Notes to Symmetry and Symmetry Breaking

1. Symmetry considerations were used by R.J. Haüy to characterize and classify crystal structure and formation (see his 1801 Traité de minéralogie, Volume 1), and with this, crystallography emerged as a discipline distinct from mineralogy.

2. A group is defined to be a set G, together with a product operation (·), such that: for any two elements g1 and g2 of G, g1 · g2  is again an element of G; the group operation is associative; the group contains the identity element; and for each element there exists an inverse.

3. An equivalence relation is a relation that is reflexive, symmetric and transitive. For further details on the connection between symmetry, equivalence and group in mathematics and physics, see Olver (1995). Castellani (2003) is devoted to exploring the relevance of these connections to the issue of the meaning of physical symmetries. On the connection between groups and equivalence classes, when generalized to groupoids, and, in general, for a discussion of the relation between the concept of symmetry and its formalisms, see Guay and Hepburn (2009). A thorough analysis of the relation between the notion of a symmetry of a physical theory and that of the physical equivalence of two solutions or models of such a theory is provided in Belot (2012).

4. A classic reference for the general theory of symmetric configurations is Shubnikov and Koptsik 1974. An overview is provided also in Mainzer 1996. Further details of the material in this section can be found in Castellani (2000, Chapters 1-3). Hon and Goldstein (2008) offers a detailed historical study of the term ‘symmetry’ and the concepts associated with it up to the early 1800s (on this book see Brading, 2010).

5. This is an example of a methodological use of symmetry properties: on the basis of the invariance properties of the situation under consideration (in this case, the dynamical problem in classical mechanics), a strategy is applied for deriving determinate consequences. The underlying principle is that equivalent problems have equivalent solutions. This type of symmetry argument (see Section 3, below) is discussed also by van Fraassen (1989, Chapter 10).

6. Wigner (1967) is a collection of twenty-four reprinted papers covering several decades.

7. Whence the name ‘Poincaré group’ introduced later by Wigner, whereas Poincaré himself named the group after Lorentz. Nowadays the name ‘Poincaré group’ is reserved for the inhomogeneous Lorentz group; that is, the Lorentz group plus spatial translations.

8. General relativity marks a further important stage in the development, as we will see below.

9. An example of such a principle is the non-existence of perpetual motion machines in thermodynamics.

10. For references see the literature on Einstein’s “hole argument”, detailed in Section 2.5, below.

11. For more on Einstein’s route to GTR and the changing fortunes of general covariance as one of his postulates, see Norton (1993). See also the references on Einstein’s “hole argument” in Section 2.5, below.

12. The problem which led Heisenberg to introduce this symmetry (and connect it with the statistical behaviour of quantum particles) in Heisenberg (1926) was to obtain a quantum description of atomic systems --- seen as ensembles of identical electrons subject to Coulomb interaction --- in agreement with the spectroscopics results of the time.

13. In that paper, entitled “Über die Operation der Zeitumkehr in der Quantenmechanik”, Wigner introduced time reversal invariance in order to reinterpret results previously obtained by H. Kramers.

14. Subsequently, new symmetries acquired relevance in theoretical physics, such as supersymmetry (the symmetry relating bosons and fermions and leading, when made local, to the theories of supergravity), and the various forms of duality used in today’s superstring theories.

15. See, for example, Mach’s discussion of the Oersted effect in his Die Mechanik in ihrer Entwickelung historisch--kritisch dargestellt of 1883.

16. Strocchi (2012) criticizes this too simplified description. See his paper for a precise formulation and Strocchi (2008) for a thorough and rigorous treatment of symmetry breaking in classical and quantum physics. Note that there are both analogies and disanalogies between the classical and quantum cases of SSB. These are the subject of discussion in the newly-emerging philosophical literature on SSB, and include the role of asymmetrical causes and the transition from a symmetrical to an asymmetrical situation.

17. Another example from classical physics which is often used in the literature to illustrate SSB is the case of a ball moving with no friction in a hoop constrained to rotate with a given angular velocity. This case is discussed in detail by Liu (2003).

18. Note that SSB was in fact first introduced in the DSB form. In the BCS theory of superconductivity, as well as in the 1961 theory of broken chiral symmetry by Nambu and Jona-Lasino, SSB is realized dynamically through a fermion condensate. In the BCS theory, for example, the gauge invariance of electromagnetism is spontaneously broken by pairs of electrons that condense -- forming a bound state -- in the ground state of a metal. Although DSB has not (so far) proved successful as an alternative route to the problem raised by the Higgs fields in the Standard Model, it has been applied with success to specific cases: for example, besides the already mentioned case of the BCS theory, the current quantum field theory of the strong interaction (quantum chromodynamics), in the approximation that quark masses are very small, possesses chiral symmetries that are spontaneously broken by a condensation of quark—antiquark pairs. For a historical—philosophical analysis of the notion that the Higgs boson is a composite particle, see Borrelli (2012).

19. Stewart and Golubitsky (1992), for example, speak of an “Extended Curie's principle” to indicate this situation.

20. Kosso’s analysis begins from a set of examples offered by ’t Hooft (1980).

21. The significance of the notion of invariance and its group-theoretic treatment for the issue of objectivity is explored in Born (1953), for example. For more recent discussions see Kosso (2003) and Earman ([2002] 2004, Sections 6 and 7).

Copyright © 2023 by
Katherine Brading
Elena Castellani <>
Nicholas Teh <>

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