First published Mon Jul 6, 2009; substantive revision Fri Nov 22, 2019

Syrianus (in antiquity known as “the Great”) was a teacher of philosophy and, if we can trust the evidence, of rhetoric in Athens during the late 4th and early 5th centuries CE. He was a slightly younger contemporary of Augustine of Hippo (354–430). Born in Alexandria in the second half of the 4th century, he received his basic education there but later went on to study philosophy under Plutarch of Athens (c. 350–431/2), who had revived Plato’s Academy. When Plutarch died in 431/2, Syrianus succeeded him as head of the Athenian school. During this last stage in his life, Syrianus became the teacher of the young Proclus (410/2–485), who in turn succeeded him as scholarch, either immediately or not long after Syrianus’ death in 437. The particular circumstances of Syrianus’ life are almost entirely unknown, and of his copious philosophical work only the important commentaries on books Beta (III), Gamma (IV), and Mu and Nu (XIII–XIV) of Aristotle’s Metaphysics survive.

1. Life

Damascius, in his Philosophical History (aka Life of Isidore) describes Syrianus as a strikingly handsome and tall man with impressive intellectual powers. The son of an otherwise unknown Philoxenus, he grew up in Alexandria, where he must have received an education in rhetoric and perhaps some philosophy. In the second half of the 4th century, Alexandria had become increasingly burdened by strife between her pagan elite and a notoriously quarrelsome Christian populace. The mathematician Theon of Alexandria (c. 335–405) and his daughter Hypatia, who was killed by agitating Christians in 415, were the most prominent pagan intellectuals in Alexandria during Syrianus’ life. We do not know when exactly Syrianus decided to go to Athens to study with Plutarch and to dedicate himself to philosophy; it appears, however, that Syrianus spent the rest of his active life in Athens as a close associate of Plutarch and, eventually, as his successor. If the attribution of the commentary on Hermogenes is correct (see section 3b below), we may infer that Syrianus was married, since that commentary is dedicated to its author’s son Alexander. Archeological evidence suggests that Plutarch and Syrianus, and later Proclus, lived and taught in a complex of houses near the theater of Dionysus at the south slope of the Acropolis, not at the site now known as the original location of Plato’s Academy outside the ancient city’s walls. According to Marinus (in his Life of Proclus, 36), Syrianus was buried on the slopes of Mount Lycabettus in Athens.

During his lifetime, the political and cultural landscape of the Roman Empire changed dramatically and irrevocably for pagan intellectuals, and it did so in disturbing ways. Politically, the Roman Empire was shaken to its foundation by the massive incursion of Gothic tribes into northern Greece (Thrace) and their decisive victory over the imperial army at Adrianople (modern Edirne) in 378. Under Theodosius I, who reigned from 379 to 395, Christianity became the state religion, and in order to strengthen the adopted Nicene orthodoxy, the emperor sought to curtail heresy of any form, both Christian and pagan.

In 425, a few years before Syrianus assumed leadership of the Academy, emperor Theodosius II and his wife Eudocia (a well-educated Christian convert and daughter of Leontius, a pagan educator at Athens who was in a sense a colleague of Syrianus’) founded what came to be the University of Constantinople. In consequence, higher education in Rhetoric, Law and Philosophy was thereby placed under the patronage—and supervision—of the court. The survival of a private institution such as the Athenian School, in contrast, depended much on the capability, personality, and commitment of its individual members. It is in this context that we have to understand the sense of excitement and relief that prevailed (as Marinus relates in his Life of Proclus) when Proclus (410/2–485), a young committed pagan intellectual, arrived in Athens to join the school in 431. At first, Syrianus was suspicious of the new arrival, but when he observed Proclus openly worshiping the Moon, he agreed to accept him. Eventually, Marinus says, Syrianus “found in him the disciple and successor he had long been looking for” (Life 12). Proclus succeeded Syrianus as head of the School in 437, at the mere age of about twenty-six, while Syrianus’ other, most talented student Domninus, who was Jewish, returned to his home town Larissa.

From Marinus we can gather some further evidence about Syrianus as a teacher. Whereas Plutarch had introduced the “freshman” Proclus to somewhat more accessible works such as Aristotle’s De anima and Plato’s Phaedo, Syrianus, once he had taken over instruction from Plutarch, subjected Proclus to a much more rigorous and systematic philosophical training. In quick succession, they read practically the entire Aristotelian corpus together (“Aristotle’s treatises on logic, ethics, politics, physics and … theology,” presumably in that order) in preparation for the study of Plato and, eventually, the Orphic Poems and Chaldaean Oracles. Syrianus gave Aristotle a firm place and function in the philosophical-theological curriculum of a student of Platonism; however, as we shall see, this yoking together of Aristotle to Plato did not entail endorsement of the doctrine that the views of the two ancestral philosophers were in complete harmony.

2. Testimonia of Syrianus’ literary work

Apart from the texts written by Syrianus that survive and are discussed in more detail under (3) below, there is evidence for a much wider literary output. According to the Suda, a 10th century Byzantine encyclopedia, Syrianus wrote seven books of commentary on Homer, four on Plato’s Republic, two on the theology of Orpheus as well as treatises on the Homeric Gods, on the agreement of Orpheus, Pythagoras and Plato on the subject of oracles (in no less than ten books), and other exegetical works. This list is evidently not complete because it fails to mention any work on Aristotle; nor do we have any means of verifying the attribution of these works to Syrianus. As such, it would not be unusual at all for a Platonic philosopher to write commentaries on Homer and Orphic poetry, given that these early literary texts were thought to be replete with hidden meaning and arcane revelations. Moreover, shortly before his death Syrianus offered Proclus and Domninus a course on either the Chaldean Oracles or the Orphic Poems.

Syrianus’ commentaries were greatly admired by later generations of Neoplatonists (Isidore and Damascius regarded him as one of the best exegetes), and he is therefore often referred to and quoted. Collecting these references, R.L. Cardullo (1985) inferred that, apart from the extant work on the Metaphysics, Syrianus commented on Aristotle’s Categories, De interpretatione, Prior Analytics, Physics, De caelo, and De anima. Asclepius of Tralles (mid 6th century), in his commentary on the Metaphysics, preserves two fragments of Syrianus’ exegesis of book VII (Z) of that work. There is also evidence (in Proclus) that Syrianus commented on Plato’s Timaeus and Parmenides, but it is not clear whether these comments were formally composed, or circulated merely within the school as transcripts of his lectures.

3. The surviving works

3.1 Commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics, Books III, IV, XIII, XIV

Syrianus’ work on Aristotle’s Metaphysics is transmitted in some 18 manuscripts dating from the 15th and 16th centuries, two of which, Parisinus Graecus 1896 and Hamburgensis phil. gr. 2, are superior to the others. The extant text does not offer a unified and comprehensive interpretation of the Metaphysics. For one thing, the commentary covers only four of the fourteen treatises that now make up the collection of work that came “after the Physics”. In addition, Syrianus’ work is a collection of three separate essays of quite different character and purpose, one essay on the aporetic book III (=Beta), one on book IV (=Gamma), and one on books XIII and XIV (=Mu and Nu). Already the titles of these separate parts (regardless of whether they are Syrianus’ own) indicate the differences:

The first essay is entitled “Syrianus, the Son of Philoxenus, about the Logical Difficulties and Topics Requiring Discussion in Book Beta of Aristotle’s Metaphysics”. It begins, unusually, with hardly any introductory remarks at all. There is only a swift recapitulation of the subject-matter of books I and II (Α and little α) of the Metaphysics. This suggests that Syrianus had covered those books in earlier lectures. Typically of him, Syrianus goes through the aporiae raised by Aristotle on the subject-matter and methodology of ‘first philosophy’, one by one, and in each case explains briefly how he himself thinks these difficulties ought to be resolved, not how Aristotle resolves them in subsequent books of the Metaphysics.

The second, very short essay is entitled “A Course (ephodos) by Syrianus, the Son of Philoxenus, on Book Gamma of Aristotle’s Metaphysics”. This book of the Metaphysics begins with an exposition of first philosophy as dealing with being in general, that is, with what is insofar as it has being, as well as the properties that belong in and of itself to anything that has being. Aristotle then continues with a defense of the Law of Non-Contradiction (for any proposition P, it is not the case that both P and not-P) being one of these properties. Syrianus discusses each of these main topics of the book, but keeps his own comments short because, as he says, the book “has already been sufficiently elucidated by the most diligent Alexander (of Aphrodisias)” (54, 12f).

The third treatise is entitled “Investigations (episkepseis) by Syrianus, the Son of Philoxenus, into the Difficulties Aristotle Raises About Mathematics and Numbers in Books Mu and Nu of the Metaphysics.” This long defense of Platonism and Pythagoreanism against Aristotle’s incisive criticism is by far the most instructive part of Syrianus’ work. It is worth quoting the introduction to this polemical essay in full because it throws some light on the careful way in which Syrianus calibrates his opposition to Aristotle. Syrianus writes In metaph 80, 4–81, 6:

I am not a natural controversialist, nor yet would I count myself as a disciple of Aristotle on merely a few or trivial topics; rather, I am one of those who admire both his logical methodology overall and who accept with enthusiasm his treatment of ethical and physical questions. And that I may not make a bore of myself by enumerating in detail all the excellent aspects of this man’s philosophy, let me just ask why every intelligent person might not justly marvel at the apt remarks, accompanied by demonstrations of the highest quality, to be found in this most excellent treatise on the subject of both forms in matter and definitions, and on the subject of the divine and unmoved transcendent causal principles of the whole cosmos—even though they are beyond the reach of any synthetic treatment and very detailed exposition—and declare the author of such a philosophical enquiry a benefactor of human life. For all he is owed the warmest thanks both from us and from all those who can appreciate his sagacity.
However, it is the fact that, for whatever reasons, both in other parts of his theological treatise and especially in the last two books, 13 and 14, he has indulged in a good deal of criticism of the first principles of the Pythagoreans and the Platonists, without saying anything pertinent or adequate against them, and in many instances, if one may state the truth quite frankly, not even meeting them on their own ground, but rather basing his objections on hypotheses propounded by himself. Because of this it seemed reasonable (in fairness to the less sophisticated students, that under the influence of the well-deserved reputation of the man they may not be seduced into contempt for divine realities and the inspired philosophy of the ancients) to examine his remarks critically and at the same time impartially as best we can, and to demonstrate that the doctrines of Pythagoras and Plato about the first principles remain free of disproof or refutation, while the arguments of Aristotle against them for the most part miss the mark and pursue lines of inquiry quite irrelevant to those divine men, while on the few occasions when they seek to make a direct attack on them, they are unable to bring to bear any refutation, large or small. And necessarily so; for ‘truth is never refuted’, in the words of that divine man (i.e. Plato, cf. Gorg., 473B), and in assimilating their arguments about first principles to the realities, the fathers of those arguments established them ‘as firmly and unshakably as it is proper for arguments to be’ (Tim., 29B7–8). Now that is enough by way of preface. (transl. Dillon and O’Meara, modified)

It is necessary to decode some of these remarks in order more fully to understand the delicate position Syrianus is in: “Less sophisticated students” (presumably the sons and daughters of the educated class that became increasingly tempted by the new religion) have at least been clever enough to notice that Aristotle appears to make short work of some fundamental Platonic commitments about first principles; this in turn could “seduce” them into disparaging the “inspired philosophy of the ancients” (i.e. paganism). In order to defend paganism, Syrianus finds that he has to attack Aristotle, and he is clearly not comfortable doing this. What precisely was at stake for him?

The later Platonists shared an important commitment with orthodox Christianity, viz. to understand and explain the world in its entirety on the assumption of one principle only, not two principles that could be thought to be in opposition or conflict with one another (Gnosticism). Christians and Platonists also agreed on the assumption that the first principle itself cannot be part of the natural world but must be a transcendent entity whose existence is wholly independent of and prior to this world, and upon which the world’s existence wholly depends. But unlike Christian thinkers, the Platonists did not think that the world came to be at one point in its distant history, nor that the world’s first principle would have manufactured it like a craftsman, or spoken it into existence. Rather, the Platonists thought that the first transcendent principle sustained a set of further immaterial principles and forms from which derive the diversity of the natural biosphere and which, through the agency of divine souls and forming principles (logoi—principles that form matter at different times and places in its various ways), unfold themselves in space and time. This view of an interconnected and complex hierarchy of being was beautifully suited to accommodate and support traditional polytheism (a feature spelled out in particular by Iamblichus and Proclus), but it of course also led to a host of difficult questions the Platonists struggled to clarify, drawing in some instances for assistance on many aspects of Aristotle’s and the Stoics’ philosophies of nature: What precisely is the content of the intelligible world? What is the function of soul? How do immanent logoi operate? What is the ontological status and function of matter? etc. But the most fundamental and formidable difficulty was to explain precisely how an absolute unity (the first principle) could give rise to the obvious diversity of the intelligible and perceptible worlds. The answer the Platonists developed (the roots of which they thought reached back to Plato and his immediate successors in the Academy) was to postulate that the two most fundamental intelligible principles produced by the hyper-intelligible One should be the principle of unity and the principle of diversity as such. Already Plato had apparently spoken about the ‘Monad’ and the ‘unrestricted Dyad’; together, these principles not only bring forth an entire realm of mathematical principles and numbers, but also account for any kind of unified individuality and diversity throughout the hierarchy of being. As Plotinus put it in the characteristic manner of his style: “Being, when it awoke, stood in multiplicity as number and offered provision for the beings, as it were, a preliminary sketch of unities that held place for the beings which were to be founded on them” (Enn. VI 6, 10).

Now Aristotle, in the two last books of his Metaphysics, had forcefully repudiated the Platonic notion of some such ideal existence of numbers and their principles, and if Aristotle were right, the entire Platonic edifice would have been undermined. Roughly, it was Aristotle’s view, expressed repeatedly in the corpus, that mathematical entities such as numbers or geometrical figures are not themselves substances, that is, basic realities, at all, as these later Platonists required. They are derivative existences, in the sense that the mathematician’s mind in knowing them conceives of them as if they were substances, by looking at the physical world in an abstract way. In other words, mathematical entities do not at all exist independently or prior to the objects they are the number or figures of, but are only hypostatizations of aspects of such objects. In books Mu and Nu he amplifies this view with a searing attack on the early Platonists’ conception of mathematics and their theory of Forms.

What was needed, then, was a sophisticated refutation of Aristotle from a Platonist point of view. In order to give a flavor of Syrianus’ defense of Platonism, both early and late, it may suffice to survey his responses to two points raised by Aristotle’s celebrated criticism of Platonic forms: (1) the Aristotelian view that objects of mathematics are arrived at by abstraction; and (2) the so-called “Third Man” argument.

(1) Aristotle had argued (Metaph. XIII 3, 1078a5ff) that the work of a geometer is comparable to that of a biologist studying ‘male’ and ‘female’: ‘male’ and ‘female’ are gender attributes of animals that one can discern in isolation when one abstracts from all sorts of other (irrelevant) attributes animals happen to have; just so, the geometer studies his subject-matter by disregarding all irrelevant attributes bodies happen to have, except for points, lines, planes, and their positions and quantities. Moreover, Aristotle argues, the biologist does not suppose that ‘male’ and ‘female’ exist as separate ideal entities (substances) over and above and prior to the concrete living substances that are either male or female, nor should he suppose such a thing. In a similar vein, the points, lines, planes, and solids the geometer studies are neither physical attributes of bodies nor do they enjoy a separate existence independent of them; rather, they exist in the mind of the geometer by virtue of his powers of abstraction. Now Syrianus objects to this line of reasoning that the required kind of abstraction would be impossible unless we assume that the human mind is already equipped with an a priori grasp of precise mathematical entities and principles. He writes:

In general, in response to (Aristotle’s) overall view it must be said that we also do not observe all shapes or all numbers as being inherent in sensible objects, that is to say, all those with which the mathematical sciences concern themselves, nor is it possible that things that derive from sense-objects should enjoy such precision. And if he were to explain that we ourselves add to them what is lacking and thus make them more exact and then contemplate them as such, he will have to tell us first of all whence we are able to confer perfection on these; for we would not find any other truer cause of this than that propounded by the ancients, that the soul in its essence has prior possession of the reason-principles of all things. (95, 29–37; trans. Dillon/O’Meara)

Syrianus’ explanation of mathematical reasoning approaches the problem from a (typically Platonic) top-down perspective. He does not say that the kind of quasi-universalizing abstraction Aristotle has in mind is impossible, only that it will not have the required scope and accuracy—unless one assumes that we already possess a clear conception of mathematical accuracy. What in fact happens, according to Syrianus, is that this is impossible unless the human intellect possesses an innate understanding of mathematical principles and concepts which it projects onto the plane of our imagination from above in order to grasp them rationally as the substances that they are: “… geometry aims to contemplate the soul’s partless reason-principles (logoi) themselves but, being too feeble to employ these intellections, which are free of images, it extends these principles into imagined and extended shapes and magnitudes, and thus contemplates the former in the latter” (In metaph. 91, 31–34; trans. Dillon/O’Meara, modified). The place of mathematical objects is in our imagination, Syrianus suggests In metaph. 186, 17–23, and the case is comparable to matter receiving form, except that matter “does not know what it is receiving, nor can it hold on to it,” whereas the imagination, when it receives the mathematical blueprint from above, holds on to it to some extent and acquires an understanding of it.

(2) At Metaphysics XIII 4,1079a11–13, Aristotle briefly invokes the “Third Man” argument as a well-known problem for proponents of the theory of forms; already Plato, in the Parmenides (132a–133a), had raised the same issue. If the Form of Man not only fully expresses the characteristic of “what-it-is-to-be-a-man” (say “humanity”), but also is a perfect instance of that characteristic (i.e., the “Form-of-Man” is a man, more perfect than any physical man), then it would seem that there must be a resemblance between the Form of Man and the physical copy of that form (which, ex hypothesi, are both “men”). This requires the postulate of a “Third Man” by virtue of which it is possible to determine and predicate such resemblance. Syrianus points out correctly (In metaph. 111, 27–33) that this kind of argument could go on ad infinitum and then retorts (111, 33–112, 6) that it is a mistake to suppose that the predicate “man” is used in the same sense in the two cases: “If the point is that, because the Essential Man is synonymous with men in this realm, as Alexander states in his exegesis of this passage, and all synonyms come to be synonyms by virtue in their participation in some Form, a ‘third man’ will manifest itself as being predicated of both the Form and the things in this realm, then the argument becomes ridiculous; for it is not the case that the things in this realm are synonymous with the relevant Form” (111, 33–37; trans. Dillon/O’Meara). If that were the case, one should—absurdly—expect to find a liver, a spleen and each of the other internal organs present in the Form of Man, as Syrianus points out further down (113, 34f). In the end, Syrianus’ solution to the conundrum may not be entirely satisfactory, but it was by Syrianus’ time the standard one among Platonists. He does not deny self-predication, but he contends instead that the predication of “man” in the case of the Form and in the case of the natural human being, even if it involves homonymy, does so not in the usual sense, but “in the way that a model (paradeigma) is related to an image of itself, and specifically when the model generates the images in virtue of its essence, and causes them to revert to it” (115, 1–3). That is to say, the “Form of Man” is a man in the sense that it is productive of natural substances of a certain kind, i.e. human beings, which deserve the same predicate to the extent that they actively instantiate the essential characteristic of that form (i.e. ‘revert to it’).

There has been some discussion about Syrianus’ originality because we possess a commentary of books 6–14 of Aristotle’s Metaphysics that claims to be by the hand of Alexander of Aphrodisias and which shares numerous passages with Syrianus’ work (concordances in Luna and Dillon/O’Meara). Even though the commentary is most certainly not by Alexander, it still remains essentially unclear which author is dependent on whom. Most scholars accept the view, however, that the commentary by Ps.-Alexander was produced during the Byzantine Renaissance, most likely by Michael of Ephesus (early 12th cent.), and is therefore dependent on Syrianus.

3.2 Commentary on Hermogenes

These scholia on the popular rhetorical treatises of Hermogenes of Tarsus (c. 160–225) are attributed to “Syrianus the Sophist,” i.e. the rhetorician. References to and citations from philosophical works abound (Plato, minor Platonists, Aristotle), and there are no good reasons to doubt that this commentary was in fact written by Syrianus the Neoplatonist, most probably before he assumed full leadership of the Academy. The work is addressed to the author’s favorite son Alexander (2, 3f.), who was presumably being honed to become an orator (rather than a philosopher). The work, although containing no philosophical argument, deserves closer study as it is full of references to major and minor authors, providing good evidence for the vitality of the literary tradition as a backdrop for pagan philosophy in late antiquity.

4. Influence

Since most of Syrianus’ work is lost, it is not easy precisely to gauge the reach and depth of his influence, but it is safe to assume that it was considerable. Syrianus had two important pupils who determined the philosophical culture in Alexandria and Athens respectively. One of these was Hermias of Alexandria, the father of Ammonius, a most influential later commentator on Aristotle. Hermias did not stay in Athens but returned to Alexandria to teach philosophy there, passing away prematurely in his forties. By him we possess a transcript of lectures (scholia) on Plato’s Phaedrus, and it is generally supposed that the work draws on the lectures of Syrianus which Hermias attended, although Hermias nowhere mentions Syrianus by name (a not uncommon practice). As already stated above, the other pupil of Syrianus was the eminent Proclus, a student of Syrianus’ at roughly the same time as Hermias. In contrast to the latter, Proclus frequently acknowledges Syrianus in his writing. Proclus possessed an unusually powerful ability to synthesize and systematize Platonism, and it seems reasonable to suppose that many a doctrine he subscribed to he had learned from Syrianus.

Copies of Syrianus’ commentary on the Metaphysics were available in Alexandria several generations after his death and used by Asclepius of Tralles and, if the attribution of the commentary on the Metaphysics of Ps.-Alexander to Michael of Ephesus is correct (see above), his work was available in Constantinople in the 12th century. The first Renaissance Latin translation of Syrianus was produced by Bagnoli and published in Venice in 1558.


Primary Literature: Sources

  • Bagolinus, H., 1558, Syriani antiquissimi philosophi interpretis in II, XIII, et XIV libros Aristotelis Metaphysices commentarius, Latin translation by Hieronymus Bagolinius (Bagnoli), Venice.
  • Dillon, J. and D. O’Meara, 2006, Syrianus. On Aristotle’s “Metaphysics 13–14”, London: Duckworth and Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Dillon, J. and D. O’Meara, 2008, Syrianus. On Aristotle’s “Metaphysics 3–4”, London: Duckworth and Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Hermias Alexandrinus, In Platonis Phaedrum Scholia, P. Couvreur (ed.), Paris: É. Bouillon, 1901; reprinted Hildesheim: Olms, 1971, with indices by C. Zintzen.
  • Syrianus, In Aristotelis Metaphysica commentaria, H. Usener (ed.), Berlin: Reimer, 1870.
  • Syrianus, In Hermogenem Commentaria, H. Rabe (ed.), Leipzig: Teubner, 1892–93.
  • Syrianus, In Metaphysica commentaria, in Commentaria in Aristotelem Graeca, W. Kroll (ed.), Berlin: Reimer, Volume VI, Part i, 1902.

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  • Vincent, M.A., 1971, “Syrianus et le Politique d’Aristote cité In Metaph. p. 168, 33–35 Kroll, ou un trait d’humeur aurait-il été pris au sérieux?”, in Le neo-platonisme. Actes du Colloque de Royaumont, 9–13 juin 1969, Paris: Ed. du CNRS, pp. 215–227.
  • Wallis, R.T., 1972, Neoplatonism, London: Duckworth.
  • Wear, S.K., 2005, The Collected Fragments of Syrianus the Platonist on Plato’s Parmenides and Timaeus, Diss., Trinity College, Dublin.
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  • Wear, S.K., 2011, “The teachings of Syrianus on Plato’s Timaeus and Parmenides”, Leiden: Brill.
  • Zeller, E., 1923, Die Philosophie der Griechen in ihrer geschichtlichen Entwicklung, III 2. Die nacharistotelische Philosophie, Leipzig: Reisland; repr. 1963, Hildesheim: Olms, 818–833.

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