Arthur Schopenhauer

First published Mon May 12, 2003; substantive revision Thu May 11, 2017

Arthur Schopenhauer was among the first 19th century philosophers to contend that at its core, the universe is not a rational place. Inspired by Plato and Kant, both of whom regarded the world as being more amenable to reason, Schopenhauer developed their philosophies into an instinct-recognizing and ultimately ascetic outlook, emphasizing that in the face of a world filled with endless strife, we ought to minimize our natural desires for the sake of achieving a more tranquil frame of mind and a disposition towards universal beneficence. Often considered to be a thoroughgoing pessimist, Schopenhauer in fact advocated ways — via artistic, moral and ascetic forms of awareness — to overcome a frustration-filled and fundamentally painful human condition. Since his death in 1860, his philosophy has had a special attraction for those who wonder about life’s meaning, along with those engaged in music, literature, and the visual arts.

1. Life: 1788–1860

Exactly a month younger than the English Romantic poet, Lord Byron (1788–1824), who was born on January 22, 1788, Arthur Schopenhauer came into the world on February 22, 1788 in Danzig [Gdansk, Poland] — a city that had a long history in international trade as a member of the Hanseatic League. The Schopenhauer family was of Dutch heritage, and the philosopher’s father, Heinrich Floris Schopenhauer (1747–1805), was a successful merchant and shipowner who groomed his son to assume control of the family’s business. A future in the international business trade was envisioned from the day Arthur was born, as reflected in how Schopenhauer’s father carefully chose his son’s first name on account of its identical spelling in German, French and English. In March 1793, when Schopenhauer was five years old, his family moved to the Free and Hanseatic City of Hamburg after the formerly free city of Danzig was annexed by Prussia.

Schopenhauer toured through Europe several times with his family as a youngster and young teenager, and lived in France (1797–99) [ages 9-11] and England (1803) [age 15], where he learned the languages of those countries. As he later reported, his experiences in France were among the happiest of his life. The memories of his stay at a strict, Anglican-managed boarding school in Wimbledon were rather agonized in contrast, and this set him against the English style of Christianity for the rest of his life.

The professional occupations of a merchant or banker were not sufficiently consistent with Schopenhauer’s scholarly disposition, and although for two years after his father’s death (in Hamburg, April 20, 1805; possibly by suicide, when Schopenhauer was seventeen) he continued to respect the commercial aspirations his father had had for him, he finally left his Hamburg business apprenticeship at age 19 to prepare for university studies. In the meantime, his mother, Johanna Henriette Troisiener Schopenhauer (1766–1838), who was the daughter of a city senator, along with Schopenhauer’s sister, Luise Adelaide [Adele] Lavinia Schopenhauer (1797–1849), left their Hamburg home at Neuer Wandrahm 92 and moved to Weimar after Heinrich Floris’s death, where Johanna established a friendship with Johann Wolfgang von Goethe (1749–1832). In Weimar, Goethe frequently visited Johanna’s intellectual salon, and Johanna Schopenhauer became a well-known writer of the period, producing a voluminous assortment of essays, travelogues, novels (e.g., Gabriele [1819], Die Tante [1823], Sidonia [1827], Richard Wood [1837]), and biographies, such as her accounts of the German art critic, archaeologist, and close friend, Carl Ludwig Fernow (1763–1808), and of the Flemish painter, Jan van Eyck (c.1390–1441), published in 1810 and 1822 respectively. Her complete works total twenty-four volumes.

In 1809, Schopenhauer began studies at the University of Göttingen, where he remained for two years, first majoring in medicine, and then, philosophy. In Göttingen, he absorbed the views of the skeptical philosopher, Gottlob Ernst Schulze (1761–1833), who introduced him to Plato and Kant. Schopenhauer next enrolled at the University of Berlin (1811–13), where his lecturers included Johann Gottlieb Fichte (1762–1814) and Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768–1834). His university studies in Göttingen and Berlin included courses in physics, psychology, astronomy, zoology, archaeology, physiology, history, literature, and poetry. At age 25, and ready to write his doctoral dissertation, Schopenhauer moved in 1813 to Rudolstadt, a small town located a short distance southwest of Jena, where he lodged for the duration in an inn named Zum Ritter. Entitling his work The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason (Über die vierfache Wurzel des Satzes vom zureichenden Grunde), it formed the centerpiece of his later philosophy, articulating arguments he would later use to criticize as charlatans, the prevailing German Idealistic philosophers of the time, namely, his former lecturer, J. G. Fichte, along with F. W. J. Schelling (1775–1854) and G. W. F. Hegel (1770–1831). In that same year, Schopenhauer submitted his dissertation to the nearby University of Jena and was awarded a doctorate in philosophy in absentia.

Leaving his mother’s apartment in 1814 where he had been residing briefly, Schopenhauer moved to Dresden, where he lived until 1818. There he developed ideas from The Fourfold Root into his most famous book, The World as Will and Representation, that was completed in March of 1818 and published in December of that same year (with the date, 1819). In sympathy with Goethe’s theory of color, he also wrote On Vision and Colors (1816) during this time. In Dresden, Schopenhauer developed an acquaintance with the philosopher and freemason, Karl Christian Friedrich Krause (1781–1832), who had also been one of Fichte’s students in Berlin, whose own panentheistic views appear to have been influential. Panentheism (i.e., all-in-God), as opposed to pantheism (i.e., all-is-God), is the view that what we can comprehend and imagine to be the universe is an aspect of God, but that the being of God is in excess of this, and is neither identical with, nor exhausted by, the universe we can imagine and comprehend. As we will see below, Schopenhauer sometimes characterized the thing-in-itself in a way reminiscent of panentheism.

After a year’s vacation in Italy and with The World as Will and Representation in hand, Schopenhauer applied for the opportunity to lecture at the University of Berlin, the institution at which he had formerly studied, and where two years earlier (1818), Hegel had arrived to assume Fichte’s prestigious philosophical chair. His experiences in Berlin were less than professionally fruitful, however, for in March of 1820, Schopenhauer self-assuredly scheduled his class at a time that was simultaneous with Hegel’s popular lectures, and few students chose to hear Schopenhauer. Two years later, in 1822, he left his apartment near the University and travelled to Italy for a second time, returning to Munich a year later. He then lived in Mannheim and Dresden in 1824 before tracing his way back to Berlin in 1825. A second attempt to lecture at the University of Berlin was unsuccessful, and this disappointment was complicated by the loss of a lawsuit that had begun several years earlier in August, 1821. The dispute issued from an angry shoving-match between Schopenhauer and Caroline Luise Marguet (d. 1852), a 47-year-old seamstress, that occurred in the rooming house where they were both living. The issue concerned Ms. Marguet’s conversing loudly with her associates in the anteroom of Schopenhauer’s apartment, making it difficult for him to concentrate on his work. The conversations were apparently a matter of routine that built up Schopenhauer’s animosity, leading to the explosive confrontation.

Leaving Berlin in 1831 in view of a cholera epidemic that was entering Germany from Russia, Schopenhauer moved south, first briefly to Frankfurt-am-Main, and then to Mannheim. Shortly thereafter, in June of 1833, he settled permanently in Frankfurt, where he remained for the next twenty-seven years, residing in an apartment along the river Main’s waterfront from 1843 to 1859 at Schöne Aussicht 17, a few minutes walking distance from Frankfurt’s Judengasse. His daily life, living alone with a succession of pet French poodles (named Atma and Butz), was defined by a deliberate routine: Schopenhauer would awake, wash, read and study during the morning hours, play his flute, lunch at the Englisher Hof — a fashionable inn at the city center near the Hauptwache — rest afterwards, read, take an afternoon walk, check the world events as reported in The London Times, sometimes attend concerts in the evenings, and frequently read inspirational texts such as the Upanishads before going to sleep.

During this later phase of his life, Schopenhauer wrote a short work in 1836, Über den Willen in der Natur (On the Will in Nature), that aimed to confirm and reiterate his metaphysical views in light of scientific evidence. Featured in this work are chapters on animal magnetism and magic, along with Sinology (Chinese studies). The former reveals Schopenhauer’s interest in parapsychology; the latter is valuable for its references to the preeminent Neo-Confucian scholar, Zhu Xi (1130-1200), as well as to influential writers on Asian thought from the period such as Robert Spence Hardy (1803–1868) and Issac Jacob Schmidt (1779–1847).

Shortly thereafter in 1839, Schopenhauer completed an essay of which he was immensely proud, “On the Freedom of Human Will” (Über die Freiheit des menschlichen Willens), that was awarded first prize in a competition sponsored by the Royal Norwegian Society of Sciences and Letters in Trondheim. A year later, he complemented this with a second essay, “On the Basis of Morality” (Über die Grundlage der Moral) that was not honored with an award by The Royal Danish Society of the Sciences in Copenhagen, even though it was the sole submission in their essay competition. The Society claimed that Schopenhauer did not answer the assigned question and that he gravely disrespected philosophers with outstanding reputations (viz., Fichte and Hegel). In 1841, Schopenhauer defiantly published both essays together as Two Fundamental Problems of Ethics (Die Beiden Grundprobleme der Ethik). There soon followed an accompanying volume to The World as Will and Representation, that was published in 1844 along with the first volume in a combined second edition.

In 1851, Schopenhauer published a lengthy and lively set of philosophical reflections entitled Parerga and Paralipomena (appendices and omissions, from the Greek), and within a couple of years, he began to receive the philosophical recognition for which he had long hoped. The recognition was stimulated by a favorable review of his philosophy published in 1853 without signature in the Westminster Review (“Iconoclasm in German Philosophy,” by John Oxenford), that, acknowledging the centrality of “Will” within Schopenhauer’s outlook, drew insightful parallels between Schopenhauer’s and Fichte’s more well-known thought. A year after the third edition of The World as Will and Representation appeared in 1859, Schopenhauer died peacefully on September 21, 1860, in his apartment in Frankfurt at Schöne Aussicht 16. He was 72. After his death, Julius Frauenstädt (1813–1879) published new editions of most of Schopenhauer’s works, with the first complete edition (six volumes) appearing in 1873. In the 20th century, the editorial work on Schopenhauer’s manuscripts was carried forth in authoritative depth by Arthur Hübscher (1897–1985).

Schopenhauer donated his estate to help disabled Prussian soldiers and the families of those soldiers killed, who had participated in the suppression of the 1848 revolution. An assortment of photographs of Schopenhauer was taken during his final years, and although they reveal to us an old man, we should appreciate that Schopenhauer completed his main work, The World as Will and Representation, by the time he had reached the age of thirty.

2. The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason

Schopenhauer’s PhD dissertation of 1813, The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, examines what many philosophers have recognized as an innate tendency to assume that in principle, the universe is a thoroughly understandable place. His dissertation, in effect, critically examines the disposition to assume that what is real is what is rational. A century earlier, G.W. Leibniz (1646–1716) had defined the principle of this assumption — the principle of sufficient reason — in his Monadology (1714) as that which requires us to acknowledge that there is no fact or truth that lacks a sufficient reason why it should be so, and not otherwise.

Although the principle of sufficient reason might seem to be self-evident, it does yield surprising results. For example, we can appeal to this principle to argue that there can be no two individuals exactly alike, because there would otherwise be no sufficient reason why one of the individuals was in one place, while the other individual was in another. The principle also supports the argument that the physical world was not created at any point in time, since there is no sufficient reason why it would be created at one point in time rather than another, since all points in time are qualitatively the same. Moreover, if the principle of sufficient reason’s scope of applicability is assumed to be limitless, then there is a definite answer to the question, “Why is there something, rather than nothing?” Schopenhauer was keen to question the universal extension of the principle of sufficient reason, mainly owing to his advocacy of Kant’s view that human rationality lacks the power to answer metaphysical questions, since our knowledge is limited by our specific and narrowly-circumscribed capacities for organizing our field of sensation.

Schopenhauer observed as an elementary condition, that to employ the principle of sufficient reason, we must think about something specific that stands in need of explanation. This indicated to him that at the root of our epistemological situation, we must assume the presence of a subject that thinks about some object to be explained. From this, he concluded that the general root of the principle of sufficient reason is the distinction between subject and object that must be presupposed as a condition for the very enterprise of looking for explanations (The Fourfold Root, Section 16) and as a condition for knowledge in general.

Schopenhauer’s claim that the subject-object distinction is the most general condition for human knowledge has its theoretical source in Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason, for Kant similarly grounded his own theory of knowledge upon a highly-abstracted, formalized, and universalized subject-object distinction. Kant characterized the subjective pole of the distinction as the contentless transcendental unity of self-consciousness and the objective pole as the contentless transcendental object, that corresponds to the concept of an object in general (CPR, A 109). The general root of the principle of sufficient reason, as Schopenhauer characterizes it, is at the root of Kant’s epistemology as well.

Following the demanding conceptions of knowledge typical of his time that had been inspired by René Descartes’s (1596–1650) quest for certainty (see Descartes’s “method of doubt” and his “cogito” [Latin, for “I think”]), Schopenhauer maintained that if any explanation is to be genuine, then whatever is explained cannot be thought to have arisen by accident, but must be regarded as having been necessary. Schopenhauer’s investigation into the principle of sufficient reason can thus be alternatively characterized as an inquiry into the nature of the various kinds of necessary connection that can arise between different kinds of objects.

Inspired by Aristotle’s doctrine of the four basic kinds of explanatory reason or four [be]causes (Physics, Book II, Chapter 3), Schopenhauer defines four kinds of necessary connection that arise within the context of seeking explanations, and he correspondingly identifies four independent kinds of objects in reference to which explanations can be given:

  1. material things
  2. abstract concepts
  3. mathematical and geometrical constructions
  4. psychologically-motivating forces

Corresponding to these four kinds of objects, Schopenhauer links in parallel, four different kinds of reasoning. He associates material things with reasoning in terms of cause and effect; abstract concepts with reasoning in terms of logic; mathematical and geometrical constructions with reasoning in reference to numbers and spaces; and motivating forces with reasoning in reference to intentions, or what he calls moral reasoning. In sum, he identifies the general root of the principle of sufficient reason as the subject-object distinction in conjunction with the thought of necessary connection, and the fourfold root of the principle of sufficient reason as the specification of four different kinds of objects for which we can seek explanations, in association with the four independent styles of necessary connection along which such explanations can be given, depending upon the different kinds of objects involved.

One of Schopenhauer’s most significant assertions is that the four different modes of explanation only run in parallel with each other, and cannot coherently be intermixed. If we begin by choosing a certain style of explanation, then we immediately choose the kinds of object to which we can refer. Conversely, if we begin by choosing a certain kind of object to explain, we are obliged to use the style of reasoning associated with that kind of object. It thus violates the rationality of explanation to confuse one kind of explanation with another kind of object. We cannot begin with a style of explanation that involves material objects and their associated cause-and-effect relationships, for example, and then argue to a conclusion that involves a different kind of object, such as an abstract concept. Likewise, we cannot begin with abstract conceptual definitions and accordingly employ logical reasoning for the purposes of concluding our argumentation with assertions about things that exist.

With this set of regulations about what counts as a legitimate way to conduct explanations, Schopenhauer ruled out the often-cited and (especially during his time) philosophically often-relied-upon cosmological and ontological arguments for God’s existence, and along with them, all philosophies that ground themselves upon such arguments. He was adamant that the German Idealist outlooks of Fichte, Schelling and Hegel rested upon explanatory errors of this kind, and he regarded those outlooks as fundamentally wrongheaded styles of thought, for he saw their philosophies as being specifically grounded upon versions of the ontological argument for God’s existence. His frequent condemnation of German Idealism was advanced in light of what he considered to be sound philosophical reasons, despite his ad hominem attacks on Fichte, Schelling and Hegel.

3. Schopenhauer’s Critique of Kant

Schopenhauer can be called a Kantian in many respects, but he did not always agree with the details of Kant’s arguments. As noted, Schopenhauer’s teacher in Göttingen was G. E. Schulze, who authored in 1792, a text entitled Aenesidemus, that contains a criticism of the Kantian philosopher, Karl Leonhard Reinhold (1757–1823). Reinhold was a defender of Kant, and was known for his Philosophy of the Elements (Elementarphilosophie) that was expressed, along with some earlier writings, in Reinhold’s 1791 work, The Foundation of Philosophical Knowledge (Fundament des philosophischen Wissens).

Schulze’s critique of Kant is essentially the following: it is incoherent to posit as a matter of philosophical knowledge — as Kant seems to have done — a mind-independent object that is beyond all human experience, and that serves as the primary cause of our sensory experience. Schulze shares this criticism of Kant with F. H. Jacobi, who expressed the same objection five years earlier in David Hume on Faith, or Idealism and Realism, a Dialogue [1787] in an appendix entitled “On Transcendental Idealism.” Schulze argues that Kant illegitimately uses the concept of causality to conclude as a matter of strong epistemological requirement, and not merely as a matter of rational speculation, that there is some object — namely, the thing-in-itself — outside of all possible human experience, that is nonetheless the cause of our sensations.

Schopenhauer concurs that hypothesizing a thing-in-itself as the cause of our sensations amounts to a constitutive application and projection of the concept of causality beyond its legitimate scope, for according to Kant himself, the concept of causality only supplies knowledge when it is applied within the field of possible experience, and not outside of it. Schopenhauer therefore denies that our sensations have an external cause in the sense that we can know there is some epistemologically inaccessible object — the thing-in-itself — that exists independently of our sensations and is the cause of them.

These internal problems with Kant’s argument suggest to Schopenhauer that Kant’s reference to the thing-in-itself as a mind-independent object (or as an object of any kind) is misconstrued. Schopenhauer maintains instead that if we are to refer to the thing-in-itself, then we must come to an awareness of it, not by invoking the relationship of causality — a relationship where the cause and the effect are logically understood to be distinct objects or events (since self-causation is a contradiction in terms) — but through another means altogether. As we will see in the next section, and as we can see immediately in the title of his main work — The World as Will and Representation — Schopenhauer believes that the world has a double-aspect, namely, as “Will” (Wille) and as representation (Vorstellung). The German word, “Vorstellung”, can be translated as “representation”, “presentation,” “idea”, or “mental image.”

Schopenhauer does not believe, then, that Will causes our representations. His position is that Will and representations are one and the same reality, regarded from different perspectives. They stand in relationship to each other in a way that compares to the relationship between a force and its manifestation (e.g., as exemplified in the relationship between electricity and a spark, where the spark “is” electricity). This is opposed to saying that the thing-in-itself causes our sensations, as if we were referring to one domino striking another. Schopenhauer’s view is that the relationship between the thing-in-itself and our sensations is more like that between two sides of a coin, neither of which causes the other, and both of which are of the same coin and coinage.

Among his other criticisms of Kant (see the appendix to the first volume of The World as Will and Representation, entitled, “Criticism of the Kantian Philosophy”), Schopenhauer maintains that Kant’s twelve categories of the human understanding — the various categories through which we logically organize our field of sensations into comprehensible and interrelated individual objects — are reducible to the single category of causality, and that this category, along with the forms of space and time, is sufficient to explain the basic format of all human experience, viz., individual objects dispersed throughout space and time, causally related to one another.

Schopenhauer further comprehends these three (and for him, interdependent) principles as expressions of a single principle, namely, the principle of sufficient reason, whose fourfold root he had examined in his doctoral dissertation. In The World as Will and Representation, Schopenhauer often refers to an aspect of the principle of sufficient reason as the principle of individuation (principium individuationis), linking the idea of individuation explicitly with space and time, but also implicitly with rationality, necessity, systematicity and determinism. He uses the principle of sufficient reason and the principle of individuation as shorthand expressions for what Kant had more complexly referred to as space, time and the twelve categories of the understanding (viz., unity, plurality, totality, reality, negation, limitation, substance, causality, reciprocity, possibility, actuality [Dasein], and necessity).

4. The World as Will

It is a perennial philosophical reflection that if one looks deeply enough into oneself, one will discover not only one’s own essence, but also the essence of the universe. For as one is a part of the universe as is everything else, the basic energies of the universe flow through oneself, as they flow through everything else. For that reason it is thought that one can come into contact with the nature of the universe if one comes into substantial contact with one’s ultimate inner being.

Among the most frequently-identified principles that are introspectively brought forth — and one that was the standard for German Idealist philosophers such as Fichte, Schelling and Hegel who were philosophizing within the Cartesian tradition — is the principle of self-consciousness. With the belief that acts of self-consciousness exemplify a self-creative process akin to divine creation, and developing a logic that reflects the structure of self-consciousness, namely, the dialectical logic of position, opposition and reconciliation (sometimes described as the logic of thesis, antithesis and synthesis), the German Idealists maintained that dialectical logic mirrors the structure not only of human productions, both individual and social, but the structure of reality as a whole, conceived of as a thinking substance or conceptually-structured-and-constituted entity.

As much as he opposes the traditional German Idealists in their metaphysical elevation of self-consciousness (which he regards as too intellectualistic), Schopenhauer philosophizes within the spirit of this tradition, for he believes that the supreme principle of the universe is likewise apprehensible through introspection, and that we can understand the world as various manifestations of this general principle. For Schopenhauer, this is not the principle of self-consciousness and rationally-infused will, but is rather what he simply calls “Will” — a mindless, aimless, non-rational impulse at the foundation of our instinctual drives, and at the foundational being of everything. Schopenhauer’s originality does not reside in his characterization of the world as Will, or as act — for we encounter this position in Fichte’s philosophy — but in the conception of Will as being devoid of rationality or intellect.

Having rejected the Kantian position that our sensations are caused by an unknowable object that exists independently of us, Schopenhauer notes importantly that our body — which is just one among the many objects in the world — is given to us in two different ways: we perceive our body as a physical object among other physical objects, subject to the natural laws that govern the movements of all physical objects, and we are aware of our body through our immediate awareness, as we each consciously inhabit our body, intentionally move it, and feel directly our pleasures, pains, and emotional states. We can objectively perceive our hand as an external object, as a surgeon might perceive it during a medical operation, and we can also be subjectively aware of our hand as something we inhabit, as something we willfully move, and of which we can feel its inner muscular workings.

From this observation, Schopenhauer asserts that among all the objects in the universe, there is only one object, relative to each of us — namely, our physical body — that is given in two entirely different ways. It is given as representation (i.e., objectively; externally) and as Will (i.e., subjectively; internally). One of his notable conclusions is that when we move our hand, this is not to be comprehended as a motivational act that first happens, and then causes the movement of our hand as an effect. He maintains that the movement of our hand is but a single act — again, like the two sides of a coin — that has a subjective feeling of willing as one of its aspects, and the movement of the hand as the other. More generally, he adds that the action of the body is nothing but the act of Will objectified, that is, translated into perception.

At this point in his argumentation, Schopenhauer has established only that among his many ideas, or representations, only one of them (viz., the [complex] representation of his body) has this special double-aspected quality. When he perceives the moon or a mountain, he does not under ordinary circumstances have any direct access to the metaphysical inside of such objects; they remain as representations that reveal to him only their objective side. Schopenhauer asks, though, how he might understand the world as an integrated whole, or how he might render his entire field of perception more comprehensible, for as things stand, he can directly experience the inside of one of his representations, but of no others. To answer this question, he uses the double-knowledge of his own body as the key to the inner being of every other natural phenomenon: he regards — as if he were trying to make the notion of universal empathy theoretically possible — every object in the world as being metaphysically double-aspected, and as having an inside or inner aspect of its own, just as his consciousness is the inner aspect of his own body. This is his rationale for rejecting Descartes’s causal interactionism, where thinking substance is said to cause changes in an independent material substance and vice-versa.

This precipitates a position that characterizes the inner aspect of things, as far as we can describe it, as Will. Hence, Schopenhauer regards the world as a whole as having two sides: the world is Will and the world is representation. The world as Will (“for us”, as he sometimes qualifies it) is the world as it is in itself, which is a unity, and the world as representation is the world of appearances, of our ideas, or of objects, which is a diversity. An alternative title for Schopenhauer’s main book, The World as Will and Representation, might well have been, The World as Reality and Appearance. Similarly, his book might have been entitled, The Inner and Outer Nature of Reality.

An inspiration for Schopenhauer’s view that ideas are like inert objects is George Berkeley (1685–1753), who describes ideas in this despiritualized way in his A Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge (1710) [Section 25]. A primary inspiration for Schopenhauer’s double-aspect view of the universe is Baruch (Benedict) de Spinoza (1632–1677), who developed a similarly-structured metaphysics, and who Schopenhauer had studied in his early years before writing his dissertation. A subsequent, but often highlighted inspiration is from the Upanishads (c. 900–600 BCE) that also express the view that the universe is double-aspected, having objective and subjective dimensions that are referred to respectively as Brahman and Atman.

Only a few months after completing his dissertation, Schopenhauer was exposed to classical Indian thought in late 1813 by the orientalist Friedrich Majer (1771–1818), who visited Johanna Schopenhauer’s salon in Weimar. Schopenhauer also probably met at the time, Julius Klaproth (1783–1835), who was the editor of Das Asiatische Magazin. As the records of his library book withdrawals indicate, Schopenhauer began reading the Bhagavadgita in December 1813 or very soon thereafter, and the Upanishads in March 1814. This also marks the time when Schopenhauer’s thought assumed an explicitly atheistic quality. Only a year before this, he was referring to himself explicitly in his notebooks as an “illuminated theist”, i.e., a mystic, in an 1812 discussion of Schelling’s philosophy (Manuscript Remains, Vol. 2, p. 373).

Schopenhauer’s appreciation for Indian thought was augmented in Dresden during the writing of The World as Will and Representation by Karl Friedrich Christian Krause, Schopenhauer’s 1815–1817 neighbor. Krause was not only a metaphysical panentheist (see biographic segment above); he was also an enthusiast of South Asian thought. Familiar with the Sanskrit language, he introduced Schopenhauer to publications on India in the Asiatisches Magazin, and these enhanced Schopenhauer’s studies of the first European-language translation of the Upanishads: in 1801, a Persian version of the Upanishads (the Oupnekhat) was rendered into Latin by the French Orientalist, Abraham Hyacinthe Anquetil-Duperron (1731-1805) — a scholar who also introduced translations of Zoroastrian texts into Europe in 1771.

Despite its general precedents within the philosophical family of double-aspect theories, Schopenhauer’s particular characterization of the world as Will is nonetheless novel and daring. It is also frightening and pandemonic: he maintains that the world as it is in itself (again, sometimes adding “for us”) is an endless striving and blind impulse with no end in view, devoid of knowledge, lawless, absolutely free, entirely self-determining and almighty. Within Schopenhauer’s vision of the world as Will, there is no God to be comprehended, and the world is conceived of as being inherently meaningless. When anthropomorphically considered, the world is represented as being in a condition of eternal frustration, as it endlessly strives for nothing in particular, and as it goes essentially nowhere. It is a world beyond any ascriptions of good and evil.

Schopenhauer’s denial of meaning to the world differs radically from the views of Fichte, Schelling and Hegel, all of whom sustained a distinct hope that everything is moving towards a harmonious and just end. Like these German Idealists, however, Schopenhauer also tries to explain how the world that we experience daily is the result of the activity of the central principle of things. As the German Idealists tried to account for the great chain of being — the rocks, trees, animals, and human beings — as the increasingly complicated and detailed objectifications of self-consciousness, Schopenhauer attempts to do the same by explaining the world as objectifications of Will.

For Schopenhauer, the world we experience is constituted by objectifications of Will that correspond first, to the general root of the principle of sufficient reason, and second, to the more specific fourfold root of the principle of sufficient reason. This generates initially, a two-tiered outlook (viz., Will [= reality] vs. objects-in-general [= appearance]), that articulates into a three-tiered outlook (viz., Will [= reality] vs. universal, non-spatio-temporal objects vs. individual, spatio-temporal objects), by further distinguishing between universalistic and individualistic levels within the sphere of objects.

The general philosophical pattern of a single world-essence that initially manifests itself as a multiplicity of abstract essences, that, in turn, manifest themselves as a multiplicity of physical individuals is found throughout the world. It is characteristic of Neoplatonism (c. third century, C.E., as represented by Plotinus [204–270]), as well as the Buddhist Three Body Doctrine [trikaya] of the Buddha’s manifestation, that is developed in the Yogacara school of Mahayana Buddhism as represented by Maitreya (270–350), Asanga (375–430) and Vasubandu (400–480).

According to Schopenhauer, corresponding to the level of the universal subject-object distinction, Will is immediately objectified into a set of universal objects or Platonic Ideas. These constitute the timeless patterns for each of the individual things that we experience in space and time. There are different Platonic Ideas, and although this multiplicity of Ideas implies that some measure of individuation is present within this realm, each Idea nonetheless contains no plurality within itself and is said to be “one.” Since the Platonic Ideas are in neither space nor time, they lack the qualities of individuation that would follow from the introduction of spatial and temporal qualifications. In these respects, the Platonic Ideas are independent of the specific fourfold root of the principle of sufficient reason, even though it would be misleading to say that there is no individuation whatsoever at this universal level, for there are many different Platonic Ideas that are individuated from one another. Schopenhauer refers to the Platonic Ideas as the direct objectifications of Will, and as the immediate objectivity of Will.

Will’s indirect objectifications appear when our minds continue to apply the principle of sufficient reason beyond its general root such as to introduce the forms of time, space and causality, not to mention logic, mathematics, geometry and moral reasoning. When Will is objectified at this level of determination, the world of everyday life emerges, whose objects are, in effect, kaleidoscopically multiplied manifestations of the Platonic forms, endlessly dispersed throughout space and time.

Since the principle of sufficient reason is — given Schopenhauer’s inspiration from Kant — the epistemological form of the human mind, the spatio-temporal world is the world of our own reflection. To that extent, Schopenhauer says that life is like a dream. As a condition of our knowledge, Schopenhauer believes that the laws of nature, along with the sets of objects that we experience, we ourselves create in way that is not unlike the way the constitution of our tongues invokes the taste of sugar. As Galileo Galilei (1564–1642) states in “The Assayer” (1623), if ears tongues and noses were removed from the world, then odors, tastes, and sounds would be removed as well.

At this point, what Schopenhauer has developed philosophically is surely interesting, but we have not yet mentioned its more remarkable and memorable aspect. If we combine his claim that the world is Will with his Kantian view that we are responsible for the individuated world of appearances, we arrive at a novel outlook — an outlook that depends heavily upon Schopenhauer’s characterization of the thing-in-itself as Will, understood to be an aimless, blind striving.

Before the human being comes onto the scene with its principle of sufficient reason (or principle of individuation) there are no individuals. It is the human being that, in its very effort to know anything, objectifies an appearance for itself that involves the fragmentation of Will and its breakup into a comprehensible set of individuals. The result of this fragmentation, given the nature of Will, is terrible: it is a world of constant struggle, where each individual thing strives against every other individual thing. The result is a permanent “war of all against all” akin to what Thomas Hobbes (1588–1679) characterized as the state of nature.

Kant maintains in the Critique of Pure Reason that we create the laws of nature (CPR, A125). Adding to this, Schopenhauer maintains in The World as Will and Representation that we create the violent state of nature, for his view is that the individuation we impose upon things, is imposed upon a blind striving energy that, once it becomes individuated and objectified, turns against itself, consumes itself, and does violence to itself. His paradigm image is of the bulldog-ant of Australia, that when cut in half, struggles in a battle to the death between its head and tail. Our very quest for scientific and practical knowledge creates — for Schopenhauer sinfully and repulsively — a world that feasts nightmarishly upon itself.

This marks the origin of Schopenhauer’s renowned pessimism: he claims that as individuals, we are the anguished products of our own epistemological making, and that within the world of appearances that we structure, we are fated to fight with other individuals, and to want more than we can ever have. On Schopenhauer’s view, the world of daily life is essentially violent and frustrating; it is a world that, as long as our consciousness remains at that level where the principle of sufficient reason applies in its fourfold root, will never resolve itself into a condition of greater tranquillity. As he explicitly states, daily life “is suffering” (WWR, Section 56) and to express this, he employs images of frustration taken from classical Greek mythology, such as those of Tantalus and the Danaids, along with the suffering of Ixion on the ever-spinning wheel of fire. The image of Sisyphus expresses the same frustrated spirit.

5. Transcending the Human Conditions of Conflict

5.1 Aesthetic Perception as a Mode of Transcendence

Schopenhauer’s violent vision of the daily world sends him on a quest for tranquillity, and he pursues this by retracing the path through which Will objectifies itself. He discovers more peaceful states of mind by directing his everyday, practically-oriented consciousness towards more extraordinary, universal and less-individuated states of mind, since he believes that the violence that a person experiences is proportional to the degree to which that person’s consciousness is individuated and objectifying. His view is that with less individuation and objectification, there is less conflict, less pain and more peace.

One way to achieve a more tranquil state of consciousness is through aesthetic perception. This is a special state of perceptual consciousness where we apprehend some spatio-temporal object and discern through this object, the object’s essence, archetype, or “Platonic Idea” that corresponds to the type of object in question. In this form of perception, we lose ourselves in the object, forget about our individuality, and become the clear mirror of the object. During the aesthetic perception of an individual apple tree, for example, we would perceive shining through the tree, the archetype of all apple trees (i.e., the Ur-phenomenon, as Goethe would describe it) in an appreciation of every apple tree that was, is, or will be. The kind of perception involved compares, for example, to the traditional portrait artist who discerns the shapes that nature intended to realize in a face, but that were not ideally realized. The painter consequently removes in the artistic portrait, the little hairs, warts, wrinkles and such, to present a more idealized, angelic, timeless, and perfected facial presentation, as we might see in a wedding or religious portrait.

Since Schopenhauer assumes that the quality of the subject of experience must correspond to the quality of the object of experience, he infers that in the state of aesthetic perception, where the objects are universalistic, the subject of experience must likewise assume a universalistic quality (WWR, Section 33). Aesthetic perception thus transforms an individually-oriented state of consciousness to a universally-oriented state of consciousness, or what Schopenhauer calls a pure will-less, painless, and timeless subject of knowledge (WWR, Section 34).

Few people supposedly have the capacity to remain in such an aesthetic state of mind for very long, and most are denied the transcendent tranquillity of aesthetic perception. Only the artistically-minded genius is naturally disposed to and can supposedly remain at length in the state of pure perception, and it is to these individuals Schopenhauer believes we must turn — as we appreciate their works of art — to obtain a more concentrated and knowledgeable glimpse of the Platonic Ideas (i.e., into the essences of things). The artistic genius contemplates these Ideas, creates a work of art that presents them in a manner more clear and accessible than is usual, and thereby communicates a universalistic vision to those who lack the idealizing power to see through, and to rise above, the ordinary world of spatio-temporal objects.

Schopenhauer states that the highest purpose of art is to communicate Platonic Ideas (WWR, Section 50). As constituting art, he has in mind the traditional five fine arts minus music, namely, architecture, sculpture, painting, and poetry. These four arts he comprehends in relation to the Platonic Ideas — those universal objects of aesthetic awareness that are located at the objective pole of the universal subject-object distinction at the root of the principle of sufficient reason. Schopenhauer’s account of the visual and literary arts corresponds to the world as representation in its immediate objectification, namely, the field of Platonic Ideas as opposed to the field of spatio-temporal objects.

As a counterpart to his interpretation of the visual and literary arts, Schopenhauer develops an account of music that coordinates it with the subjective pole of the universal subject-object distinction. Separate from the other traditional arts, he maintains that music is the most metaphysical art and is on a subjective, feeling-centered level with the Platonic Ideas themselves. Just as the Platonic Ideas contain the patterns for the types of objects in the daily world, music formally duplicates the basic structure of the world: the bass notes are analogous to inorganic nature, the harmonies are analogous to the animal world, and the melodies are analogous to the human world. The sounding of the bass note produces more subtle sonic structures in its overtones; similarly, inanimate nature produces animate life.

In the structure of music, Schopenhauer discerns a series of analogies to the structure of the physical world that allow him to claim that music is a copy of Will itself. His view might seem extravagant upon first hearing, but it rests on the thought that if one is to discern the truth of the world, it might be advantageous to apprehend the world, not exclusively in scientific, mechanical and causal terms, but rather in aesthetic, analogical, expressive and metaphorical terms that require a sense of taste for their discernment. If the form of the world is best reflected in the form of music, then the most philosophical sensibility will be a musical sensibility. This partially explains the positive attraction of Schopenhauer’s theory of music to creative spirits such as Richard Wagner and Friedrich Nietzsche, both of whom combined musical and philosophical interests in their work.

With respect to the theme of achieving more peaceful and transcendent states of mind, Schopenhauer believes that music achieves this by embodying the abstract forms of feelings, or feelings abstracted from their particular everyday circumstances. This allows us to perceive the essences of emotional life — “sadness itself,” “joy itself,” etc. — without the contingent contents that would typically cause suffering. By expressing emotion in this detached way, music allows us to apprehend the nature of the world without the frustration involved in daily life, and hence, in a mode of aesthetic awareness akin to the tranquil philosophical contemplation of the world. Insofar as music provides an abstract and painless vision of the world and of inner life, however, it also fails to evoke the compassion that issues from identifying tangibly with another person’s suffering. This deficiency motivates a shift from musical, or aesthetic, awareness to moral awareness.

5.2 Moral Awareness as a Mode of Transcendence

As many medieval Christians once assumed, Schopenhauer believed that we should minimize our fleshly desires, since moral awareness arises through an attitude that transcends our bodily individuality. Indeed, he states explicitly that his views on morality are entirely in the spirit of Christianity, as well as being consistent with the doctrines and ethical precepts of the sacred books of India (WWR, Section 68). Among the precepts he respects are those prescribing that one treat others as kindly as one treats oneself, that one refrain from violence and take measures to reduce suffering in the world, that one avoid egoism and thoughts directed towards revenge, and that one cultivate a strong sense of compassion. Such precepts are not unique to Christianity; Schopenhauer believes that they constitute most religiously-grounded moral views. Far from being immoralistic, his moral theory is written in the same vein as those of Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) and John Stuart Mill (1806–1873), that advocate principles that are in general accord with Christian precepts.

Schopenhauer’s conception of moral awareness coheres with his project of seeking more tranquil, transcendent states of mind. Within the moral realm, this quest for transcendence leads him to maintain that once we recognize each human as being merely an instance and aspect of the single act of Will that is humanity itself, we will appreciate that the difference between the tormentor and the tormented is illusory, and that in fact, the very same eye of humanity looks out from each and every person. According to the true nature of things, each person has all the sufferings of the world as his or her own, for the same inner human nature ultimately bears all of the pain and all of the guilt. Thus, with the consciousness of humanity in mind, a moral consciousness would realize that it has upon and within itself, the sins of the whole world (WWR, Sections 63 and 64). It should be noted that such a consciousness would also bear all of humanity’s joys, triumphs, and pleasures, but Schopenhauer does not develop this thought.

Not only, then, does the specific application of the principle of sufficient reason fragment the world into a set of individuals dispersed through space and time for the purposes of attaining scientific knowledge, this rationalistic principle generates the illusion that when one person does wrong to another, that these two people are essentially separate and private individuals. Just as the fragmentation of the world into individuals is necessary to apply the relationship of causality, where A causes B and where A and B are conceived to be two independent objects, this same cognitive fragmentation leads us to conceive of the relationships between people on a model where some person P acts upon person Q, where P and Q are conceived as two independent individuals. The conditions for scientific knowledge thus have a negative moral impact, because they lead us to regard each other as individuals separate and alien to one another.

By compassionately recognizing at a more universal level that the inner nature of another person is of the same metaphysical substance as oneself, one arrives at a moral outlook with a more concrete philosophical awareness. This compassionate way of apprehending another person is not merely understanding abstractly the proposition that “each person is a human being,” or understanding abstractly (as would Kant) that, in principle, the same regulations of rationality operate equally in each of us and oblige us accordingly as equals. It is to feel directly the life of another person in an almost magical way; it is to enter into the life of humanity imaginatively, such as to coincide with all others as much as one possibly can. It is to imagine equally, and in full force, what it is like to be both a cruel tormentor and a tormented victim, and to locate both opposing experiences and characters within a single, universal consciousness that is the consciousness of humanity itself. With the development of moral consciousness, one’s awareness expands towards the mixed-up, tension-ridden, bittersweet, tragicomic, multi-aspected and distinctively sublime consciousness of humanity itself.

Edmund Burke (1729–1797) characterized the sublime as a feeling of tranquillity tinged with terror, and Schopenhauer’s moral consciousness fits this description. Just as music embodies the emotional tensions within the world in an abstracted and distanced manner, and thus affords a measure of tranquillity by presenting a softened, sonic image of the daily world of perpetual conflict, a measure of tranquillity also attends moral consciousness. When attaining the universal consciousness of humanity that transcends spatial and temporal determinations, the desires that derive their significance from one’s personal condition as a spatio-temporal individual are seen for what they are, as being grounded upon the illusion of fragmentation, and they thereby lose much their compelling force. In this respect, moral consciousness becomes the “quieter” of the will, despite its first-person recognition of human torment. Works of art that portray this kind of sublime consciousness would include the Laocoön (c. 25 B.C.E.) and Hieronymous Bosch’s painting, Christ Carrying the Cross (c. 1515).

Negatively considered, moral consciousness delivers us from the unquenchable thirst that is individuated human life, along with the unremitting oscillation between pain and boredom. Positively considered, moral consciousness generates a measure of wisdom, as one’s outlook becomes akin to a universal novel that contains the templates for all of the human stories that have been repeating themselves generation after generation — stories comic and tragic, pathetic and triumphant, and trivial and monumental. One becomes like the steadfast tree, whose generations of leaves fall away with each passing season, as does generation after generation of people (Homer, Iliad, Book VI).

Schopenhauer maintains similarly in his “Essay on the Freedom of the Will” (1839) that everything that happens, happens necessarily. Having accepted Kant’s view that cause and effect relationships extend throughout the world of experience, he believes that every individual act is determined by prior causes or motives. This fatalistic realization is a source of comfort and tranquillity for Schopenhauer, for upon becoming aware that nothing can be done to alter the course of events, he finds that the struggle to change the world quickly loses its force (see also WWR, Section 56).

Schopenhauer denies the common conception that being free entails that, for any situation in which we acted, we could always have acted differently. He augments this denial, however, with the claim that each of us is free in a more basic sense. Noting that we have “an unshakeable certainty that we are the doers of our deeds” (“Essay on the Freedom of the Will”, Conclusion), he maintains that our sense of responsibility reveals an innate character that is self-determining and independent of experience. Just as individual trees and individual flowers are the multifarious expressions of the Platonic Ideas of tree and flower, each of our individual actions is the spatio-temporal manifestation of our respective innate or intelligible character.

A person’s intelligible character is a timeless act of Will that the person essentially is, and it can be conceived of as the subjective aspect of the Platonic Idea that would objectively define the person’s inner essence (WWR, Section 28), as a portrait artist might perceive it. This concept of the intelligible character is Kantian (Critique of Pure Reason, A539/B567), and in conjunction with Kant’s correlated concept of an empirical character (i.e., the intelligible character as it is experientially expressed) Schopenhauer regards it as a means to resolve the problem of freedom and determinism, and to be one of the most profound ideas in Kant’s philosophy.

From the standpoint of later philosophical influence, Schopenhauer’s discussion of the intelligible character resonates with Friedrich Nietzsche’s injunction to “become what one is” (Ecce Homo, “Why I am so Clever”, Section 9). Schopenhauer believes that as we learn more about ourselves, we can manifest our intelligible character more effectively, and can play our designated role “artistically and methodically, with firmness and grace.” With self-knowledge, we can transform our lives into works of art, as Nietzsche later prescribed.

Character development thus involves expanding the knowledge of our innate individual tendencies, and a primary effect of this knowledge and self-realization is greater peace of mind (WWR, Section 55). Moreover, since our intelligible character is both subjective and universal, its status coordinates with that of music, the highest art. This association with music — as Nietzsche probably observed — reveals a systematic link between Schopenhauer’s aesthetics and his moral theory, and it can account for Schopenhauer’s reference to the emergence of pleasing aesthetic and artistic, if not musical, qualities in connection with the expression of our acquired character.

5.3 Asceticism and the Denial of the Will-to-Live

According to Schopenhauer, aesthetic perception offers only a short-lived transcendence from the daily world. Neither is moral awareness, despite its comparative tranquillity in contrast to the daily world of violence, the ultimate state of mind. Schopenhauer believes that a person who experiences the truth of human nature from a moral perspective — who appreciates how spatial and temporal forms of knowledge generate a constant passing away, continual suffering, vain striving and inner tension — will be so repulsed by the human condition, and by the pointlessly striving Will of which it is a manifestation, that he or she will lose the desire to affirm the objectified human situation in any of its manifestations. The result is an attitude of denial towards our will-to-live, that Schopenhauer identifies with an ascetic attitude of renunciation, resignation, and willessness, but also with composure and tranquillity. In a manner reminiscent of traditional Buddhism, he recognizes that life is filled with unavoidable frustration, and acknowledges that the suffering caused by this frustration can itself be reduced by minimizing one’s desires. Moral consciousness and virtue thus give way to the voluntary poverty and chastity of the ascetic. St. Francis of Assisi (WWR, Section 68) and Jesus (WWR, Section 70) subsequently emerge as Schopenhauer’s prototypes for the most enlightened lifestyle, in conjunction with the ascetics from every religious tradition.

This emphasis upon the ascetic consciousness and its associated detachment and tranquillity introduces some paradox into Schopenhauer’s outlook, for he admits that the denial of our will-to-live entails a terrible struggle with instinctual energies, as we avoid the temptations of bodily pleasures and resist the mere animal force to endure and flourish. Before we can enter the transcendent consciousness of heavenly tranquillity, we must pass through the fires of hell and experience a dark night of the soul, as our universal self combats our individuated and physical self, as pure knowledge struggles against animalistic will, and as freedom struggles against nature.

One can maintain superficially that no contradiction is involved in the act of struggling (i.e., willing) to deny the will-to-live, because one is not saying that Will is somehow destroying itself, but only saying that a more universal manifestation of Will is overpowering a less universal manifestation, namely, the natural, individuated, physically-embodied aspect. Within this opposition, it does remain that Will as a whole is set against itself according to the very model Schopenhauer is trying to transcend, namely, the model wherein one manifestation of Will fights against another manifestation, like the divided bulldog ant. This in itself is not a problem, but the location of the tormented and self-crucifying ascetic consciousness at the penultimate level of enlightenment is paradoxical, owing to its high degree of inner ferocity. Even though this ferocity occurs at a reflective and introspective level, we have before us a spiritualized life-and-death struggle within the ascetic consciousness.

This peculiarity notwithstanding, the ascetic’s struggle is none other than a supreme struggle against human nature. It is a struggle against the close-to-unavoidable tendency to apply the principle of sufficient reason for the purpose of attaining practical knowledge — an application that for Schopenhauer has the repulsive side-effect of creating the illusion, or nightmare, of a world permeated with endless conflict. From a related angle, the ascetic’s struggle is against the forces of violence and evil, that, owing to Schopenhauer’s acceptance and interpretation of Kant’s epistemology, locates these forces significantly within human nature itself. When the ascetic transcends human nature, the ascetic resolves the problem of evil: by removing the individuated and individuating human consciousness from the scene, the entire spatio-temporal situation within which daily violence occurs is removed.

In a way, then, the ascetic consciousness can be said symbolically to return Adam and Eve to Paradise, for it is the very quest for knowledge (i.e., the will to apply the principle of individuation to experience) that the ascetic overcomes. This amounts to a self-overcoming at the universal level, where not only physical desires are overcome, but where humanly-inherent epistemological dispositions are overcome as well.

6. Schopenhauer’s Later Works

At the end of the first volume of The World as Will and Representation (1818), Schopenhauer intimates that the ascetic experiences an inscrutable mystical state of consciousness that looks like nothing at all from the standpoint of ordinary, day-to-day, individuated and objectifying consciousness. Conversely, he adds that from the standpoint of the ascetic’s mystical consciousness, where only knowledge remains and where “the will [to live] has vanished,” the physical world itself, with all of its suns and galaxies “is — nothing,” likening this consciousness to “the Prajna-Paramita of the Buddhists” (WWR, Section 71) to conclude the book. He also states in the same section that this mystical consciousness has an ocean-like calmness, tranquillity, confidence and serenity, adding that if one were to seek a positive characterization of the mystical state, we could refer loosely to words and phrases such as “ecstasy,” “rapture,” “illumination” and “union with God.” Schopenhauer recognizes a positive content to the ascetic’s mystical experience, but he regards the experience as ineffable.

This advocacy of mystical experience creates a puzzle: if everything is Will without qualification, then it is unclear where to locate the will-less mystical state of mind. According to Schopenhauer’s three-tiered philosophical schema, which is now coming into question, it must be located either at the level of Will as it is in itself, or at the level of Platonic Ideas, or at the level of individual things in space and time. It cannot be the latter, because individuated consciousness is the everyday consciousness of desire, frustration and suffering. Neither can it be located at the level of Will as it is in itself, because the Will is a blind striving, without knowledge, and without satisfaction.

The ascetic consciousness might be most plausibly located at the level of the universal subject-object distinction, akin to the music-filled consciousness, but Schopenhauer states that the mystical consciousness abolishes not only time and space, but also the fundamental forms of subject and object: “no will: no representation, no world” (WWR, Section 71). So in terms of its degree of generality, the mystical state of mind seems to be located at a level of universality comparable to that of Will as thing-in-itself. Since he characterizes it as not being a manifestation of Will, however, it appears to be keyed into another dimension altogether, in total disconnection from Will as the thing-in-itself. This is to say that if the thing-in-itself is exactly congruent with Will, then it is difficult to accept Schopenhauer’s mystical characterizations of the ascetic consciousness, and at the same time identify a consistent place for it within Schopenhauer’s three-tiered philosophical schema of reality.

Schopenhauer’s position on whether the thing-in-itself is Will consequently presents some interpretive difficulties. In On the Will in Nature (1836/1854), he almost always speaks as if the two are identical. In the second volume of The World as Will and Representation (1844), he addresses the above complication, and qualifies his claim that the thing-in-itself is Will. He states in the 1844 work (reciting manuscript notes from 1821 almost verbatim, so this is not an “1844” or “later” view) that it is only “to us” that the thing-in-itself appears as Will and that it remains possible that the thing-in-itself has other modes of being that are incomprehensible in ordinary terms, but that might be accessible to mystical consciousness (WWR, II, Chapter XVIII, “On the Possibility of Knowing the Thing-in-Itself”). He concludes that mystical experience is only a relative nothingness, that is, when it is considered from the standpoint of the daily world, but that it is not an absolute nothingness, as would be the case if the thing-in-itself were Will in an unconditional sense, and not merely Will to us.

In light of this, Schopenhauer sometimes expresses the view that the thing-in-itself is multidimensional, and although the thing-in-itself is not wholly identical to the world as Will, it nonetheless includes as its manifestations, the world as Will and the world as representation. This lends a panentheistic structure to Schopenhauer’s view (noted earlier in the views of K.C.F. Krause). From a scholarly standpoint, it implies that interpretations of Schopenhauer that portray him as a Kantian who believes that knowledge of the thing-in-itself is impossible, do not fit with what Schopenhauer himself believed. It also implies that interpretations that portray him as a traditional metaphysician who claims that the thing-in-itself is straightforwardly, wholly and unconditionally Will, also stand in need of qualification.

7. Critical Reflections

Schopenhauer’s intermittently-encountered claim that Will is the thing-in-itself only to us, provides philosophical space for him to assert consistently that mystical experience provides a positive insight. It also relativizes to the human condition, Schopenhauer’s position that the world is Will. This entails that his outlook on daily life as a cruel and violence-filled world — a world generated by the application of the principle of sufficient reason, is based on a human-conditioned intuition, namely, the direct, double-knowledge of one’s body as both subject and object. So along these lines, Schopenhauer’s pessimistic vision of the world can itself be seen to be grounded upon the subject-object distinction, i.e., the general root of the principle of sufficient reason. As mentioned above, we can see this fundamental reliance upon the subject-object distinction reflected in the very title of his book, The World as Will and Representation, that can be read as, in effect, The World as Subjectively and Objectively Apprehended.

This observation does not render (within the parameters of his outlook) Schopenhauer’s ruthlessly competitive world-scenario typically any less avoidable, but it does lead one to understand Schopenhauer’s pessimistic vision of the world-as-Will, as less of an outlook derived from an absolute standpoint that transcends human nature — although he frequently speaks in this absolutistic way — and as more of an outlook expressive of human nature in its effort to achieve philosophical understanding. Owing to its fundamental reliance upon the subject-object distinction, Schopenhauer’s classical account of the daily world as the objectification of Will, is understandable not only as a traditional metaphysical theory that purports to describe the unconditional truth. It can be understood alternatively as an expression of the human perspective on the world, that, as an embodied individual, we typically cannot avoid. This tempered approach, though, does leave us with the decisive question of why the world would appear to be so violent, if the universe’s core is not thoroughly “Will,” but is also something mysterious beyond this. For if Will is only one of an untold number of the universe’s dimensions, there would be no reason to expect that the individuating effects of the principle of sufficient reason would generate a world that feasts on itself in the manner that Schopenhauer describes.

8. Schopenhauer’s Influence

Schopenhauer’s philosophy has been widely influential, partly because his outlook acknowledges traditional moral values without the need to postulate the existence of God. His view also allows for the possibility of absolute knowledge by means of mystical experience. Schopenhauer also implicitly challenges the hegemony of science and other literalistic modes of expression, substituting in their place, more musical and literary styles of understanding. His recognition — at least with respect to a perspective we typically cannot avoid — that the universe appears to be a fundamentally irrational place, was also appealing to 20th century thinkers who understood instinctual forces as irrational, and yet guiding, forces underlying human behavior.

Schopenhauer’s influence has been strong among literary figures, which include poets, playwrights, essayists, novelists and historians such as Charles Baudelaire, Samuel Beckett, Thomas Bernhard, Jorge Luis Borges, Jacob Burckhardt, Joseph Conrad, André Gide, George Gissing, Franz Grillparzer, Thomas Hardy, Gerhardt Hauptmann, Friedrich Hebbel, Hugo von Hoffmansthal, Joris Karl Huysmans, Ernst Jünger, Karl Kraus, D. H. Lawrence, Joaquim Maria Machado de Assis, Stephane Mallarmé, Thomas Mann, Guy de Maupassant, Herman Melville, Robert Musil, Edgar Allan Poe, Marcel Proust, Arno Schmidt, August Strindberg, Italo Svevo, Leo Tolstoy, Ivan Turgenev, Frank Wedekind, W. B. Yeats, and Emile Zola. In general, these authors were inspired by Schopenhauer’s sense of the world’s absurdity, either regarded in a more nihilistic and gloomy manner, or regarded in a more lighthearted, absurdist, and comic manner.

Among philosophers, one can cite Henri Bergson, Julius Bahnsen, Eduard von Hartmann, Suzanne Langer, Philipp Mainländer, Hans Vaihinger, and Friedrich Nietzsche, where each tended to focus on selected aspects of Schopenhauer’s philosophy, such as his views on the meaning of life, his theory of the non-rational will, his theory of music, or his Kantianism. Insofar as he influenced Nietzsche, who subordinated science to art, Continental philosophy’s twentieth-century challenge to purely literalistic styles of philosophy via Nietzsche is anticipated by Schopenhauer’s view that music expresses metaphysical truth more directly than does traditional philosophy.

Schopenhauer’s theory of music, along with his emphasis upon artistic genius and the world-as-suffering, was also influential among composers such as Johannes Brahms, Antonín Dvorák, Gustav Mahler, Hans Pfitzner, Sergei Prokofiev, Nikolay Rimsky-Korsakoff, Arnold Schönberg, and Richard Wagner. Insofar as he influenced Wagner, who is the father of twentieth-century music written to accompany and enhance motion pictures, Schopenhauer’s theory of music as the expression of a continual flow of emotion stands significantly behind the contemporary experience of music in artistic and communicational media.

Schopenhauer’s 19th century historical profile is frequently obscured by the shadows of Kant, Hegel, Marx, Mill, Darwin and Nietzsche, but more than is usually recognized, in his rejection of rationalistic conceptions of the world as early as 1818, he perceived the shape of things to come. The hollow, nihilistic laughter expressed by the Dada movement at the turn of the century in the midst of WWI, reiterates feelings that Schopenhauer’s philosophy had embodied almost a century earlier. Schopenhauer’s ideas about the importance of instinctual urges at the core of daily life also reappeared in Freud’s surrealism-inspiring psychoanalytic thought, and his conviction that human history is going nowhere, became keynotes within 20th century French philosophy, after two World Wars put a damper on the 19th century anticipations of continual progress that had captured the hearts of thinkers such as Hegel and Marx.


A. Works by Schopenhauer

  • 1813: Über die vierfache Wurzel des Satzes vom zureichenden Grunde (On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason).
  • 1816: Über das Sehn und die Farben (On Vision and Colors).
  • 1819 [1818]: Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung (The World as Will and Representation) [first edition, one volume].
  • 1836: Über den Willen in der Natur (On the Will in Nature).
  • 1839: “Über die Freiheit des menschlichen Willens” (“On Freedom of the Human Will”).
  • 1840: “Über die Grundlage der Moral” (“On the Basis of Morality”).
  • 1841 [1840]: Die beiden Grundprobleme der Ethik (The Two Fundamental Problems of Ethics) [joint publication of the 1839 and 1840 essays in book form].
  • 1844: Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung (The World as Will and Representation) [second edition, two volumes].
  • 1847: Über die vierfache Wurzel des Satzes vom zureichenden Grunde (On the Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason) [second edition, revised].
  • 1851: Parerga und Paralipomena.
  • 1859: Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung (The World as Will and Representation) [third edition, two volumes].

B. English Translations of Die Welt als Wille und Vorstellung

  • 1883: The World as Will and Idea, 3 Vols., translated by R. B. Haldane and J. Kemp, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul Ltd.
  • 1958: The World as Will and Representation, Vols. I and II, translated by E. F. J. Payne, New York: Dover Publications (1969).
  • 2007: The World as Will and Presentation, Vol. I, translated by Richard Aquila in collaboration with David Carus, New York: Longman.
  • 2010: The World as Will and Presentation, Vol. I, translated by David Carus and Richard Aquila, New York: Longman.
  • 2010: The World as Will and Representation, Vol. I, translated by Judith Norman, Alistair Welchman, and Christopher Janaway, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

C. Works About Schopenhauer

  • Atwell, J., 1990, Schopenhauer: The Human Character, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
  • –––, 1995, Schopenhauer on the Character of the World, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Barua, A., M. Gerhard, and M. Kossler (eds.), 2013, Understanding Schopenhauer Through the Prism of Indian Culture, Berlin: deGruyter.
  • Berger, D.L., 2004, The Veil of Maya: Schopenhauer’s System and Early Indian Thought, Binghamton, New York: Global Academic Publishing.
  • Brener, M., 2014, Schopenhauer and Wagner: A Closer Look, Bloomington, Xlibris.
  • Cartwright, D., 2005, Historical Dictionary of Schopenhauer’s Philosophy, Lanham, Maryland, Toronto, Oxford: The Scarecrow Press, Inc.
  • Copleston, F., 1975 [1946], Arthur Schopenhauer: Philosopher of Pessimism, London: Barnes and Noble.
  • Farrelly, D. (ed. and trans.), 2015, Arthur Schopenhauer: New Material by Him and about Him by Dr. David Asher, Cambridge: Cambridge Scholars Publishing.
  • Fox, M. (ed.), 1980, Schopenhauer: His Philosophical Achievement, Brighton: Harvester Press.
  • Gardiner, P., 1967, Schopenhauer, Middlesex: Penguin Books.
  • Hamlyn, D. W., 1980, Schopenhauer, London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
  • Head, J., and D. Vanden Auweele, 2017, Schopenhauer’s Fourfold Root, New York and London: Routledge
  • Hübscher, A., 1989, The Philosophy of Schopenhauer in its Intellectual Context: Thinker Against the Tide, trans. Joachim T. Baer and David E. Humphrey, Lewiston, N.Y.: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • Jacquette, D. (ed.),1996, Schopenhauer, Philosophy and the Arts, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press .
  • Jacquette, D., 2005, The Philosophy of Schopenhauer, Chesham, UK: Acumen.
  • Janaway, C., 1994, Schopenhauer, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1989, Self and World in Schopenhauer’s Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Janaway, C. (ed.), 1998, Willing and Nothingness: Schopenhauer as Nietzsche’s Educator, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 1999, The Cambridge Companion to Schopenhauer, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Jordan, N., 2010, Schopenhauer’s Ethics of Patience: Virtue, Salvation and Value, Lewiston, N.Y.: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • Lauxtermann, P.F.H., 2000, Schopenhauer’s Broken World View: Colours and Ethics Between Kant and Goethe, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Magee, B., 1983, The Philosophy of Schopenhauer, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Mannion, G., 2003, Schopenhauer, Religion and Morality: The Humble Path to Ethics, Farnham, UK: Ashgate Publishing.
  • Marcin, R.B., 2006, In Search of Schopenhauer’s Cat: Arthur Schopenhauer’s Quantum-mystical Theory of Justice, Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press.
  • Neeley, S.G., 2004, Schopenhauer: A Consistent Reading, Lewiston, N.Y.: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • Neil, A. and Janaway, C. (eds.) 2009, Better Consciousness: Schopenhauer’s Philosophy of Value, London: Wiley-Blackwell.
  • Peters, M., 2009, Schopenhauer and Adorno on Bodily Suffering: A Comparative Analysis, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Ryan, C., 2010, Schopenhauer’s Philosophy of Religion: The Death of God and the Oriental Renaissance, Leuven: Peeters.
  • Schulz, O., 2014, Schopenhauer’s Critique of Hope, Norderstedt: Books on Demand.
  • Simmel, G., 1986 [1907], Schopenhauer and Nietzsche, trans. Helmut Loiskandl, Deena Weinstein, and Michael Weinstein, Amherst: University of Massachusetts Press.
  • Tsanoff, R.A., 1911, Schopenhauer’s Criticism of Kant’s Theory of Experience, New York: Longmans, Green.
  • Vasalou, S., 2016, Schopenhauer and the Aesthetic Standpoint, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Vandenabeele, B., 2015, The Sublime in Schopenhauer’s Philosophy, London: Palgrave Macmillan.
  • von der Luft, E. (ed.), 1988, Schopenhauer: New Essays in Honor of His 200th Birthday, Lewiston, N.Y.: Edwin Mellen Press.
  • White, F.C., 1992, On Schopenhauer’s Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, Leiden: E.J. Brill.
  • White, F.C. (ed.), 1997, Schopenhauer’s Early Fourfold Root: Translation and Commentary, Aldershot: Avebury, Ashgate Publishing, Ltd.
  • Wicks, R., 2008, Schopenhauer, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • –––, 2011, Schopenhauer’s The World as Will and Representation: A Reader’s Guide, London: Continuum.
  • Young, J., 1987, Willing and Unwilling: A Study in the Philosophy of Arthur Schopenhauer, Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhof.
  • –––, 2005, Schopenhauer, London & New York: Routledge.

D. Biographies of Schopenhauer (published in English)

  • Bridgewater, P., 1988, Arthur Schopenhauer’s English Schooling, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Cartwright, D., 2010, Schopenhauer: A Biography, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • McGill, V. J, 1931, Schopenhauer: Pessimist and Pagan, New York: Haskell House Publishers (1971).
  • Safranski, R., 1989, Schopenhauer and the Wild Years of Philosophy, trans. Ewald Osers, London: Weidenfeld and Nicholson.
  • Wallace, W., 1890, Life of Arthur Schopenhauer, London: Walter Scott.
  • Zimmern, H., 1876, Arthur Schopenhauer: His Life and Philosophy, London: Longmans Green & Co.

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