stated implicitly already by the second axiom of Part I:

E1a2: What cannot be conceived [concipi] through another, must be conceived through itself.

The immediate implication of E1a2 is that everything is conceived.[5] Since, for Spinoza, to conceive something is to explain it (see E1p10s, E1p14d and Della Rocca 2008: 5) it seems that E1a2 amounts to the claim that everything is explainable. Some commentators have also seen the PSR encoded in E1a3:

From a given determinate cause the effect follows necessarily; and conversely, if there is no determinate cause, it is impossible for an effect to follow.

If we interpret “effect” narrowly as something with a cause, then the second clause is trivial. If we interpret it more broadly as anything that exists, obtains, happens (or whatever the relata of causation are taken to be) has a cause, then the second clause contains a statement of a version of the PSR: everything has a cause (Lin forthcoming).

In E1p11d2, Spinoza states explicitly a variant of the PSR: “For each thing there must be assigned a cause, or reason, both for its existence and for its nonexistence”. Similarly, in E1p8s2, Spinoza argues, “if a certain number of individuals exists, there must be a cause why those individuals, and why neither more nor fewer, exist”. Spinoza’s insistence that even the non-existence of things must be explainable is crucial. It allows him, for example, to argue that were God not to exist, his non-existence must be explainable. Since God is a substance, Spinoza argues, his existence or non-existence cannot be caused or explained externally (Spinoza takes substances to be causally independent of each other); hence, were God not to exist, he would have to be the cause of his non-existence, just as a square-circle is the cause of its non-existence. But since God is not a contradictory entity, He cannot internally rule out His own existence, and hence He must exist (E11pd).

Spinoza accepts a very strong version of the PSR. According to some readings, he grants the PSR unlimited extension, and takes it to be necessary. In fact, the PSR seems to be the primary motivation behind Spinoza’s strict necessitarianism. For Spinoza, if there are two (or more) possible worlds, it would seem that neither one would have a sufficient reason or cause (for if there were such a sufficient reason, this world would be necessitated, and all other worlds would be impossible). In other words, for Spinoza, the PSR dictates that there is only one possible world (see Della Rocca 2008: 69–78, and Lin 2011: 23–25. Occasionally, however, Spinoza’s endorsement of the PSR is in tension with other principles of his metaphysics, such as the priority of the infinite (see Melamed 2012b and Melamed 2013a: xvii).

Spinoza holds not only that the existence of things must be explained, but also that the coherence, or incoherence, of their essences (what others would call their possibility) must be explained (E1p33s1). Similarly, the essences of things must also have a cause (E1p25). In general, many commentators have thought that Spinoza relies, either explicitly or implicitly on the PSR to motivate many of his most important and innovative doctrines, such as the Identity of Indiscernibles (E1p4. Although see Lin forthcoming for a dissenting view), substance monism (E1p11 and E1p14), and the rejection of free will (E1p32 and E2pp48–49). In E1p21d Spinoza relies on the PSR to infer a bold causal principle: a simple cause has one, and only one, simple effect. Had the cause more than one effect, the difference between the two effects would be unexplainable insofar as each effect is supposed to be fully explained by the same cause. Thus, if we experience a cause bringing about more than one effect, we should conclude that that the cause was not simple, but comprised of parts (so that the different parts contributed to the causation of the different effects. See Melamed 2013a: 117–119, and Melamed 2013b: 212–213.

Recently, Michael Della Rocca argued not only that the PSR “provide[s] the key to unlocking many of the mysteries of Spinoza’s philosophical system” (2008: 9), but that Spinoza requires the reduction of the most basic philosophical concepts to reason or intelligibility. This alleged “double use of the PSR” stipulates (1) that everything must be explainable, and (2) that it should be (ultimately) explained in terms of intelligibility. Hence, according to Della Rocca, Spinoza reduces his major philosophical concepts—existence, causation, rightness, and power—to intelligibility (2008: 8–9). While this is a fascinating and bold reading of Spinoza’s metaphysics, it seems to contradict his crucial doctrine of the causal and conceptual barrier between the attributes (E1p10 and E2p6). The reduction of any non-Thought item to intelligibility (presumably, a feature of the attribute of thought[6]) undermines the barrier between the attributes, and with it the entire edifice of Spinoza’s ontology (see Della Rocca 2012: 12–16; Melamed 2012a; and Melamed 2013a: xv and 196 n. 84).

How would Spinoza respond to the Agrippan Trilemma? Clearly Spinoza is unsympathetic to any acceptance of brute facts. Yet he allows for some, restricted cases of self-explanation and infinite regress of explanation. Let us take a brief look at these two issues.

Spinoza begins the Ethics with the definitions of causa sui (E1d1), and of substance as that which “is conceived through itself” (E1d3). Positing these reflexive definitions at the outset might have been a calculated methodological move whose aim was to bypass the challenging task of proving the legitimacy of these notions. But since Spinoza considers his definitions as not merely stipulative (see TIE §95 and Ep. 60), we may well ask for a defense of the legitimacy of self-explanations.

The class of truths that Spinoza considers as self-explanatory are truths that follow merely from the essence or—what us the same—the nature of a thing. In E1p11d, Spinoza provides two examples of self-explanation:

the very nature of a square circle indicates the reason why it does not exist, viz. because it involves a contradiction…, the reason why a substance exists also follows from its nature alone, because it involves existence.

In contrast, claims Spinoza, the existence (as well as the non-existence) of a triangle (or any other thing that is not a substance) do no follow merely from the essence of the triangle:

The reason why a circle or triangle exists, or why it does not exist, does not follow from the nature of these things, but from the order of the whole of corporeal Nature. (E1p11d).

Thus, consider the following three propositions: (i) The triangle has three angles, (ii) The substance exists, and (iii) The triangle exists. Proposition (i) is clearly self-explanatory, since the essence of the triangle (which contains the nature of the number three and the nature the angle) is the sufficient reason for its having three angles (adding any other information is of no explanatory value). Spinoza considers proposition (ii) as self-explanatory as well. Notice that Spinoza does not define substance (in E1d3) as existing by virtue of its essence, but rather derives this claim from the definition of substance (in E1p7). In contrast to (i) and (ii), the existence of a triangle does not follow merely from its essence (since it is caused by entities external to the triangle, and therefore has to be explained through these external causes).

Let us turn now to the question of the legitimacy of infinite regress. In E1p28, Spinoza openly states that within each attribute there is an infinite causal chain of finite modes:

Every singular thing, or any thing which is finite and has a determinate existence, can neither exist nor be determined to produce an effect unless it is determined to exist and produce an effect by another cause, which is also finite and has a determinate existence; and again, this cause also can neither exist nor be determined to produce an effect unless it is determined to exist and produce an effect by another, which is also finite and has a determinate existence, and so on, to infinity. [Italics added]

Each link in this causal chain is preceded by infinitely many causes and is followed by infinitely many effects. Each link also provides at least part of the explanation for the existence of the following link. Is the existence of such an infinite regress consistent with the PSR? Spinoza has no qualms about answering this question in the positive. We may legitimately ask what is the cause of each link in the chain, and the answer would be: the preceding link. Spinoza also thinks that we may—indeed, should—ask what is the cause, or reason, for the existence of the entire infinite chain? He simply thinks that he can provide a clear answer to the latter question as well: God (or the being which is the ground of its own existence). Consider the following passage from Spinoza’s celebrated “Letter on the Infinite” in which he criticizes proofs of the existence of God which rely on the impossibility of an actual infinity of causes and effects.

In passing I should like to note here that the more recent Peripatetics have, as I think, misunderstood the demonstration by which the Ancients tried to prove God’s existence. For as I find it in a certain Jew, called Rab Chasdai, it runs as follows: if there is an infinite regress of causes, then all things that are will also have been caused; but it does not pertain to anything which has been caused, to exist necessarily by the force of its own nature; therefore, there is nothing in Nature to whose essence it pertains to exist necessarily; but the latter is absurd; therefore, the former is also. Hence the force of this argument does not lie in the impossibility of there being an actual infinite or an infinite regress of causes, but only in the supposition that things which do not exist necessarily by their own nature are not determined to exist by a thing which does necessarily exist by its own nature. [Ep. 12| IV/61/15–62/10; italics added]

In this passage, Spinoza follows the late medieval Jewish philosopher Hasdai Crescas in rejecting the Aristotelian ban on actual infinity (see Melamed 2014). For Spinoza (and Crescas) the existence of an infinite regress of causes is perfectly legitimate. Yet, if all the items in this infinite chain are contingent beings (i.e., “things which do not exist necessarily by their own nature”[7]), the chain itself remains a contingent being, and there must be reason which explains its instantiation in reality. The ultimate reason for the instantiation of such an infinite chain of contingent beings must, claims Spinoza, be a being whose existence is not contingent (for otherwise, the chain will remain merely contingent and its instantiation in reality would not be sufficiently explained). Thus, Spinoza allows for an infinite regress of causes (or explanations) as long as the entire infinite chain is grounded in a self-explained being or fact.

3. Leibniz

No philosopher is more closely associated with the PSR than Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (1646–1716). He was the first to call it by name and, arguably, the first to formulate it with full generality. His treatment of the PSR is also noteworthy for its systematicity and the centrality that he accords it.

Leibniz often presents it, along with the Principle of Contradiction, as a principle of “reasoning”. For example, in the Monadology he writes:

31. Our reasonings are based on two great principles, that of contradiction, in virtue of which we judge that which involves a contradiction to be false, and that which is opposed or contradictory to the false to be true.

32. And that of sufficient reason, by virtue of which we consider that we can find no true or existent fact, no true assertion, without there being a sufficient reason why it is thus and not otherwise, although most of the time these reasons cannot be known to us. (G VI, 612/L 646)

These principles are characterized in what appears to be epistemic terms. They are principles of “our reasoning”. They concern what we “judge” or “find”. And yet it is clear that Leibniz intends them to have metaphysical as well as epistemic import. In the case of the PSR, this will become more evident when we discuss how Leibniz understands the notion of a sufficient reason but it is already indicated in the passage quoted above by the fact that Leibniz explicitly states that there are sufficient reasons for every truth or fact even if such reasons are unknowable by us.

The scope of the PSR, as stated above, includes facts and truths. Leibniz sometimes, however, characterizes the scope of the principle in different terms. For example, he writes:

[T]he principle of sufficient reason, namely, that nothing happens without a reason. (G VII 355; LC L2; AG 321, our emphasis)

The PSR is here said to apply to what “happens”. This suggests a version of the PSR that applies not to truths or facts but rather events: Every event has a sufficient reason.

These vacillations in the formulation of the PSR are not typically taken to register indecision on Leibniz’s part as to the scope of the PSR. Rather they are usually understood as indicating that Leibniz views the scope of the PSR to be very wide, perhaps even absolutely general, but at least wide enough to encompass facts, truths, and events (see Rodriguez-Pererya forthcoming).

Leibniz associates the Principle of Contradiction and the PSR with a variety of domains where each is especially important. For example, there are domains where the truths of the domain depend on one of the two principles. These domains are characterized modally: The Principle of Contradiction rules over the domain of necessary truths and the PSR rules over the domain of contingent truths (A 6 4 1616/MP 75; G VII 355–56/LC 15–16).

There are also domains that are characterized in terms of subject matter or areas of inquiry. The Principle of Contradiction allows us to study mathematics, whereas the PSR allows us to study metaphysics, natural theology, and physics (G VII, 355–6; LC L2; AG 321). It is far from obvious that these two ways of assigning domains to the Principles are equivalent. For example, it would be natural to assume that metaphysics and natural theology would include necessary propositions and thus the PSR would encroach upon the territory assigned to the Principle of Contradiction according to the modal characterization.

We must therefore distinguish distinct ways of associating the principles with various domains. The first way is to specify the domain to which each principle applies. Leibniz appears to believe that, according to this approach, there is a single universal domain and it is associated equally with each principle. There are no contradictory contingent facts or truths and so the Principle of Noncontradiction applies to all contingent truths as well as all necessary truths. Likewise, it is usually assumed that, for Leibniz, every necessary truth has a sufficient reason (see Broad 1975: 12 and 34 and Rodriguez-Pererya forthcoming). For example, mathematical truths, might have sufficient reasons in the form of proofs that rest on statements of identity. Thus the PSR applies to all necessary truths as well as all contingent truths.

The second way of associating the principles with specific domains is to specify the domain of truths that is grounded on or depends on each principle. According to Leibniz, only contingent truths depend on and are grounded by the PSR. Likewise, Leibniz believes that only necessary truths depend on and are grounded by the Principle of Contradiction. What does it mean for some truths to depend on a principle? Leibniz is not explicit on this point but we will get a better idea in the next section when we consider the question of what counts as a sufficient reason.

The third way is to specify a domain of truths that can be investigated on the basis of each principle. For Leibniz, we can know mathematical truths only on the basis of the Principle of Contradiction and only metaphysical, theological, and physical truths require the PSR in order to be known. We will see in more detail in what way the PSR allows us to investigate these domains the section on applications.

3.1 What is a Sufficient Reason?

When Leibniz insists that every truth or fact requires a sufficient reason, what does he mean by “sufficient reason?” In some texts he suggests that sufficient reason is an “a priori proof”. This should not be understood in Kantian terms as a proof that doesn’t require any input from sense experience. Rather, Leibniz uses the term “a priori” in its original pre-Kantian meaning, which means an argument from causes to effects. An a priori proof is a proof that reflects the causal order. Thus a sufficient reason would be a proof that is both a demonstration and an explanation (see Adams 1994: 109).

In order to fully understand Leibniz’s conception of a sufficient reason, we need to also understand his theory of truth and its relationship to his theory of modality. Let us begin with truth. To keep things simple, we will focus only on categorical propositions of subject-predicate form. A proposition is true, according to Leibniz, just in case the concept of the predicate is contained in the concept of the subject. Uncontroversially, the concept of the predicate is unmarried is contained in the concept bachelor and it is this conceptual containment which explains the truth of the statement bachelors are unmarried. But Leibniz makes the further highly controversial claim that all true statements are true for this reason, even statements like Caesar crossed the Rubicon. That is, this statement is true because the concept crossed the Rubicon is contained in the concept of Caesar. This theory of truth is sometimes called the conceptual containment theory of truth. It has as a consequence that all truths are analytic. But wouldn’t such a theory entail that all truths are necessary? After all, how could an analytic truth be contingent?

In response to this worry, Leibniz develops an account of contingency in terms of infinite analysis.[8] Leibniz understands analysis as the process of replacing the terms of a proposition with definitions or partial definitions. A demonstration results when an identity is obtained through the process of analysis in a finite number of steps. Leibniz claims that all and only necessary truths have a finite demonstration by analysis and all and only contingent truths do not have a demonstration by analysis in a finite number of steps. In this way, he preserves the distinction between necessary and contingent truths while also maintaining that all truths are analytic, that is, true in virtue of the meaning of the concepts involved.

This has led some commenters to think that Leibniz gave up the account of sufficient reason as an a priori proof. If there were a proof or demonstration, it would reveal that the concept of the predicate was contained in the concept of the subject in a finite number of steps and hence every proposition would be necessary. Leibniz is not a necessitarian in his mature philosophy and thus he could not have accepted this consequence. Instead, he must have shifted from the conception of a sufficient reason as an a priori proof to that of an a priori proof sequence, where the latter notion is understood as an analysis that converges on an identity without reaching it in a finite number of steps (see Sleigh 1983: 200). What it means for an analysis to converge on an identity is, unfortunately, obscure. Nevertheless, there is some clear sense in which every contingent truth has a sufficient reason on this understanding. The sufficient reason why it is true that Caesar crossed the Rubicon, for example, is that the concept crossing the Rubicon is contained in the concept Caesar. The truth of the proposition obtains in virtue of the concepts of the subject and the predicate. Of course, this reason is undiscoverable by any finite human mind because it is buried too deeply in the concept of Caesar. Only God, in his omniscience sees the conceptual connection between them. It is enough for there to be such a connection for there be a sufficient reason.

Such a conception of the nature of a sufficient reason have lead some commentators to think that for Leibniz the PSR is a logical notion or that it is a metaphysical notion that is ultimately reducible to logic (Couturat 1901: 123ff and Russell 1937: v). But the notion of a sufficient reason as a non-terminating proof sequence is not the only conception of a sufficient reason to be found in Leibniz. And other conceptions have a decidedly less logical and more metaphysical flavor.

One such characterization of a sufficient reason comes from Leibniz’s conviction that in order to preserve the notion of causal activity, without which substances are not really substances—i.e., truly fundamental building blocks of reality—philosophy must revive something like the ancient Aristotelian notion of a substantial form (see the discussion in the entry on Aristotle’s Metaphysics). Each genuine substance, for Leibniz, has what he calls a “primitive active force”. This force is the nature or essence of the substance. Now according to Leibniz, substances do not causally interact with one another (see the entry Leibniz on causation). The changes that they undergo derive solely from their own natures or primitive active force, which consequently determines the whole of its history. Many texts suggest that, for Leibniz, the sufficient reason for any state of a substance is its primitive active force (NE 65–6; T 400/G VI, 354; Mon. 18/G VI, 609–610; G IV, 507; G III, 72).

In many ways primitive active force plays the role of the concept of the subject in the logical version of the PSR. Just as on the logical version the PSR that a is F is explained by the fact that the concept of F-ness is in the concept of a, so too on the metaphysical version of the PSR fact that a is F is explained by the primitive active force of a that determines it to be F. Whereas commentators such as Couturat and Russell emphasize the logical notion of a sufficient reason to the detriment of the metaphysical notion, other commentators see the logical and the metaphysical as two equally fundamental presentations of the same datum (see Frankel 1994).

Another metaphysical characterization of a sufficient reason connects with the Principle of the Best, which says that for any proposition p, p is true just in case p holds in the best possible world (G VI.448/DM 22; Mon. 46, 53, 54/G VI, 614–616). Is the Principle of the Best a supplement to the PSR or a rival to the PSR? It is, in fact, a consequence of the PSR in conjunction with three additional assumptions: (1) the sufficient reason for every choice is that the chooser perceives it to the best; (2) God chooses the actual world; (3) God perceives something to be what is best just in case it is the best.

In some texts, Leibniz suggests that the sufficient reason for contingent truths cannot be found in the concepts or natures of things. We must instead look to the Principle of the Best (Mon. 36–38/G VI, 613). In other words the sufficient reason for any contingent proposition of the form “a is F” is that a is F is true in the best possible word. This appears to be an entirely different sort of reason than the fact that “a is F” is analytic or that the nature of a determines that it is F. Those reasons are to be found internal to the concept of the subject or the nature of the substance. Reasons that advert to the Principle of the Best look outside the concept of the subject or the nature of the substance and make comparisons between worlds in terms of their relative perfections. It is possible that Leibniz thought that these different conceptions of sufficient reasons were equivalent but that they are so is far from obvious.

3.2 Why Did Leibniz Believe the PSR?

Leibniz argues for the PSR in three distinct ways: (1) from the concept of a sufficient reason and the concept of a “requisite”; (2) from his theory of truth; and (3) inductively.

In some texts, Leibniz argues that the PSR is a conceptual truth that is derivable from the concepts of a sufficient reason and the concept of a requisite (A VI, ii, 438; see also G VII 393, LC L5.18; A VI.iii.133). The concept of a requisite is that of a necessary condition. In this context, Leibniz defines a sufficient reason as a sufficient condition. If something exists, then all of its requisites have been posited. Leibniz then asserts that if all of a things requisites have been posited, then it exists. Thus all of a thing’s requisites are a thing’s sufficient reason. The question-begging assumption is that all the necessary conditions for something to exist are jointly sufficient for it to exist. Anybody who denies the PSR will not agree with this assumption and it is clearly not encoded in the definitions of requisite and sufficient reason provided by Leibniz.

In other texts, Leibniz argues that the PSR follows from the conceptual containment theory of truth (A VI.iv.1645/L 268). Every truth is such that the concept of the predicate is contained the concept of the subject. This conceptual connection is the sufficient reason for the truth. Thus every truth has a sufficient reason.

It is worth noting that Leibniz believed the PSR before he developed his conceptual containment Theory of Truth. In fact, the PSR is one of Leibniz’s earliest and most stable philosophical commitments (see, for example, Leibniz’s 1671 letter to Wedderkopf A II.ii.117f/L146). This observation has led some scholars to conclude that rather than deriving the PSR from the conceptual containment theory of truth, Leibniz was in fact led to the conceptual containment theory from his antecedent commitment to the PSR. The conceptual containment theory explains how there could be a sufficient reason for every truth by guaranteeing that there will be an explanation in terms of conceptual relations (see Adams 1994: 69).

In his Fifth paper to Clarke, Leibniz argues for the PSR inductively. He says that there are many cases where a fact has a sufficient reason and no cases where fact is known not to have a sufficient reason. He then says that it is reasonable to assume that the PSR holds in all cases where we do not know that sufficient reason. Leibniz describes this as “the method of experimental philosophy, which proceeds a posteriori” (G VII 420; LC, L5.129).

3.3 Applications

Leibniz says that PSR is needed if we are to go beyond mathematics to metaphysics and natural science. How does the PSR help in those domains of inquiry? There is a general pattern of argument that Leibniz uses to establish conclusions using the PSR. First he assumes the falsity of what he wants to prove. Call the proposition to be proved p. Then he tries to show that if p were false, there would be some fact or truth for which there was no sufficient reason. But by the PSR, there is no fact or truth. Therefore, p is true. Leibniz uses this template to argue for a number of claims, including the identity of indiscernibles, relationalism with respect to space and time, and the existence of God. Let us briefly look at how Leibniz uses the PSR to argue for each of these theses.

Leibniz presents arguments for the existence of God from the PSR in a number of different places (for example, The Ultimate Origination of Things, G VII 302–3; L 486–8. Monadology §37). Suppose that God does not exist. If God does not exist, then the only things that exist are contingent beings. Would the entire series of contingent things have an explanation? The explanation of the entire series cannot be a member of the series since then it would explain itself and no contingent thing is self-explanatory. But the explanation cannot be outside of the series because he have assumed that there is no non-contingent being, i.e., God. Thus if God did not exist, there would be something unexplained: the series of contingent beings. Everything has an explanation. Therefore God exists.

Leibniz also thinks that the PSR rules out the possibility that there could be two or more indistinguishable, that is, indiscernible, things (A VI, iv, 1541/AG 42). If there were two such things, God would have treated them differently insofar as he has related them differently to the rest of the world. For example, if there were two blades of grass that were indiscernible from each other, then one blade would stand in spatial and temporal relation \(R\) to the rest of the world, whereas the other blade would stand in some other spatial and temporal relation \(R'\) to the rest of the world. Why did God choose to put the first blade relation \(R\) to the rest of the world instead of \(R'\)? Leibniz claims that since they are indiscernible from each other, there could be no reason for God to treat them differently. Thus if there were two indiscernible individuals, then God would have acted for no reason. But there is a reason for everything. So, there are no indiscernible yet numerically distinct things.

For similar reasons, Leibniz thinks that space and time cannot be substances or anything else absolute and must ultimately be a system of relations that obtain between bodies (e.g., LC, L, 3.5). This is because if space, for example, were absolute, then there would be space points that were indiscernible from one another. God would treat these space points differently from each other insofar as he orients his creation in space one way rather than another. This would have to be an arbitrary decision for the reasons outlined above. So, space and time are not absolute (see Lin 2011).

4. The PSR before Spinoza and Leibniz

The PSR is nearly as old as philosophy itself. Anaximander, one of the earliest of the pre-Socratics, is usually credited—on the basis of Aristotle’s de Caelo, (b12 295b10–16)—with being the first to make use of it. Anaximander argues, we are told, that the Earth remains stationary in space because it is indifferent between motions in any direction. This indifference means that there is no reason why it should move in one direction rather than another. Since he concludes from this that it does not move, we can assume that Anaximander believes that motion in the absence of a reason is impossible.

Parmenides, another pre-Socratic, implicitly appeals to the PSR when he claims that the world cannot have come into existence because then it would have come from nothing (Fragment B8 9–10). Nothing comes from nothing. If it did, Parmenides asks, why did it not come into existence at an earlier or a later time? Parmenides appears to reason as follows. If the world came into existence, the actual moment that it came into existence would be arbitrary. It would be a brute fact. There are no brute facts (the PSR). So, the world did not come into existence.

Another ancient source for the PSR is Archimedes who writes:

Equal weights at equal distances are in equilibrium, and equal weights at unequal distances are not in equilibrium but incline towards the weight which is at the greater distance.

This is a special case of the PSR and is cited by Leibniz in his correspondence with Clarke as a precedent for the PSR.

In the medieval period, Peter Abelard argued that God must create the best of all possible worlds. If he didn’t, Abelard argues, there would have to be some reason for it. But what reason could that be except God’s injustice or jealousy? But God cannot be unjust or jealous. So there is no possible reason for God making anything less than the best. Everything has a reason. Thus God makes the best possible world. Abelard’s opinion was rejected as heresy and mainstream opinion of philosophers during the Middle Ages appears to reject the PSR. God, on the mainstream medieval view, enjoys freedom of indifference with respect to his creation. Thus there is no sufficient reason for why God created what he did and the PSR slips from prominence until its early modern revival at the hands of Spinoza and Leibniz.

Some great epistemological rationalists, such as Plato and Descartes, appear to endorse the PSR but in fact do not. For example, in the Timaeus Plato writes,

[E]verything that comes to be must of necessity come to be by the agency of some cause, for it is impossible for anything to come to be without a cause. (28a4–5)

This passage appears to assert the PSR. But Plato believes that there are things that are not among the things that “come to be”, and some of these things have no cause or reason. For example, the Demiurge creates the world by imposing order on disorderly motion. The disorderly motion preexists the work of the Demiurge. It is uncaused and there is no reason for it.

At times, Descartes appears to endorse the PSR. For example, he argues for the existence of God in the third Mediation on the basis of the principle that there must be at least as much reality in the cause as in the effect. And he justifies this causal principle by claiming that “Nothing comes from nothing”. This appears to make him as much an adherent of the PSR as Parmenides who, as we have seen, argues for his conclusions on the same basis. But elsewhere Descartes claims that God creates the eternal truths, such as mathematical and metaphysical truths (Letters to Mersenne, April 15, May 6, and 27, 1630; Fifth Replies, AT 7:380, CSM 2:261). Moreover, he claims that God creates these truths by an act of will which is free and indifferent. Thus there can be no reason for God’s will to create any of these truths. If the act of will by means of which God creates the mathematical and metaphysical truths is contingent and yet has no sufficient reason according to Descartes, then his philosophy is deeply antithetical to the PSR. Of course, Descartes, like many of the others we have discussed may have endorsed a restricted version of the PSR. But the most natural and rationalistically acceptable restriction would be to contingent truths. Descartes’ doctrine of the creation of the eternal truths holds that there is at least one contingent truth (the act of will by means of which God creates the eternal truths) which lacks a sufficient reason.

5. The PSR in Eighteenth-Century Philosophy and German Idealism

Hume’s critique of causation presents an important challenge to the PSR. In his Treatise of Human Nature (I, 3, 3) Hume considers several arguments which attempt to prove the “general maxim in philosophy, that whatever begins to exist, must have a cause” and finds all of them wanting. Hume argues that since the ideas of cause and its effect are evidently distinct, we can clearly conceive or imagine an object without its cause. He takes the separability of the two ideas to show that there is no necessary conceptual relation between the ideas of cause and effect insofar as conceiving the one without the other does not imply any contradiction or absurdity.

Christian Wolff (1679–1754), the most influential German philosopher of the first half of the eighteenth century, was a follower of Leibniz and developed the latter’s system. Like Leibniz, Wolff assigned to the PSR a central role in his system while attempting to avoid necessitarianism (or “fatalism”). Like Spinoza and Leibniz, Wolff demanded a reason for both the possibility of things [ratio essendi] (i.e., coherence of essence) and for the actualization, or coming to be, of essences [ratio fiendi]. Wolff mildly criticized Leibniz’s grounding of the PSR merely in experience and attempted to marshal several proofs for the principle (Rational Thoughts, §§30–31, 143; Ontologia, §§56–78). One of these proofs attempts to prove the PSR relying on the principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles (Metaphysical Thoughts §31), while the most famous proof attempts to derive the PSR from the Law of Non-Contradiction. According to the latter, if a thing \(A\) is assumed to exist without reason, than “nothing is posited that explains why \(A\) exists”. This, according to Wolff, would mean that \(A\) exists because of nothing (Ontologia, §70), which Wolff claims to be absurd. Kant criticized the proof claiming that it is based on an equivocal use of the term “nothing” (AK 1:398).

Leonhard Euler, the great Swiss mathematician and a contemporary of Wolff, warned against the “wretched abuse” of the PSR by those who

employ it so dexterously that by means of it they are in a condition to demonstrate whatever suits their purpose, and to demolish whatever is raised against them. (Letters to German Princess, Letter XIII)

According to Euler, many of the proofs which rely on the PSR amount to nothing over and above a petitio principii, while others derive carelessly the impossibility of things from our ignorance of the causes of these things.

In the Critique of Pure Reason (1781, 1787), Kant claims to provide a proof for the PSR by showing that

the PSR is the ground of possible experience, namely the objective cognition of appearances with regards to their relation in the successive series of time. (B/246/A201)

Relying on his transcendental method Kant argues in the “Second Analogy of Experience” that a certain version of the PSR is a condition for the possibility of experience, and as a result also a condition for the possibility of objects of experience. Yet, this argument also restricts the validity of the PSR to human experience, i.e., to things which appear in space and time. Any use of the PSR that transgresses the boundaries of human experience is bound to generate antinomies.

Kant’s view of space and time as exhibiting brute difference (i.e., the non-identity of locations in space and time cannot be reduced to conceptual explanation) stands in sharp contrast to the Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles, and thereby also to the PSR. Salomon Maimon, Kant’s rationalist critic, attempted to enforce rationalist strictures on Kant’s philosophy by arguing that Kant is unable to explain the necessary agreement of intuitions and concepts. According to Kant, intuitions and concepts come from entirely different sources: sensibility and understanding. But if this were the case, claims Maimon, we could not explain the constant agreement between intuitions and concepts, which is necessary for the possibility of experience. This agreement can be explained if we reject the radical heterogeneity of intuitions and concepts, and view intuitions as disguised concepts. Thus, any difference exhibited in space and time must have its ground in the universal forms of our thought in general (Maimon, Essay on Transcendental Philosophy, Ch. 1, p. 13). Maimon also argued that we must seek an explanation for the fact that we have two forms of intuition rather than one, and suggested that it is only the interplay between the two forms of intuition which allows us to exhibit difference, by using a unity in one form to exhibit difference in the other form, i.e., conceive different times by concentrating on the change occurring at the same location in space, or conceive different locations in space at the same point in time (Essay, Ch. 1, pp. 13–14).

Ground [Grund] and the Principle of Sufficient Ground [der Satz vom zureichenden Grund] play a significant role in Hegel’s Logic. For Hegel, the demand for ground provides a major source of transition from one thing to another. It is, Hegel says, “the expulsion of itself from itself” (Encyclopedia Logic, §121A). Ground, for Hegel, is the unity of identity and difference: the ground of \(x\) has to explain all features of \(x\), and in sense duplicates it, yet it must also be different from \(x\) in order to have explanatory value and not be a mere petitio principii.

The PSR is the subject of Schopenahuer’s 1813 doctoral dissertation: The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason. In this work, Schopenhauer provides a brief history of the PSR, and then raises the questions of the justification for the PSR and the proper scope of the principle. Schopenhauer follows Wolff in distinguishing among four kinds of reasons, corresponding to four kinds of objects, and charges that much philosophical confusion arises from attempts to explain objects of one kind by reasoning that belongs to the other kind. These four kinds of explanation, or four variants of the PSR, share the very same ground. Along Kantian lines Schopenhauer suggests that it is the subject’s activity in regularly connecting representations that is ground of the PSR (The Fourfold Root, §16).

6. The PSR in Contemporary Philosophy

The notion of grounding has been increasingly a topic of discussion in contemporary metaphysics. Grounding is said to be a kind of explanation distinct from causal explanation. It is metaphysical or constitutive explanation. It is generally taken to be asymmetric, irreflexive, and transitive. Alleged examples of grounding relations are: dispositions (e.g., fragility) are grounded in categorical features (e.g., molecular structure); semantic facts (e.g., Jones means addition by “+”) are grounded by non-semantic facts (e.g., Jones is disposed to draw certain inferences); mental properties (e.g., pain) are grounded by physical properties (e.g., c-fibers firing; see Rosen 2010 and Fine 2012). It has recently been proposed by Dasgupta that a version of the PSR could be formulated in terms of grounds. The proposal is formulated as follows:

PSR: For every substantive fact \(Y\) there are some facts, the \(X\)s, such that (i) the \(X\)s ground \(Y\) and (ii) each one of the \(X\)s is autonomous. (Dasgupta 2016: 12)

Here substantive means apt for grounding and autonomous means not apt for grounding. For example, perhaps essentialist facts are autonomous where essentialist facts are facts of the form: it is essential to \(x\) that \(\phi\). The idea is that just as definitions are not apt for proof, essentialist facts are not apt for grounding explanations, that is, they are autonomous (Dasgupta 2016: 6–9). The notion of an autonomous fact allows the adherent of this version of the PSR to avoid the Agrippan Trilemma without allowing for self-explanatory facts or infinite regresses. Chains of explanation terminate with autonomous facts, which are not brute because they are not apt for explanation.

Following Bolzano (Theory of Science: vol. II, 259–264), most contemporary theories of grounding affirm the irreflexivity of this relation (see Fine 2001: 15; Schaffer 2009: 364; and Rosen 2010: 115). More recently, Fine showed that given certain plausible premises, one may point out counterexamples to irreflexivity (Fine 2010; cf. Krämer 2013), and the issue has been further challenged by Jenkins (2011).

Jonathan Schaffer has relied on the notion of ground to revive an Aristotelian, structured metaphysics, i.e., a metaphysics which is ordered by priority relations (Schaffer 2009), and to defend Priority Monism (see the entry on monism). In response, Michael Della Rocca (2014) has argued that strict adherence to the PSR—and to Ockham’s Razor (see the entry on simplicity)—undermines Schaffer’s structured metaphysics (and Priority Monism), since insofar as all the features of the grounded are already present in the ground, the existence of the grounded is just redundant. (See also the entry on metaphysical grounding).

The role of the PSR in ethics and political theory has not been seriously studied so far. Clearly, the PSR may be marshaled in order to question our reliance on mere intuitions. The repugnance of a certain view cannot be taken at face value, but rather requires a justification. In the past, various racist and conservative views relied merely on the alleged repugnance of certain sexual acts (e.g., homosexuality, interracial relations). The requirement to dig deeper and ask a person to justify her intuitions may help the person understand the maxims guiding her specific moral beliefs. Adherence to the PSR may also shift the onus of proof in the debate between those who consider our preferential evaluation of human beings over other things in nature as simply brute (Williams 2006: 195) and those who insist that if human beings have a special value, there must be a reason for the ascription of such value (Buss 2012: 343).

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Other Internet Resources

  • Candide, Wikipedia entry on the famous satire in which Voltaire mocks both Leibniz's belief that this is the best of all possible worlds and the principle of sufficient reason. [Permanent Link]

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Yitzhak Y. Melamed <ymelame1@jhu.edu>
Martin Lin <mlin@philosophy.rutgers.edu>

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