Neoplatonism

First published Mon Jan 11, 2016

The term “Neoplatonism” refers to a philosophical school of thought that first emerged and flourished in the Greco-Roman world of late antiquity, roughly from the time of the Roman Imperial Crisis to the Arab conquest, i.e., the middle of the 3rd to the middle of the 7th century. In consequence of the demise of ancient materialist or corporealist thought such as Epicureanism and Stoicism, Neoplatonism became the dominant philosophical ideology of the period, offering a comprehensive understanding of the universe and the individual human being’s place in it. However, in contrast to labels such as “Stoic”, “Peripatetic” or “Platonic”, the designation “Neoplatonic” is of modern coinage and to some extent a misnomer. Late antique philosophers now counted among “the Neoplatonists” did not think of themselves as engaged in some sort of effort specifically to revive the spirit and the letter of Plato’s dialogues. To be sure, they did call themselves “Platonists” and held Plato’s views, which they understood as a positive system of philosophical doctrine, in higher esteem than the tenets of the pre-Socratics, Aristotle, or any other subsequent thinker. However, and more importantly, their signature project is more accurately described as a grand synthesis of an intellectual heritage that was by then exceedingly rich and profound. In effect, they absorbed, appropriated, and creatively harmonized almost the entire Hellenic tradition of philosophy, religion, and even literature—with the exceptions of Epicureanism, which they roundly rejected, and the thoroughgoing corporealism of the Stoics. The result of this effort was a grandiose and powerfully persuasive system of thought that reflected upon a millennium of intellectual culture and brought the scientific and moral theories of Plato, Aristotle, and the ethics of the Stoics into fruitful dialogue with literature, myth, and religious practice. In virtue of their inherent respect for the writings of many of their predecessors, the Neoplatonists together offered a kind of meta-discourse and reflection on the sum-total of ideas produced over centuries of sustained inquiry into the human condition.

As a natural consequence of their insistence on the undiminished relevance of the past, the Neoplatonists developed their characteristically speculative brand of philosophical enquiry in which empirical facts tended to serve as illustrations rather than heuristic starting points or test cases. Today, the Neoplatonic system may strike one as lofty, counterintuitive, and implausible, but to dismiss it out of hand is difficult, especially if one is prepared to take seriously a few fundamental assumptions that are at least not obviously wrong and may possibly be right.

The most fundamental of these assumptions, which the Neoplatonists shared with the majority of intellectuals of the ancient world, including most pre-Socratic thinkers as well as Socrates, Plato, Aristotle and their followers, is that mindful consciousness (nous, often translated as thought, intelligence, or intellect) is in an important sense ontologically prior to the physical realm typically taken for ultimate reality (Mind over Matter). There existed a dispute between Plato and Aristotle over whether or not the objects of mindful consciousness (abstract concepts, Platonic or otherwise, numbers, geometrical properties, and so forth) are also ontologically prior, but the Neoplatonists regarded this fact as a matter of inconsequential detail. And so, following a venerable and abiding tradition of Mind over Matter, Neoplatonism inevitably turned out to be an idealist type of philosophy.

The second assumption, which the Neoplatonists shared with the Stoics and the Hermetists (an influential group of Egyptian religious thinkers that predate the rise of Neoplatonism), was that reality, in all its cognitive and physical manifestations, depended on a highest principle which is unitary and singular. Neoplatonic philosophy is a strict form of principle-monism that strives to understand everything on the basis of a single cause that they considered divine, and indiscriminately referred to as “the First”, “the One”, or “the Good”. Since it is reasonable to assume, as the Neoplatonists did, that any efficient cause is ontologically prior to, and hence more real, than its effect, then, in the hierarchy of being, the first principle, whatever it is, cannot be less “real” than the phenomena it is supposed to explain. Given the veracity of the first assumption (the ontological priority of intelligence and consciousness), it follows at once that the first principle must be a principle of consciousness. In consequence, the fundamental challenge all Neoplatonists struggled to meet was essentially the following: How are we to understand and describe the emergence of the universe, with all its diverse phenomena, as the effect of a singular principle of consciousness? In particular—and in this regard Neoplatonism shares certain concerns with modern cosmology—how is it possible to understand the emergence of the physical, material universe from a singularity that is in every sense unlike this universe? Their answer to this question was entirely new, and went far beyond any prior cosmic aetiology, including that of Plato’s Timaeus, in elegance and sophistication.

1. Historical Orientation: Antiquity

Rightly or wrongly, the Egyptian-born Plotinus (204/5–270) is commonly regarded as the founder of Neoplatonism. He was a pupil of the Alexandrian philosopher Ammonius Saccas (3nd century), who reportedly did not publish anything and remains one of the most enigmatic philosophers of all antiquity. Around 245, at the age of 40, Plotinus moved from Alexandria to Rome and founded a school of philosophy there. At first, his instruction too was entirely oral, until his most talented pupil, Porphyry, persuaded him to commit his seminars to the page. After Plotinus’ death, Porphyry edited and published these writings, having arranged them in a collection of six books consisting of nine essays each (the so-called “Enneads” or “nines”).

By any standard of intellectual prowess, Plotinus is one of the intellectual giants of antiquity, on a par with the likes of Plato, Aristotle, and Chrysippus, even if modernity is still hesitant to accord him such an exalted status. As in the case of his preeminent precursors, Plotinus’ philosophical system combines innovation with tradition. The question of precisely which predecessors inspired him is still unclear and in need of further investigation. Carefully selected passages from Plato’s dialogues and Aristotle’s Metaphysics often serve him as starting points for his own speculations; Stoic ethics is very much in evidence, as are the views of the Peripatetic philosopher Alexander of Aphrodisias (2nd-3rd centuries). A general intellectual background is provided by the so-called Middle Platonists, above all Numenius of Apamea (2nd century). Moreover, it is not impossible that Gnosticism (which Plotinus vehemently opposed) as well as the writings circulating under the name of Hermes Trismegistus confirmed or even informed his metaphysical monism. Lastly, Plotinus may have been well aware of the rise of Christianity, but if so, he was not as alarmed by it as his pupil Porphyry.

In the course of its history in late antiquity, Neoplatonism proved to be adaptable, fluid and dynamic, much more so than the system of the Stoics, the dominant philosophy during Hellenistic times. It appealed to the mundane literati as much as to the religious zealot, to the die-hard pagan as much as to the up-start Christian who needed a philosophical background to parse the theological fine points which would eventually distinguish the orthodox from the heretic. Important figures of late antique Neoplatonism were the already mentioned pupil of Plotinus, Porphyry, his pupil Iamblichus, Plutarch of Athens, Syrianus, Proclus, Simplicius, Damascius, Ammonius Hermeiou, John Philoponus, Olympiodorus, and Stephanus of Alexandria, to name but the most important. All of them, in different and fascinating ways, contributed to the development and internal diversification of the school’s doctrines. (Some of these philosophers have their own entries in this encyclopedia; see the Related Entries section below.)

Importantly, the new direction Plotinus, and presumably Ammonius Saccas before him, had given to Greek philosophy gradually acquired traction among the Greco-Roman elites. Ironically, it may have contributed to the acceptance of Christianity among the educated, thereby elevating the religious sentiments of the empire’s misfits and downtrodden to the ideology of a political system sanctified by the will of god. Evidence for the increasing Neoplatonization of Christianity is abundant: The brilliant Christian theologian Origen, some twenty years older than Plotinus, may also have been a pupil of Ammonius Saccas; the Cappadocian Fathers Basil and Gregory of Nazianzus spent their youth in philosophical study in Athens in the 4th century, where they most certainly were exposed to Neoplatonism, while Augustine of Hippo (354–430) was intimately familiar with the writings of Plotinus and Porphyry. The cut-throat debates about transubstantiation (in the Eucharist), the hypostases of the Trinity, or the divine/human nature of Christ, could not even be followed without a thorough training in current Greek philosophical discourse. By the end of the 5th century, the audience in the philosophical classrooms in Alexandria was predominantly Christian, and Neoplatonism continued to be taught in some form or other in Athens, Alexandria, Constantinople, Baghdad, Mistra, and other pockets of learning until its triumphant revival in Renaissance Italy.

2. The One

What was it that made the radically top-down idealism of the Neoplatonists so appealing? Disregarding in this context the religious-sentimental appeal Neoplatonism undoubtedly must have had and perhaps still has, its philosophical attractiveness and significance lies in the fact that it offered a maximum of explanatory power on the basis of just one metaphysical principle. Even though the system coheres in such a way that it is possible to approach it from many angles, it is perhaps best to begin at the top of the ontological pyramid and to return to the question posed earlier: How is it possible to explain the world’s emergence from a single divine principle of consciousness?

It may be useful first to state that the pagan Neoplatonists were not creationists. That is to say, whatever account they were giving about the universe’s origin, this narrative was not to be misunderstood as recounting a creation in time or at the very beginning of time. Instead, they speculated that the process of the emergence of the universe from the divine principle, as they conceived of it (described below), has gone on forever, just as it continues at this very moment and will continue to do so, sustaining a world without end. When the general outlook of Neoplatonism was appropriated and adapted to refine and articulate the creeds of Christianity, Islam, and Judaism, this feature of the doctrine, and the connected doctrine of the eternity of the world, would become a vigorously debated issue.

Second, unlike the ancient theologians of Israel and Egypt, the Neoplatonists did not think that the universe could spring from the deity directly and in a way that surpasses all understanding, for example by being thought and spoken into existence. Their more refined view was that reality emerged from “the First” in coherent stages, in such a way that one stage functions as creative principle of the next.

This kind of emanationist cosmology rests on the tenet—based to some extent in observation, but elevated by them to the status of a heuristic principle—that every activity in the world is in some sense double insofar as it possesses both an inner and an outer aspect. For example, the inner activity of the sun (nuclear fusion, as we now know) has the outer effect of heat and light, themselves activities as well. Or the inner activity of a tree that is determined by the kind of tree it is (its genetic code, we would now say; the Neoplatonists spoke of an inherent formative principle, logos) results in the bearing of a particular kind of fruit; or again, thoughts and feelings internal to human beings express themselves in speech and actions. In each case, the outer effect is not the purpose or end of the inner activity; rather, it is simply the case that one falls out of the other and is concomitant with it. Furthermore, it is also the case that these outer activities will typically be productive of yet other outer activities that are ontologically more remote and derivative: Fruit serves as nourishment or poison for other individual life forms, and human speech and action constitute, over time, a person’s biography or a society’s history. It is important to note that, in all cases, the outer activity will not be some random affair, but rather something intimately connected with the inner activity it is an expression of. In other words, any inner activity will somehow prefigure the character and nature of its outer effect. Thus, the Neoplatonists insisted that there is nothing on the lower ontological levels within the chains of causality that is not somehow prefigured on the corresponding higher levels. In general, no property emerges unless it is already in some way preformed and pre-existent in its cause.

As regards the very first principle of reality, conceived of as an entity that is beyond Being, transcending all physical reality, very little can actually be said, except that it is absolute Unity. However, we know empirically of its effect, the entire universe, and we must therefore suppose that the One is the carrier of, or rather identical with, a boundless sort of singular activity or energy. Since it is counterintuitive to suppose that the material universe leapt into being its present form directly from this well-spring of energy, the question arises: what precisely is the first and primary outer activity of the inner activity of the One?

3. Absolute Consciousness

In accordance with the Platonic-Aristotelian commitment to Mind over Matter the Neoplatonists’ answer to this question was that the outer activity and effect of the First must be nous, a difficult and ambiguous concept commonly translated as “Intellect”. It seems preferable to translate the term nous in an experientially more concrete and accessible way as pure and absolute “Consciousness”. According to Neoplatonic theory, Consciousness would not be some kind of emergent property of material constituents arranged in a certain way, but rather be the first effect of the activity of the One, the most supreme form of reality (since the One was posited to be beyond Being), a kind of pre-embodied power of cognition as such. Neoplatonists referred to Consciousness as the second “Hypostasis”, a term that would have a long and complex history as it acquired new and related meanings in Christian contexts. “Hypostasis” is an abstract noun derived from a verb meaning “to place oneself under or beneath”, with the connotation of “standing one’s ground”. The word “hypostasis” therefore denotes a distinct substantial being or realm of reality of a certain kind which, in the case of Consciousness, is the derivative outer activity of the first principle. The term could also be applied to the One as the “first hypostasis”, in which case the connotation of subordination would recede into the background.

What, then, is the inner activity of Consciousness? The inherent task of consciousness is to understand, and understanding entails the cognition of causes. In trying to understand itself, Consciousness can only turn towards its origin and thus posit or behold the First as the transcendent principle of its own reality. As the Neoplatonists would put it, having emerged from the First, Consciousness “turns back” towards it in order to understand the pre-condition of its own existence. Becoming thus aware of another entity, the originary unity of Consciousness breaks up into duality, and with it emerge the categories of identity and difference, of greater and smaller, of number, of change and of rest. In fact, in a way not fully explained, or perhaps even explicable, the entire ideal world of Platonic forms and ideas emerges effortlessly in the course of Consciousness’ effort to understand itself.

Before we move on to discuss the outer effect of this inner activity of Consciousness, we must correct the common assertion that what we are dealing with here is a process of “emanation”. To be sure, Consciousness (or Intellect) somehow emerges from the activity of the First, but calling this a process of emanation, with its obviously materialist connotations, is misleading. The Neoplatonists used the words “procession and return” (prohodos and epistrophê), which, as spatial metaphors, are not much better either. And even though the analogy oftentimes invoked in this context is that of light radiating out from the sun, this too does not do much to help us grasp the nature of the Neoplatonic theory of how Consciousness, and by implication the entire rest of reality, eternally emerges from the first cause. In essence, there is no process of generation or production; nothing material or spatial is happening; no agent exerts its influence on a patient. Although the Neoplatonists followed Platonic tradition in talking about a demiurge (divine craftsman), their cosmology has nothing demiurgic about it, as Plotinus rarely failed to point out. Craftsmen think, forge, labor, arrange, and coordinate a host of diverse technical operations towards the creation of some product of their craft. Unlike Plato’s character Timaeus or the authors of Genesis, Neoplatonic metaphysics has no room for such crude analogies. In the realm of Consciousness, the activity is one and constitutes itself as a multiplicity within that unity. In the identity of the activity of thought with its objects, the Neoplatonists contended, the ideal world of all forms and ideas came to be conceptualized. Here again, in an unintentional and effortless way, this inner active life of Consciousness produces further outer effect, the Soul.

4. Soul and Nature

According to the second law of thermodynamics, structural and dispositional diversities present in the inanimate material world converge towards irreversible entropy and disorder. In the biosphere, however, we witness a tendency to ever increasing diversification of natural kinds and species. From a Neoplatonic point of view, this latter fact is readily explained by the entirely non-Darwinian supposition of eternal Forms of natural kinds in the hypostasis of Consciousness which gradually emerge in the world, limited by space and time, in some sort of evolutionary organic process. As has already been pointed out, the Neoplatonists assumed as axiomatic that nothing could come to be here below that is not prefigured paradigmatically in the intelligible realm.

Although one might think that the phenomenon of evolution militates against Neoplatonic theory, it is actually compatible with it; to some degree, it is precisely what we should expect as the empirical upshot of such metaphysical assumptions. Moreover, in distinction to the Forms posited in the old Academy of Plato and his immediate successors, the Forms of the Neoplatonists, far from being mere schemata, definitions, or ghostly blueprints of the natural world, are rather noetic entities teeming with conscious life. They actively and dynamically interrelate in such a way as to constitute a living noetic cosmos; and it is their rich inner life, the conscious activity of thoughts that they are, which is ultimately responsible for the appearance of images of them in space and time to make up the physical universe and everything contained in it. But this is by no means easy to understand. How exactly can images of eternal and immutable Forms, prefigured in Consciousness as such, become manifest in, and in fact constitute, the material world?

To understand and explain how precisely it is that mind and matter interact with one another in general is a considerable and perennial philosophical problem. Approaches to it that start from modern materialist assumptions have not yielded plausible answers any more readily than the Neoplatonists’ idealist perspective. Even though the Neoplatonists afforded it extensive treatment, they, unsurprisingly, have not satisfactorily explained it either. In a nutshell, the answer they gave has something to do with their fundamental understanding of the realm of the psychic. Plotinus in particular struggled in long and meandering treatises to explicate the precise functioning of the general phenomenon of what the ancients called “Soul” (psychê). Soul, a further hypostasis of being that effortlessly “falls out of” the inner activity of Consciousness in a similar way as Consciousness “fell out of” the First, is the link that facilitates the manifestation of form in matter. Their ingenious speculation about Soul, understood in its relationship to its cause (pure Consciousness) on the one hand and its effect (the emergence of the living material universe) on the other, lies at the heart of Neoplatonism. In a manner of speaking, Neoplatonism is nothing but a philosophy of the soul, or “psychology” in the original sense of that word.

In living beings, and human beings in particular, consciousness is but one psychic activity among others. The realm of the psychic extends in a continuum from the loftiest processes of knowing, memory, and imagination down to the most rudimentary forms and expressions of life that characterize the world’s biosphere (natural processes of metabolism, growth, etc.). Many influential ancient thinkers, both philosophers and poets, regarded the universe as a living being, not only in its parts but also and especially as whole. In the Timaeus, Plato had described in detail the structure and function of the world soul, and had recounted the way in which it was put together by a divine craftsman (demiurge) and conjoined with the realm of disorderly matter, upon which it controlled and imposed order. Plotinus and his followers had a quite different view. There is no planning on account of anyone, no “construction” of one metaphysical entity by another; instead, soul, that is to say the general phenomenon of life capable of animating matter, is merely the manifest outer aspect of the inner activity of Consciousness.

The general idea is that Soul, qua outer activity of Consciousness, looks back at its cause in order to understand itself so as to truly be what it is. Gazing thus at the forms and ideas eternally present in Consciousness, it becomes “informed” by them and carries forward, by some manner of benevolent necessity, images of the eternal forms into the lower realm of Being. Giving birth to the entire universe and the biosphere on earth in this way, one could say that the sum total of the corporeal, sensible world rests in Soul, not the other way round, that soul resides in the bodies it animates.

According to Neoplatonic theory, then, the world as we know and experience it in its formal and structural characteristics is the outer effect of the activity and life of Consciousness, an activity that was thought to be mediated “from above” by another, intermediate metaphysical entity, Soul. The precise ontological status of Soul as another hypostasis in its own right remains somewhat underdetermined, for in a manner of speaking Soul is the very process of expressing the intelligible world in the derivative form of sensible natural living beings and the lives they live.

The Neoplatonists drew a distinction between “Soul” and “Nature” (phusis) that amounts to a hierarchical separation of higher and lower psychical functions. For the Neoplatonists, “Nature” denotes not only the essence or nature of each natural being or the entirety of the natural world (Nature as a whole), but also, and in the first instance, a lower aspect of conscious life (the “autonomic” life activities that are not consciously controlled by the individual animal’s consciousness) which beholds, in a kind of diminished vision, relevant aspects of the intelligible world and brings them forth in an act of silent contemplation. Thus, every aspect of the natural world, even the meanest piece of inorganic and apparently useless matter, has an eternal and divine moment. For all the other-worldliness often associated with Neoplatonic philosophy, then, it needs to be emphasized that the material world they inhabited was for this reason an essentially good and beautiful place, the effortless product of cosmic providence and divine power, and worthy of reverence.

5. Matter

Without light, it would not make any sense to speak of darkness. In fact, there would be no such thing as darkness, since darkness is, if it is anything, light’s absence and opposite. In the same way as darkness is a by-product of light, so matter, the Neoplatonists reasoned, is nothing but a by-product of the dynamic emanation of the First. In fact, it is the limit at which the energy transmitted in the chain of inner and outer activities at the various levels of reality exhausts itself and comes to an end. Just as darkness has no capacity to make itself visible, in the same way matter no longer has any inner activity that could give rise to a further outer activity. As such, it is merely passive, and the eternal process of consecutive production of ever lower levels of reality necessarily comes to an end. But importantly for us, it is the realm at which the activity of Soul informed by Consciousness becomes phenomenal and perceptible. It would be wrong to say that matter does not exist at all, or is a nothing. According to this theory, at any rate, matter exists, but not as a separate ontological principle distinct from the One with effects of its own. Rather, it is a fringe phenomenon of the life of the soul, a by-product of the activity of higher realms of Being. As such, it is no thing, an entirely immaterial and formless non-entity. This Plotinian doctrine was destined to raise controversy among later Neoplatonists, when it was proposed that matter should at the very least have the property of undefined three-dimensionality.

An even more controversial doctrine connected to matter was the explanation of evil. Plotinus had tried to uphold the view, consistent with his entire ontology, that at no point in the great chain of Being coming from above does anything emerge that could be regarded as evil, or the cause of evil. Nevertheless, evil, and in particular moral evil, is obviously part of our experience of the world, and an explanation had to be given as to where it originated. Plotinus’ answer was that evil arises from below, not above, and is intimately connected with matter. Yet importantly, matter is not an independent principle of evil in any Manichean or Gnostic sense, as it has no active power on its own. Rather, evil arises if and when higher beings, and in particular human beings, direct their attention towards the material world below, instead of the intelligible world above, and have an all-encompassing concern for it. The regard downwards, as it were, rather than upwards towards Consciousness and the divine essences, is what contaminates the soul and renders it morally evil. Even though it is surprising how much explanatory force for the nature and existence of moral evil this theory affords, it remained controversial even among Neoplatonists. Proclus, in the fifth century, dedicated an entire treatise to repudiating Plotinus on this point. Proclus abandoned the comforting notion of the essential goodness of humanity and, not unlike Augustine before him, insisted on the real possibility of the moral depravity of the human soul qua soul.

6. Ethics

As human beings we are, with our bodies, part of the material world; but importantly, we are living organisms that can place ourselves in opposition to the needs and concerns of the body and reflect upon our own condition. Nothing just material would be able do that, according to the Neoplatonists, and therefore we have what the ancients called a “soul”. Moreover, our souls operate on a level of consciousness and intelligence that surpasses the cognition of all other creatures. Finally, just as everything else that has being, we are individual units and participate, again, as the Neoplatonists would express it, in the form of Unity.

Looked at from this point of view, human existence is a striking representation of the cosmos as a whole, a microcosm in which all levels of being (Unity, Consciousness, Soul, Nature, Matter) are combined into one organic individual. The Neoplatonists took this to be a clear indication that we, just like the entire cosmic edifice, “came from above”. A human being is therefore in the first instance not a social or political being, but a divine being, and life’s purpose was seen not so much in the exercise and rehearsal of the traditional virtues that give meaning and quality to our interaction with others, but in seeking “to bring back the god in us to the divine in the All”, as Plotinus pressed upon his followers on the very point of his death (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus 2).

Neoplatonic ethics recognizes the social importance and value of the so-called cardinal virtues (justice, prudence, temperance, and courage), but the virtues’ main function lies in purifying and preparing us for a much more momentous individual relationship, that with divine Consciousness and, ultimately, the first principle itself. Necessarily, then, the moral precepts of the Neoplatonists concern the individual person, the goal being not the mundane fulfillment of life within the bounds of what is humanly possible, but nothing less than eudaimonia in its most expansive sense, deification. Unsurprisingly, the route to salvation turned out to be the philosophic life, a sincere and arduous effort of the mind to return to the One and forever abrogate any concerns for the body. It was on this basis that the Neoplatonists would most vehemently protest against the latter-day Christian dogma that human salvation has already been accomplished vicariously through the life and death of a man revered as the son of god.

7. Later Developments in Antiquity

At a time when the considered wisdom of Greece and Rome came under increasing pressure to re-articulate its commitments in the face of waves of novel movements that lay claim to revelatory truth, the Neoplatonists too strove to refine their teachings and to delineate the metaphysical architecture of the world as they saw it. No longer would it suffice to hold forth on philosophical issues, as Plato, Cicero, and to some extent Plotinus had done, in a serious yet exploratory and protreptic spirit. In order to be heard in an increasingly competitive marketplace of ideas teeming with holy men of every kind and temperament, views had to be laid out clearly and in systematic fashion. In some of its later manifestations, like Stoicism and Epicureanism before it, Neoplatonism drifted towards scholasticism and reveled in dogmatic system building.

Along the way, all kinds of refinements and modifications of nomenclature were introduced. Distinctions were drawn up within the hypostases of Consciousness and Soul in order to try to articulate the transitions from one level of Being to another. An entire industry of teaching and commenting sprang up to interpret a millennium of Hellenic philosophy in the light of the core commitments of Neoplatonism. Certain philosophic predecessors were elevated to the status of nearly infallible authorities, and the texts of Plato and Aristotle were comprehensively read, diligently analyzed, and ruthlessly harmonized. Finally, in an effort to stem the rising tide of all kinds of new salvation-peddling cults then inundating the Roman Empire, the ancient religious traditions of the Greeks and especially the Egyptians were brought into the fold and given new significance and meaning. But after the untimely death of Emperor Julian (363), a Neoplatonist himself, none of these efforts could any longer withstand the tidal wave of Christendom.

The most vigorous group of Neoplatonists, living in Athens and still adhering to the old rituals, disbanded in the aftermath of Emperor Justinian’s legislation of 529, which resulted in the closing of the Platonist academy. Hellenic philosophy and the teaching of its attendant disciplines went on in Alexandria and Constantinople until the end of the 6th century, but were now being taught by people who had either embraced or otherwise come to terms with the new religion. The Arab conquest in the 7th century obliterated and appropriated in equal measure, but the real revival of Neoplatonism occurred when humanists made the treasures of late antique Greece available to the Renaissance intelligentsia of Italy, France, and Germany.

8. Influence

It is an undeniable fact, although nowadays rarely acknowledged, that the general outlook and the principal doctrines of the Neoplatonists proved exceedingly influential throughout the entire history of western philosophy. Through Augustine (354–430) in the West and the 4th-century Cappadocian Fathers (Basil, Gregory of Nyssa, Gregory of Nazianzus) in the East as well as the pseudo-epigraphic writings of Dionysius the Areopagite (early 6th century), Neoplatonism profoundly influenced the emergence of mainstream and not so mainstream Christian theology (John Scotus Eriugena, Thomas Aquinas, Duns Scotus, Meister Eckhart). In addition, by way of a pseudo-epigraphical treatise entitled Theology of Aristotle, Neoplatonic thought facilitated the integration of ancient philosophy and science into both Islam (especially through Al-Kindi, Al-Farabi and Avicenna [Ibn Sina]) and Judaism (Maimonides).

During the Renaissance, ancient Greek learning, and Neoplatonism in particular, experienced a dramatic revival in the West in the wake of the work of Gemistus Plethon (1355–1452), Bessarion (1403–1472) and, above all, Marsilio Ficino (1433–1499), whose translation and interpretation of Plato and Plotinus in the second half of the 15th century influenced not only the philosophy, but also the art and literature of the period. It may even be true to say that even more than the writings of Plato and Aristotle themselves Neoplatonic ideas have continued to influence Western thinkers of the idealist persuasion, such as the Cambridge Platonists (who were really Neoplatonists), Leibniz, Hegel, Schelling, Fichte, Bergson and Teilhard de Chardin, to name but a few.

The history of Neoplatonism until the present day is much too diverse and complex to be done justice to in an introductory article such as this. In spite of the ubiquity of proponents of this developed form of Platonism in all historical periods of western philosophy since late antiquity, today Neoplatonism has acquired the reputation of being speculative and abstract to a fault. Modern philosophical commitments to empiricism, logical positivism, and the analysis of language have not helped much to arrive at a judicious evaluation of the movement, its strengths and its weaknesses, and the dramatic scientific discoveries of contemporary bottom-up materialism tend to deter students from even attempting to find their way into the world of Neoplatonism. Perhaps another reason that this kind of thinking strikes the general public as arcane and alien may that the Abrahamic religions, even if they too posit a single divine principle as the source of all being, conceive of this principle as a person and maker. This vestige of pre-philosophical anthropomorphism bypasses the difficult questions that the last pagan thinkers so arduously struggled to answer when they sought to explain the existence of the diverse and complex physical world from a non-material principle that they assumed to be nothing but One.

Bibliography

Essential readings of late-antique Neoplatonic Works

  • Plotinus, Enneads
  • ––– I 1 (What is the Living Being and what is Man?)
  • ––– I 2 (On Virtues)
  • ––– I 4 (On Well-Being)
  • ––– I 6 (On Beauty)
  • ––– I 8 (What is Evil and Where Does it Come From?)
  • ––– II 4 (On Matter)
  • ––– III 8 (On Nature and Contemplation)
  • ––– IV 8 (On the Descent of the Soul in Bodies)
  • ––– V 1 (On the Three Primary Hypostases)
  • ––– V 9 (On Intellect, The Forms, and Being)
  • ––– VI 8 (On Free Will and the Will of the One)
  • Porphyry, Life of Plotinus
  • –––, Isagoge
  • –––, On Abstinence
  • Iamblichus, On the Egyptian Mysteries
  • Proclus, Elements of Theology
  • Marinus, Life of Proclus
  • Damascius, Life of Isidore
  • Simplicius, Commentary on Epictetus’ Handbook
  • John Philoponus, On the Eternity of the World against Proclus

For further and more detailed information on the development of Neoplatonism in the history of Western philosophy, or on specific Neoplatonic doctrines, refer to the Related Entries section below.

Selected Introductory Secondary Literature

  • Chiaradonna, Riccardo and Franco Trabattoni (eds.), 2009, Physics and Philosophy of Nature in Greek Neoplatonism, Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Cooper, John M., 2012, Pursuits of Wisdom: Six Ways of Life in Ancient Philosophy from Socrates to Plotinus, Princeton NJ: Princeton University Press, Ch. 6.
  • Emilsson, Eyjolfur Kjalar, 1988, Plotinus on Sense-Perception: A Philosophical Study, Cambridge (England) and New York, NY: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gerson, Lloyd P., 1994, Plotinus, London and New York: Routledge.
  • ––– (ed.), 1996, The Cambridge Companion to Plotinus, Cambridge (England) and New York, NY: Cambridge University Press.
  • Gerson, Lloyd P. (ed.), 2010, The Cambridge History of Philosophy in Late Antiquity, 2 vols., Cambridge (England) and New York, NY: Cambridge University Press.
  • O’Meara, Dominic J., 1993, Plotinus: An Introduction to the Enneads, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Remes, Pauliina and Svetla Slaveva-Griffin (eds.), 2014, The Routledge Handbook of Neoplatonism, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Smith, Andrew, 2004, Philosophy in Late Antiquity, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Wallis, Richard T., 1995, Neoplatonism, with a foreword and bibliography by Lloyd P. Gerson, 2nd edition, London: Duckworth and Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company.
  • Wilberding, James and Christoph Horn (eds.), 2012, Neoplatonism and the Philosophy of Nature, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Other Internet Resources

  • Enneads, translated by Stephen Mackenna and B. S. Page.
  • Porphyry's Isagoge, translated by Octavius Freire Owen, hosted at The Tertulian Project.

Copyright © 2016 by
Christian Wildberg <wildberg@princeton.edu>

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